Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Affirmative Action

1. While racial “set-asides” in public construction still remain somewhat contentious (they have been mostly foreclosed by Adarand v. Pena, 515 U. S. 200 [1995]), the public in general is not aroused by the vicissitudes of the federal contracting process and the good or ill fortune of construction firms. Although most contemporary writing focuses on affirmative action in college admissions, one recent book goes against the grain by examining affirmative action in faculty hiring. See Celia Wolf-Devine 1997.

2. Preferences for women don't figure into the current controversy because women have no trouble competing for college admissions. They now constitute 57 percent of all college students, half of all entering medical school students and half of all entering law school students. See

The story is quite different for African-Americans and Hispanics.

3. So profound was the shock to the academy that Nicholas Capaldi, writing in 1985, remained under the impression that “[a]ffirmative action as a public policy was first applied on a massive and national scale to institutions of higher learning” (Capaldi 1985, 1).

4. Ironically enough, the first discussions of “inverse” discrimination began in one of the prime sites of analytical philosophy, Analysis. For the full record of exchanges, see Nickel 1972; Cowan 1972; Taylor 1973; Shiner 1973; Silvestri 1973; Nunn 1974; Nickel 1974; Goldman 1975; Ketchum & Pierce 1976; Woodruff 1976; and Simon 1978.

5. See also Fullinwider 1975, Goldman 1979 (65-102), and Fullinwider 1980 (30-44).

6. Similar sentiments were expressed by Virginia Black:

If it is irrational and unjust and cruel to fire someone because he is a black or she is a woman — cases whose absurdity seems obvious — then it is equally irrational and unjust and cruel to hire someone because be is a black or she is a woman. To appreciate the parallel, one has only to remember that to hire X because of color is, ipso facto, not to hire Y because of color. When inscribed in law, this is racism. (Black 1974, 106).

See also Capaldi 1998, 535, 536 (affirmative action is “incoherent” in practice and “illogical”).

7. This idea that using racial preferences involves a kind of practical contradiction was given voice and support at the highest levels of government in the 1980s. William Bradford Reynolds, during his tenure as Assistant Attorney General for Civil Rights in the Reagan Administration, contended:

[T]o those who argue that we must use race to get beyond racism …[h]istory teaches us all too well that such an approach does not work. It is wrong when the government bestows advantages on whites at the expense of innocent blacks; it assumes no greater claim of morality if the tables are turned…. Whatever group membership one inherits, it carries with it no entitlement to preferential treatment over those not similarly endowed with the same immutable characteristics. Any compromise of this principle is discrimination, plain and simple, and such behavior is no more tolerable when employed remedially, in the name of “affirmative action” or “racial balance,” to bestow a gratuitous advantage on members of a particular group, than when it is divorced from such beneficence and for the most invidious of reasons works to one's disadvantage. (Reynolds 1984, 1004).

While Reynolds found the proposition, “Use race to achieve a colorblind society,” an assault on common sense, he belonged to an administration — like a long line of previous administrations — whose defense policy was grounded on the proposition, “Prepare for war in order to have peace.”

8. Title 42 United States Code Sec. 2000d. Title IX of the Education Amendments of 1972 promised the same protection against gender discrimination. See 20 USC 1681.

9. “(a) It shall be unlawful for an employer (1) to refuse to hire or to discharge any individual, or otherwise to discriminate against any individual with respect to his compensation, terms, conditions, or privileges of employment, because of such individual's race, color, religion, sex, or national origin; or (2) to limit, segregate, or classify his employees or applicants in any way which would tend to deprive any individual of employment opportunities or otherwise adversely affect his status as an employee, because of such individual's race, color, religion, sex, or national origin.” Title 42 USC Sec 2000e-2

10. Griggs v. Duke Power Company, 401 U.S. 424 (1971), at 430, 431. At issue in the case was the use of an aptitude test and a high-school graduation requirement to screen job applicants. Duke Power Company did not succeed in showing that the results of the aptitude test or the possession of a high school diploma bore any demonstrable relation to performance at such of its jobs as janitor, maintenance worker, and the like.

11. For a more extended discussion of goals and quotas, see Fullinwider 1980, 162-177.

12. Consider, for example, this 1969 court decision involving a union with a record of excluding African-Americans and Mexican-Americans. The court imposed an injunction that

prohibit[ed] discrimination in excluding persons from union membership or referring persons for work; prohibit[ed] use of member's endorsements, family relationship or elections as criteria for membership; …ordered the development of objective membership criteria and prohibited new members …until developed; and ordered continuation of chronological referrals for work, with alternating white and Negro referrals until objective membership criteria are developed.

On appeal, the Court of Appeals for the Fifth Circuit upheld the lower court. In its view,

[t]he District Court did no more than prevent future discrimination when it prohibited a continuing exclusion of Negroes through the application of an apparently neutral membership provision …which served no significant trade-related purpose. [Further] the District Court did no more [in barring new membership until objective criteria were developed] than ensure that the injunction against further racial discrimination would be fairly administered. Absent objective criteria …covert subversion of the purpose of the injunction could occur. The same administrative reasons support alternating white and Negro referrals…

Asbestos Workers v. Vogler, 407 F. 2d 1047 (1960), at 1051, 1055. Each part of the lower court's order, including the part that required racially balanced referrals, harkened back to a single ground: the part was necessary to prevent future discrimination.

