# First-order Model Theory

*First published Sat Nov 10, 2001; substantive revision Tue May 17, 2005*

First-order model theory, also known as classical model theory, is a branch of mathematics that deals with the relationships between descriptions in first-order languages and the structures that satisfy these descriptions. From one point of view, this is a vibrant area of mathematical research that brings logical methods (in particular the theory of definition) to bear on deep problems of classical mathematics. From another point of view, first-order model theory is the paradigm for the rest of model theory; it is the area in which many of the broader ideas of model theory were first worked out.

- 1. First-order languages and structures
- 2. Elementary maps
- 3. Five grand theorems
- 4. Three useful constructions
- 5. Three successful programmes
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. First-order languages and structures

Mathematical model theory carries a heavy load of notation, and HTML is
not the best container for it. In what follows, syntactic objects
(languages, theories, sentences) are generally written in roman or
greek letters (for example L, T, φ), and set-theoretic objects such
as structures and their elements are written in italic (*A*,
*a*). Two exceptions are that variables are italic (*x*,
*y*) and that sequences of elements are written with lower case
roman letters (a, b).

We recall and refine some definitions from the entries on
classical logic
and
model theory.
A *signature* is a set
of individual constants, predicate symbols and function symbols; each
of the predicate symbols and function symbols has an *arity*
(for example it is binary if its arity is 2). Each signature K gives
rise to a first-order language, by building up formulas from the
symbols in the signature together with logical symbols (including =)
and punctuation.

If K is a signature, then a *structure of signature* K, say
*A*, consists of the following items:

- A set called the
*domain*of*A*and written dom(*A*); it is usually assumed to be nonempty; - for each individual constant
*c*in K, an element*c*of dom(^{A}*A*); - for each predicate symbol
*P*of arity*n*, an*n*-ary relation*P*on dom(^{A}*A*); - for each function symbol
*F*of arity*n*, an*n*-ary function*F*from dom(^{A}*A*) to dom(*A*).

The *elements* of *A* are the elements of
dom(*A*). Likewise the *cardinality* or *power* of
*A* is the cardinality of its domain. Since we can recover the
signature K from the first-order language L that it generates, we can
and will refer to structures of signature K as L-*structures*.
We think of *c* as a name for the element
*c*^{A} in the structure *A*, and
likewise with the other symbols.

For example the field of real numbers forms a structure
* R* whose elements are the real numbers, with
signature consisting of the individual constant 0 to name the number
zero, a 1-ary function symbol - for minus, and two 2-ary function
symbols + and . for plus and times. At first sight we can't add a
symbol to express 1/

*x*, since all the named functions have to be defined on the whole domain of the structure, and there is no such real number as 1/0. But on second thoughts this is not a serious problem; any competent mathematician puts the condition ‘

*x*is not zero’ before dividing by

*x*, and so it never matters what the value of 1/0 is, and we can harmlessly take it to be 42. But most model theorists are uncomfortable with any kind of division by zero, so they stick with plus, times and minus.

If L is the first-order language of signature K, then
Tarski's model-theoretic truth definition
tells us when a sentence of L is true in *A*, and when an
assignment of elements of *A* to variables satisfies a formula
of L in *A*. Instead of talking of assignments satisfying a
formula, model theorists often speak of the set of *n*-tuples of
elements of *A* that is *defined* by a formula φ
(*v*_{1},…,*v*_{n}); the
connection is that an *n*-tuple
(*a*_{1},…,*a*_{n}) is in
the defined set if and only if the assignment taking each
*v*_{i} to *a*_{i}
satisfies the formula.

If φ is a sentence, we write

A⊨ φ

to mean that φ is true in *A*, or in other words, *A*
is a model of φ. If
φ(*v*_{1},…,*v*_{n})
is a formula with free variables as shown, we write

A⊨ φ[a]

to mean that the *n*-tuple a is in the set defined by φ.
(The entry on
classical logic
uses
the notation ‘*A,s*
⊨
φ’,
where *s* is any assignment to all the variables
of L that assigns to each variable *v*_{i} free
in φ the *i*-th element in the *n*-tuple a.)

Two L-structures that are models of exactly the same sentences of L
are said to be *elementarily equivalent*. Elementary equivalence
is an equivalence relation on the class of all L-structures. The set of
all the sentences of L that are true in the L-structure *A* is
called the *complete theory* of *A*, in symbols
Th(*A*). A theory that is Th(*A*) for some structure
*A* is said to be *complete*. (By the completeness
theorem for first-order logic, for which see the entry on
classical logic,
a theory is complete if
and only if it is maximal syntactically consistent.) The two structures
*A* and *B* are elementarily equivalent if and only if
Th(*A*) = Th(*B*).

