Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Propositional Attitude Reports

The De Re/De Dicto Distinction

Propositional attitudes seem to be examples of what we can call opacity verbs. That is, they seem to create linguistic environments that do not permit substitution of singular terms salva veritate. This is the basis of Frege's puzzle. Modals like ‘it is necessary that’ and ‘it is possible that’ and temporal modifiers like ‘in two days' are also opacity inducing. This fact gives rise to a de re/de dicto distinction. Now, the de re/de dicto distinction has meant different things to different people. Below we'll distinguish three different conceptions of this distinction, the first two concerning the status sentences and the third being more metaphysical. But first let us motivate the distinction.

There is an important distinction in belief attributions, and, according to some, in the beliefs we attribute. W. V. Quine, in his 1956, brings this out nicely by pointing out an ambiguity in the following.

(1) Ralph believes that someone is a spy.

This could mean either of the following.

(2) Ralph believes that there are spies


(3) Someone is such that Ralph believes that he is a spy.

(2) is something that most of us believe; (3) is something that few of us believe. The truth of (3) but not (2), to echo Quine, would give the FBI cause to be interested in Ralph (or at least this was evidently so in the 50s). We might paraphrase (3) as follows: "Someone is such that Ralph believes of him that he is a spy." The distinction between (2) and (3) can be seen as a distinction of scope for the existential quantifier. In (2), the existential quantifier is interpreted as having narrow scope, within the scope of ‘believes'.

(2*) Ralph believes: ∃x(x is a spy).

In (3), however, the existential quantifier has wide scope and binds a variable that occurs freely within the scope of ‘believes'.

(3*) ∃x(Ralph believes that x is a spy).

The ambiguity in (1) and the simple way of distinguishing the two interpretations in (2*) and (3*) suggest that we are on to something. Russell's theory of definite descriptions employs just such a distinction in answering Frege's puzzles about belief. (See the supplementary document on Definite descriptions.)

It is worth briefly noting that the same distinction can be found with both modals and temporal modifiers. (4) below is ambiguous between (4n) and (4w).

(4) The shortest spy might not have been/was not a spy.

(4n) It is possible/was the case that: the shortest spy is not a spy.

(4w) The shortest spy is such that it is possible/was the case that he is not a spy.

(4n) is false; necessarily, anything that is a spy such there is no spy shorter is a spy. But presumably (4w) is true; the person who in fact is shortest of all spies might not have gone into espionage and surely wasn't born into the business.

This very natural and elegant explanation of the ambiguity in (1) leads us to the first conception of the de re/de dicto distinction.

Syntactically de re/de dicto:
A sentence is syntactically de re just in case it contains a pronoun or free variable within the scope of an opacity verb that is anaphoric on or bound by a singular term or quantifier outside the scope of that verb. Otherwise, it is syntactically de dicto.

So, (2) and its quasi-formalization (2*) are syntactically de dicto because the quantifier ‘someone’ occurs within the scope of ‘believes’ along with the variable it binds. (3) and its quasi-formalization (3*), on the other hand, are syntactically de re because the quantifier ‘someone’ occurs outside the scope of ‘believes' and yet binds a variable within its scope. Similarly, (5) and (6) below are syntactically de dicto while (7) and (8) are syntactically de re.

(5) Sally believes that Bill is happy.

(6) Sally believes that someone is happy.

(7) Bill is such that Sally believes that he is happy.

(8) Someone is such that Sally believes that he is happy.

In his 1956, Quine considers and then rejects this simple account of the different readings (1) seems to give rise to. He rejects it because it involves quantifying into opaque environments, which Quine thought was incoherent. In particular, making sense of the wide scope reading of (1) in terms of (3) and (3*) requires making sense of quantifying in, which Quine maintained could not be done without changing the meaning of the quantifier or the attitude verb.

On the standard semantics for quantification, the interpretation of (3*) requires that we be able to say when an individual satisfies the open sentence ‘Ortcutt believes that x is a spy’. This is because the standard semantics for quantification is objectual: A quantified sentence ∃xFx is true just in case there is an object that the open sentence Fx is true of. Quine thought that this leads to contradiction when the open sentence contains an opacity-inducing verb like ‘believes’. He thought this largely because of considerations involving Frege-style cases. Quine's arguments here follow his earlier arguments against quantified modal logic (see, for example, Quine 1980).

Quine thought that (3*) is non-sense because he thought it is incoherent to say of some individual — Orcutt, let's say — that the open sentence ‘Ralph believes that he is a spy’ is true of him. He thought this, in turn, for the following reason. Suppose that Ralph knows of Orcutt under two guises. Under one — say, the mayor of the town guise — Ralph thinks of him as the town pillar who would hardly engage in espionage. Under the other — say, the guy he saw sneaking around in a shadows at night in a trench coat at night — he thinks of him as a suspicious character engaged in espionage. Let's associate the first with the term ‘Mayor’ and the second with the term ‘he [pointing at the man in the dark]’. (9) below seems true while (10) seems false.

