Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Probabilistic Causation

The Fork Asymmetry and the Second Law of Thermodynamics

Reichenbach (1956) saw his fork asymmetry as a macro-statistical analog of the second law of thermodynamics. The idea is roughly along the following lines. Suppose we have a system such as a beach that is essentially isolated from the rest of its environment. Suppose moreover that we find this system in a state of low entropy; e.g. there are footprints on the beach. The second law of thermodynamics tells us that the system did not spontaneously evolve into this state; rather, the low entropy state must be the result of an earlier interaction with some other system (a human walking on the beach). This interaction ‘prepares’ the system in a low entropy state, but once the system is isolated, its entropy will increase. Now suppose that we have two events A and B. If we hold fixed the probability of each event individually, a probability distribution over the partition A&B, A&~B, ~A&B, ~A&~B will have more information, in the sense of Shannon (1948), when A and B are correlated. The formal definition of entropy is closely related to that of information, the two being inversely proportional. So when A and B are correlated, we have the analog of a system in a state of low entropy. This state is then to be explained in terms of some earlier event that prepares the system.