Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Anthony Collins

1. For an excellent brief account of these men and others, see the article “Deism” by Ernest Campbell Mossner in the MacMillan Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Vol. 2 Pp. 326-335.

2. Collins does not use the term ‘emergent property’ but it seems strikingly appropriate. Scholars generally trace the origin of the school of British emergentism of the late nineteenth and twentieth centuries to John Stuart Mill's System of Logic (1843). (See McLaughlin, 2008) Mill also does not use the terms ‘emergence’ or ‘emergent property’. (ibid. Pg. 25) The term was first used by George Henry Lewes in a philosophical sense in his 1875 Problems of Life and Mind. (See the article “Emergent Properties” in this encyclopedia) So, it may be of some historical interest that Collins argument that there are wholes (such as the brain) that have properties (such as consciousness) that are not had by any of its parts in addition to wholes all of whose properties are derived from their parts (with similar causal language) antedates Mill's distinction between heteropathic causes and effects and the Composition of causes by some 137 years. I doubt that there is any evidence of the British emergentist philosophers reading or being influenced by Collins. Nonetheless, this may affect our judgment of Collins' originality as a philosopher.

3. Clarke holds a version of what John Cottingham has called an “heirloom theory of causality” since the theory requires that the effect ‘inherit’ some property from its cause. There are a variety of different versions of this kind of theory, some more reductionist than others. Clarke holds a strongly reductionist version. Collins, by contrast, holds that causes and effects need have nothing in common. In this respect he is a precursor of Hume.