(9) Ralph believes that he [pointing at the man in the dark] is a spy.

(10) Ralph believes that Mayor is a spy.

But if (9) is true while (10) is false, continues Quine, then whether or not Orcutt satisfies the open formula ‘is believed by Ralph to be a spy’ depends on how Orcutt is designated. In particular, Orcutt satisfies the formula if designated as ‘he [pointing at the man in the dark] ‘ and doesn't if designated as ‘Mayor’. So, Quine concluded, it is simply non-sense to say that Orcutt himself, independent of a way of designating him, satisfies or doesn't satisfy the condition. But then, given the standard objectual semantics for quantification, (3*) itself doesn't make any sense. So, says Quine, we should abandon the attractive project of making sense of the two readings (1) gives rise to in terms of a difference in scope.

We'll return to this argument shortly. First, however, let's introduce our second conception of the de re/de dicto distinction. We shall call it "the semantically de re/de dicto distinction."

Semantically de re/de dicto:
A sentence is semantically de re just in case it permits substitution salva veritate. Otherwise, it is semantically de dicto.

(7) from above non-controversially counts as semantically de re. Suppose that Bill is Grumpy. Then (7) is true iff (11) below is true.

(11) Grumpy is such that Sally believes that he is happy.

(6) is non-controversially semantically de dicto. Similarly, it is all but non-controversial that (12) below is semantically de dicto.

(12) Sally believes that the happy guy in the corner is happy.

Even if Grumpy is the happy looking guy in the corner, (13) below doesn't seem to follow from the truth of (12).

(13) Sally believes that Grumpy is happy.

What about a sentence like (5) from above? In general, what is the relationship between the syntactic conception and the semantic conception? If Fregeanism is true, then every syntactically de dicto sentence is semantically de dicto as well. On Frege's own view, remember, there is a reference shift when a singular term is within the scope of an attitude verb. Furthermore, a large part of the motivation for accepting a sense/reference distinction for singular terms is to ensure that substitution within the scope of an attitude verb is blocked. But substitution outside such environments should be legitimate. So, any syntactically de dicto sentence should be one that does not permit, without further assumptions, substitution and hence is semantically de dicto as well.

But what if neo-Russellianism is true? Neo-Russellianism is compatible with both naive Russellianism (see the section The naive Russellian theory in the main text) and anti-naive Russellianism (see the section on Contextualist theories in the main text). Given anti-naive Russellianism, substitution within the scope of an attitude verb is, in general, not permitted and hence any syntactically de dicto sentence will be semantically de dicto for the reasons given above. But given naive Russellianism, and given the identity of Bill and Grumpy, (5) is true iff (13) is true. Now suppose that definite descriptions are singular terms and suppose that they function roughly as Russell says they do. (We say roughly because Russell thought that definite descriptions are not singular terms. For more on Russell's theory of definite descriptions, see the supplementary document Definite descriptions and the entry on descriptions.) Then the identity of Bill and the person at Disneyland, together with the truth of (5) does not, intuitively, suffice for the truth of (14) below.

(14) Sally believes that the person at Disneyland is happy.

Intuitively, (14) is true just in case Sally believes true a proposition to the effect that whoever is uniquely at Disneyland is happy. If naive Russellianism is true, then (5) is true just in case Sally believes true the singular proposition containing Bill as a direct constituent to the effect that he is happy. Intuitively Sally could believe true one of these propositions without believing true the other. So, a general substitution principle would be violated. The same seems true of any syntactically de dicto propositional attitude ascribing sentence. So, it would seem, we still would have the same connection between syntactic and semantic conceptions of a sentence's being de dicto.

But suppose now that a naive Russellian denies that definite descriptions are singular terms. Then the falsity of (14) is irrelevant. Because the truth of (5) guarantees the truth of (13), and indeed any belief sentence resulting from the substitution of a co-referring genuine singular term, it would appear that (5) (as well as (13)), although syntactically de dicto is semantically de re. This is a bit surprising.

Indeed, naive Russellianism, and perhaps neo-Russellianism in general, seems to give rise to a very interesting form of reduction of the de re to the de dicto. On some conceptions of the reduction of the de re to the de dicto, all de re beliefs involve completely conceptualized beliefs. (See, for example, Kaplan 1969, Chisholm 1976, and Sosa 1970. Kaplan abandons the view in his later work.) The neo-Russellian is not likely to embrace this sort of reduction. But there is a less ambitious reduction that she may well find congenial: Namely, for any true de re reporting sentence, there is a true de dicto reporting sentence. This is because the de re and de dicto reporting sentences will report the very same belief, as is witnessed by the naive Russellian view of the relationship between (11) and (13). (For a suggestion of the relationship between neo-Russellianism and the reduction of the de re, see Kaplan 1986; for more details, see Salmon 1995, 1997.) If this view is correct, then we can see that Quine's argument against the natural and elegant account of the ambiguity we found in (1) that we started out with fails.

