Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Mohist Canons

1. “Canons” (jing) is a generic Chinese term for a set of concise sayings or aphorisms. It was probably a purely formal description of the texts, rather than an acknowledgment of their status as “canonical” within the Mohist school. The “All Under Heaven” book of the Zhuangzi (Book 33), China's earliest history of thought, describes later sects of Mohists as “chanting the Mohist Canon,” as if reciting scripture. This description should probably be taken with a grain of salt, however, since it is a caricature of the Mohists by their opponents, and it is unclear whether the reference is specifically to the Canons or to the Mozi as a whole.

2. I will use the italicized ‘Canons’ as the title of the two books of the Mozi containing the canons (Books 40-41) and ‘Explanations’ as the title of the books containing the explanations (Books 42-43). The non-italicized ‘canons’ and ‘explanations’ I will use as general terms referring to the various canons and explanations. Individual canons and explanations will be cited according to the numbering system in Graham's edition (2003/1978). For brevity, textual citations will not distinguish between canons and explanations (for instance, “A1” refers to either Canon A1 or Explanation A1 or both). For convenience, references to the “Big Selection” and “Small Selection” will cite section numbers from Graham's reconstructed versions, though the interpretations of the text given here may differ from his. Thus “EC1” refers to section 1 of Graham's reconstructed “Expounding the Canons” (2003: 245) and “NO1” refers to section 1 of his reconstructed “Names and Objects” (470).

3. Graham argued that the texts are organized systematically and have a single unifying theme, but later writers have generally resisted this view. Graham's theory is presented in his (2003/1978) and summarized in his (1989), 137-39. For opposing views, see Harbsmeier (1980), Geaney (1999), and Fraser (2003).

4. Though differing with him on many points, the interpretations presented here are deeply indebted to Graham's monumental work on the later Mohists (2003/1978). They are also indebted to Chad Hansen's work (1983, 1992) on points too numerous to identify one by one.

5. Graham holds that, through a series of interlocking definitions, the texts present a rationalist, a priori argument that “the benevolent and right are what will be desired on behalf of mankind by the sage,” a moral paragon with ideal knowledge (1989: 144-46). If this interpretation were correct, the later Mohist ethical theory might be a form of ideal observer theory. The grounds for this view are tenuous, however (Fraser, 2003). It depends heavily on Graham's reconstruction of a badly corrupt passage (EC2); on taking the ordinary word xian (before) to refer to a priori knowledge, in an intellectual milieu in which no other thinker formulates a notion of the a priori; on interpreting a reference to happiness (A26) as actually alluding to desire; and on positing the existence of an unknown, lost text that gave the missing definition of “care” (ai).

6. This interpretation is tentative, because two passages, one badly corrupt, seem at odds with the doctrine of equal care as summarized here. The first seems to indicate that social superiors and subordinates have an unequal degree of care for each other: superiors care less for their subordinates than vice versa, though they benefit them more (EC7). The second, corrupt fragment implies that for the sake of the world, we may care more for a great sage-king such as Yu, whose benefit to the world was exceptional (EC5).

7. “Weighing” (quan) is also treated in several other early Chinese texts, including the Analects, Mencius, Zhuangzi, Xunzi, and Lushi Chunqiu.

8. For a detailed discussion of the concept of shi (object), see Geaney (2002).

9. The label is Simon Blackburn's. See his Spreading the Word (Oxford: Clarendon, 1984).

10. This seems to be Harbsmeier's interpretation (1998: 186).

11. Two further observations on this potentially confusing issue: First, it is instructive to notice the terminology used in Xunzi's theory of language (Xunzi, Book 22). Where other texts speak of using language to express yi, Xunzi typically speaks of expressing zhi (intention), implying that in such contexts the two terms are roughly synonymous. Given its pattern of use in the classical literature, zhi is unlikely to be a semantic concept, such as “meaning,” for it typically refers to intentions, plans, or determination. As a kind of intention, of course zhi or yi will itself have intentional content, and thus the texts can speak of expressing or grasping one's zhi or yi. But the theoretical role of these terms is clearly different from that of semantic meaning. Second, in contexts where we might ask for or explain the meaning of a word or sentence, classical Chinese writers do not mention the word's yi. Instead, they use the extensional concept wei (call, refer). An interesting example comes from Mencius (3A:5), where one speaker uses wei to refer to his interpretation of a saying: “According to the Confucian teaching, the ancients acted as if protecting an infant. This saying, what does it wei (mean, refer to)? I take it to be that care has no grades or levels, but practice begins with one's parents.” If yi were semantic meaning, we would expect it to be used in contexts such as this, but it is not.

12. The ambiguity arising from the several senses of “same” is the likely basis for Gongsun Long's white horse paradox: “White horses are not horses.” Since the English to be has roughly the same range of senses, the ambiguity holds equally well in English: If the ‘is’ in question is the ‘is’ of predication, then of course a white horse is a horse. But if the ‘is’ is that of identity, then it is correct that the kind white horse is not identical to the kind horse, since not all horses are white.

13. Canon B66 is important evidence that the Mohists employ no concept with a role similar to that of the Western concept of ‘essence’, for if they did it would be natural to explain the distinction between oxen and horses by appeal to their different essences. Instead, the Mohists simply appeal to whatever features they believe allow us to reliably differentiate the two kinds.

