Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Callicles and Thrasymachus

1. For the term ‘immoralism’ see e.g., Dodds 1959, 266 (citing Shorey); Bernard Williams discusses the ‘amoralist’ (1972, 3-13, 1985, 22-32). Either label is misleading, in that no term corresponding neatly to our ‘morality’ occurs in Plato's works, or indeed in the Greek language. What Thrasymachus and Callicles challenge is the value of justice, >dikaiosunê. However, ancient talk of justice often maps on to modern talk about ‘morality’ reasonably well, so long as we bear in mind that it is only one of a number of virtues prized by the ancients, and so only one part of what, in the ancient tradition, constitutes the sphere of ‘the moral’.

2. This is an oversimplified picture. For one thing, aretê in Homer's world sometimes seems to be simply a matter of noble birth, as it is in some later aristocratic authors like Theognis (see Finkelberg 1998). Also, though their relation to aretê is somewhat unclear, Homer and his characters also place enormous value on a complex of ‘softer’ traits such as reverence, piety, self-restraint, compassion and acceptance of one's limitations.