Let us return to our discussion of Quine. Quine rejects, remember, (3*). But he does not deny that there is an intuitive distinction between two ways of reading or taking (1) that the simple Russell-inspired account in terms of (2) and (3) is trying to get at. Quine went on in his 1956 to offer an account of that intuitive distinction in terms of a lexical ambiguity in ‘believes' (and other propositional attitude verbs, in English as well as other languages). (The Russell-inspired account considered above makes sense of the distinction as a syntactic ambiguity of scope.) There is, first, the two-place relation believes-notional, which is a relation between an agent and a proposition. (Quine, in section 4 of his 1956, went on to eliminate propositional attitudes in terms of believing-true a sentence.) In addition, there is an irreducible three-place relation believes-relational, which obtains between an agent, an object, and an abstract. If Quine were right, there would be no reducibility thesis of any kind between the semantically de re and the semantically de dicto. Burge, in his 1977a/b, agrees with Quine on this score.

Although it may be tempting to think of the ambiguity uncovered in (1) as an ambiguity in the verb ‘believe’, the section Ambiguity theories in the main text explains why this is not possible. Moreover, the view is made all the less attractive by the availability of the neo-Russellian account, and the defense it offers of the elegant Russell-inspired account offered above. The positing of lexical ambiguities to explain the data has been shown to be unnecessary. Furthermore, not all anti-neo-Russellians agree with Quine and Burge on this score. As we have already indicated above, Kaplan, before his relationship with singular propositions developed, argued for a thorough-going reductivist thesis in his 1969. A more recent anti-neo-Russellian discussion of the matter is contained in Forbes 1996.

There is a final conception of the de re/de dicto distinction that is worth briefly considering. We shall label it the metaphysical conception of the de re/de dicto distinction.

Metaphysically de re/de dicto:
An attribution is metaphysically de re with respect to an object o just in case it directly attributes a property to o. Otherwise, it is metaphysicallyde dicto with respect to o, if it indirectly involves o, and independent of o if it doesn't.

Suppose that Sally believes that Bill is happy. Does it thereby follow that Bill himself has a property — namely, the property of being believed by Sally to be happy? Neo-Russellians say "yes," for just the reasons given above: Namely, Sally's believing that Bill is happy involves Sally's standing in the belief relation to a singular proposition that involves Bill himself as a direct constituent. Those that reject neo-Russellianism, however, are free to answer "no." But they then face a problem, to which we shall now turn.

Suppose that Sally has reason to believe, on purely general grounds, that there is exactly one person at Disneyland and that, whoever is at Disneyland is a happy person. Then (14) from above seems true. Suppose now that Bill is the person at Disneyland. In this case, although in some sense it is Bill that Sally believes to be happy, in that she believes true a proposition that is about Bill in virtue of his satisfying the condition of uniquely being at Disneyland, many have found it intuitive that Bill himself does not have the property of being believed by Sally to be happy. (Kaplan raises just this issue in his 1969 by asking whether Ralph's believing that the shortest spy is spy on the grounds that there are spies (and, presumably, only finitely many) and none of them have exactly the same height suffices for Ralph's having a de re belief concerning the shortest spy that he is a spy. Kaplan thought not and thus complicated his simple account of de re belief by requiring vivid names of the object of belief.)

If we assume a connection between the semantical conception of the de re and the metaphysical conception, then we can say that this is because the truth of (14) does not guarantee the truth of (17).

(17) The person at Disneyland is such that Sally believes that he is happy.

(17) is syntactically de re, non-controversially allows substitution, and hence is semantically de re as well. But intuitively the truth of (17), combined with the fact that Bill is the person at Disneyland, entails (7). Why does (14) not entail (17) or (7)? A plausibly answer is this. The truth of (17) and (7) requires that Sally stand in the belief relation to a singular proposition involving Bill himself as a direct constituent. But (14) can be true even if Sally believes no such proposition. The truth of (14) only requires that Sally stand in the belief relation to a purely general proposition to the effect that there is someone who uniquely is at Disneyland and that person is happy. Now, this is an answer that only a neo-Russellian is in a position to offer. One serious problem facing those who reject neo-Russellianism is to explain the intuition that (14) does not entail (17). Any such explanation will run against a thorough-going reduction of the de re to the de dicto.

The issues involving the de re/de dicto distinction are very complex. In this short note we have distinguished three different conceptions of that distinction. Exactly how these different conceptions line up is controversial. We have tried to explore some connections one might forge between the view one takes on the nature of propositional attitudes and one's conception of the de re/de dicto distinction.

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