14. This remark is premised on taking shi (“this”) and bi (“other”) in the Zhuangzi passage to refer to “this kind of thing” and “the other kind of thing.” Another defensible reading of the passage is simply to take these words as the demonstratives ‘this’ and ‘that/other’, in which case the Zhuangzi’s claim is obviously true—what in any context is referred to as “this” could, with a shift in viewpoint, instead be referred to as “that.” (I thank Chad Hansen for reminding me of this point.) On the translation of the passage, compare A. C. Graham, tr., Chuang-tzu: The Inner Chapters (London, George Allen & Unwin, 1981), 52-53.

15. In this context, realism is the view that the meanings of general terms are abstract, mind-independent entities called universals, and that concrete things belong to kinds by virtue of instantiating universals. Conceptualism holds that the meanings of general terms are concepts and that concrete things belong to certain kinds because they fall under or satisfy the corresponding concepts. Nominalism holds that the objects of thought are just words or imagined images, not abstract entities or concepts; only concrete individuals exist, and the referents of general terms are just their extensions. Things belong to kinds, denoted by the same general term, simply because language users use the same term to refer to them.

16. I adopt this suggestion from Chad Hansen (1992).

17. “Admissibility” (ke) refers to assertions that are “semantically permissible,” in that they conceivably could be uttered in some situation without violating semantic or pragmatic norms. Logical consistency in what one says is a necessary but not sufficient condition for admissibility. “Perversity” (bei) refers to assertions that are not “semantically permissible”; in uttering them one would be guilty of semantic or pragmatic contradiction, inconsistency, or other error. A logical contradiction in what one has said would be a sufficient but not necessary condition for “perversity.”

18. Graham (2003/1978) claims, strangely, that the notion of bian in the Canons is part of a different field of knowledge from the notion of bian in the “Small Selection.” As he sees it, in the Canons bian is part of the study of “disputation,” which investigates a priori, necessary relations between names, but not relations between names and objects. In the “Small Selection,” it is part of the study of “description,” which provides procedures for consistently describing, or fitting names to, objects. Against this, we can point out that the canons on bian clearly refer to name-object relations, the terminology of the two texts is highly coherent, and both refer to their subject by the same name, bian (distinguishing, distinction drawing). In the absence of any explicit statement to the contrary in the texts, it is overwhelmingly likely that the separate discussions of bian are part of a single subject.

19. As we will see shortly in several examples, “proceeding” (xing), the component of drawing parallels (mou) in which we draw out parallel statements about two or more cases, typically involves some form of material inference or what Hansen (1983) calls “algebraic inference” (inference based on analogous grammatical structure). These inferences are not the focus of the Mohists’ theoretical attention, however. The focus is on the analogical extension from one or more parallel strings of expressions to a further, formally parallel string.

20. For convenience of illustration, the examples that follow are modified from those in the “Small Selection.” The statements about brown horses and about Jack and Jill are not found in the text, though they are modeled on statements found there. A further caveat: There is no scholarly consensus concerning the interpretation of these sorts of examples in the “Small Selection.” The account that follows diverges significantly from those of Graham (2003) and Hansen (1983), for instance, who themselves disagree on many points. I will not attempt to defend this account here, since doing so would require a full-length journal article.

21. Another way of explaining the issue is to say that for the Mohists, ‘killing _____’ is an intensional context, whose satisfaction conditions may vary with the substitution of coextensive terms. Interestingly, in Canon B54, the Mohists seem to indicate that such a predicate can be treated either intensionally or extensionally. On the one hand, they hold that when coextensive terms, such as ‘dog’ and ‘hound', are substituted into it, the satisfaction conditions change. So they claim that although “dogs are hounds,” it's admissible to assert “killing dogs is not killing hounds.” Apparently, ‘killing dogs’ and ‘killing hounds' do not denote actions of the same kind (the first may have denoted slaughtering mongrels for their meat, the second killing hunting or working dogs). On the other hand, however, the text also states that “calling it killing hounds” is admissible. Thus the writers recognize that an extensional reading is also possible. For a study of intensional contexts in Mohist texts, see Zong (2000).

22. The grounds for the “this and so” category are obvious and unobjectionable. Many of the examples in the second, third, and fifth categories seem unconvincing or contrived, though a detailed discussion is beyond the scope of this article. The fourth category, “one universal and one not universal,” is implicitly based on quantifier logic and is probably on firmer ground.

23. See John Knoblock, Xunzi: A Translation and Study of the Complete Works, Vol. 3 (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1994), sections 18.9 and 22.2f. The reference to Xunzi in the next paragraph is also to section 22.2f.

24. The precise chronology of the Mohist Dialectics and the Xunzian theory of language is impossible to determine, as is whether Xunzi himself was directly responsible for formulating the theory of language that appears in the anthology bearing his name. However, I am assuming that since the claim “killing robbers isn't killing people” is cited for criticism in the discourse on language in the Xunzi (Book 22), the Xunzian theory is probably later.

25. I am grateful to Chad Hansen for numerous constructive comments on an earlier draft of this article, many of which have been incorporated into the present version.