13. For a list of Circuit Court decisions embracing this theory, see Fullinwider 1986b, 106-08 and accompanying footnotes.

14. Regents of the University of California v. Bakke, 438, U.S. 265 (1978). In 1974, the Court had accepted for decision a similar case involving a race-preference policy at the University of Washington Law School. However, perhaps experiencing second thoughts, the Court then dismissed the case as moot (the plaintiff, admitted to the Law School by a lower court, was about to graduate). See De Funis v. Odegaard, 416 U.S. 312 (1974).

15. Unlike Title VII, which is grounded in the Interstate Commerce Clause of the Constitution, Title VI is grounded in the federal government's spending powers. Brennan relied on Congressional debate to argue for the substantive identity of Title VI, on the one hand, and the Fourteenth Amendment to the Constitution (which forbids states to discriminate) and the Fifth Amendment (which incorporates the Fourteenth Amendment's strictures and applies them to the federal government), on the other hand. The debate can be summed up in this rhetorical question: “Why should the government through its spending be subsidizing acts of private discrimination that it would be forbidden by the Constitution to do itself?” See Regents v. Bakke, 438 U.S. 265, at 329-336 (Brennan, dissenting).

16. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U. S. 265, at 295-300 (Powell quoting Cox 1976, 114).

17. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U.S. 265, at 300.

18. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U.S. 265, at 307.

19. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U.S. 265, at 308.

20. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U. S. 265, at 309.

21. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U.S. 265, at 311.

22. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U.S. 265, at 316.

23. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U.S. 265, at 358 (Brennan, dissenting).

24. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U.S. 265, at 376 (Brennan, dissenting).

25. For an early statement of the anti-caste principle, see Fiss 1976.

26. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U.S. 265, at 363 (Brennan, dissenting).

27. A nice discussion of Bakke and equality's dictates can be found in Dworkin 1985 (see “Bakke's Case: Are Quotas Really Unfair?” and “What Did Bakke Really Decide?”).

28. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U. S. 265, at 318, 319.

29. Hopwood v. Texas, 78 F 3d 932 (Fifth Circuit, 1996).

30. Wessmann v. Gittens, 106 F 3d 798 (First Circuit, 1998).

31. Johnson v. Board of Regents, 263 F 3d 1234 (Eleventh Circuit, 2001).

32. Grutter v. Bollinger, 137 F. Supp. 2d 821 (2001).

33. For example, in 1992, when Cheryl Hopwood filed her law suit against the University of Texas Law School, it was using a two-track admissions policy in which applications from African-Americans and Hispanics were evaluated separately Ð and against more lenient standards Ð from other applications. See Hopwood v. Texas, 861 F. Supp. 551 (1994) at 561-2, 563, 575.

34. See Wygant v. Jackson, 476 U.S. 267 (1986); Richmond v. J. A. Croson Company, 488 U.S. 469 (1989); Adarand Constructors v. Pena, 515 U.S. 200 (1995).

35. Grutter v. Bollinger, 539 U.S. 306 (2003), at 330.

36. Grutter v. Bollinger, 539 U. S. 306, at 325.

37. Regents v. Bakke, 438 U. S. 265, at 318-19.

38. Grutter v. Bollinger, 539 U. S. 306, at 337.

39. Grutter v. Bollinger, 539 U. S. 306, at 339.

40. Gratz v. Bollinger, 539 U. S. 244 (2003), at 287.

41. Gratz v. Bollinger, 539 U. S. 244, at 288.

42. Grutter v. Bollinger, 539 U. S. 306, at 326.

43. Grutter v. Bollinger, 539 U. S. 306, at 367-69 (Rehnquist, dissenting) and 374 (Kennedy, dissenting).

44. Grutter v. Bollinger, 539 U. S. 306, at 375 (Scalia, dissenting) .

45. Gratz v. Bollinger, 122 F. Supp. 2d 811 (2000), at 823.

46. Gratz v. Bollinger, 135 F. Supp. 2d 790 (2001), at 796-797.

47. Grutter v. Bollinger, 539 U. S. 306, at 336.

48. Other good upsides to racial harmony or racial advancement can be imagined as well; see, for example, Stroud 1999 (399ff).

49. For critiques of Bowen & Bok 1998, see Sandalow 1999 and Thernstrom & Thernstrom 1999.

50. Edley's example involved a coal miner's daughter; I've change the daughter to a son for expository purposes.

51. Bernard Boxill has insisted that merely receiving benefits produced by injustice is enough to make one personally liable to compensate the victim of injustice (Boxill 1972). And who is the victim of injustice”“We know that all blacks, lower class, middle class, and upper class, have been wronged by racial injustice” (Boxill 1984, 164). In 1978 (251), Boxill argues that the correlation between “preferences received” and “compensation deserved,” though not perfect, is very high. A recent piece by D. W. Haslett (2002) also conceives of affirmative action as a way to neutralize “tainted” advantages enjoyed by whites, although he concedes that the neutralization is “extremely rough” (83). Haslett cites none on the literature from the 1970s and 1980s that thoroughly covered this terrain. He is not alone in such forgetfulness.

52. 438 U.S. 265, at 365-6.