To continue the example of the field * R* of
real numbers: It is often not at all obvious whether two given
structures are or are not elementarily equivalent. One of the greatest
achievements of the pre-history of model theory was Tarski's
description in 1930 of Th(

*) (which he published in full only after the war; see his book in the Bibliography below). This description implied among other things that the structures elementarily equivalent to*

**R***are exactly the real-closed fields, a class of fields which was already known to the algebraists in its own right.*

**R**
When mathematicians introduce a class of structures, they like to
define what they count as the basic maps between these structures. The
basic maps between structures of the same signature K are called
*homomorphisms*, defined as follows. A *homomorphism from
structure A to structure B* is a function *f* from
dom(*A*) to dom(*B*) with the property that for every
atomic formula
φ(*v*_{1},…,*v*_{n})
and any *n*-tuple a =
(*a*_{1},…,*a*_{n}) of
elements of *A*,

A⊨ φ [a] ⇒B⊨ φ [b]

where b is
(*f*(*a*_{1}),…,*f*(*a*_{n})).
If we have ‘⇔’ in place of
‘⇒’ in the quoted condition, we say that *f* is
an *embedding* of *A* into *B*. Since the language
includes =, an embedding of *A* into *B* is always
one-to-one, though it need not be onto the domain of *B*. If it
is onto, then the inverse map from dom(*B*) to dom(*A*)
is also a homomorphism, and both the embedding and its inverse are said
to be *isomorphisms*. We say that two structures are
*isomorphic* if there is an isomorphism from one to the other.
Isomorphism is an equivalence relation on the class of all structures
of a fixed signature K. If two structures are isomorphic then they
share all model-theoretic properties; in particular they are
elementarily equivalent.

If *A* and *B* are structures of signature K with
dom(*A*) a subset of dom(*B*), and the interpretations in
*A* of the symbols in K are just the restrictions of their
interpretations in *B*, then we say that *A* is a
*substructure* of *B* and conversely *B* is an
*extension* of *A*. If moreover *B* has some
elements that are not in *A*, we say that *A* is a
*proper substructure* of *B* and *B* is an
*proper extension* of *A*. If *B* is a structure
and *X* is a nonempty subset of dom(*B*), then there is a
unique smallest substructure of *B* whose domain contains all of
*X*. It is known as the *substructure of B* generated by
*X*, and we find it by first adding to *X* all the
elements *c ^{B}* where

*c*are individual constants of K, and then closing off under the functions

*F*where

^{B}*F*are function symbols of K.

For example the substructure of the field
* R* generated by the number 1 consists of 1, 0
(since it is named by the constant 0), 1+1, 1+1+1 etc., −1,
−2 etc., in other words the ring of integers. (There is no need
to close off under multiplication too, since the set of integers is
already closed under multiplication.) If we had included a symbol for
1/

*x*too, the substructure generated by 1 would have been the field of rational numbers. So the notion of substructure is sensitive to the choice of signature.

## 2. Elementary maps

Let L be a first-order language and let *A* and *B* be
L-structures. Suppose *e* is a function which takes some
elements of *A* to elements of *B*. We say that
*e* is an *elementary map* if whenever a sequence of
elements *a*_{1}, …,
*a*_{n} in the domain of *e* satisfy a
formula
φ(*x*_{1},…,*x*_{n})
of L in *A*, their images under *e* satisfy the same
formula in *B*; in symbols

A⊨ φ(a_{1},…,a_{n}) ⇒B⊨ φ(e(a_{1}),…,e(a_{n})).

We say that *e* is an *elementary embedding* of
*A* into *B* if *e* is an elementary map and its
domain is the whole domain of *A*. As the name implies,
elementary embeddings are always embeddings.

If there is an elementary embedding from *A* to *B*
then *A* and *B* are elementarily equivalent. On the
other hand an embedding between elementarily equivalent structures, or
even between isomorphic structures, need not be elementary. (For
example, writing * Z* for the abelian group of
the integers with signature consisting of 0 and +, the embedding from

*to*

**Z***that takes each integer*

**Z***n*to 2

*n*is an embedding, and of course

*is isomorphic to itself; but this embedding is not elementary, since 1 satisfies the formula ¬∃*

**Z***y*(

*y*+

*y*=

*v*

_{1}), but 2 doesn't.)

We say that *A* is an *elementary substructure* of
*B*, and *B* is an *elementary extension* of
*A*, if *A* is a substructure of *B* and the
inclusion map is an elementary embedding. It's immediate from the
definitions that an elementary extension of an elementary extension of
*A* is again an elementary extension of *A*.

Elementary embeddings are natural maps to consider within
first-order model theory. Around 1950 Abraham Robinson was impressed
that maps between algebraic structures in general seem hardly ever to
be elementary, whereas some important maps (such as embeddings between
two algebraically closed fields, or between two real-closed fields)
turn out to be elementary. He was also surprised to find that this fact
about algebraically closed fields is another way of stating a
celebrated theorem called the Hilbert Nullstellensatz. These
observations of Robinson have had a huge effect on the development of
model theory. In Robinson's terminology, a first-order theory is
*model-complete* if every embedding between models of the theory
is elementary. This notion has found many uses, and it often appears in
applications of model theory in algebra.

Elementary embeddings have a number of properties that make them useful. We have space for four.

The downward Loewenheim-Skolem theorem:

Suppose L is a first-order language which has κ formulas,Ais an L-structure and λ is a cardinal which is at least κ but less than the cardinality ofA. Suppose also thatXis a set of at most λ elements ofA. ThenAhas an elementary substructure which has cardinality exactly λ and contains all the elements inX.

There is a proof of this in the entry on classical logic, using Skolem hulls. Note that λ must be infinite since every first-order language has infinitely many formulas.

The elementary chain theorem:

Suppose that L is a first-order language andA_{0},A_{1}, … is a sequence (of any length) of L-structures such that any structure in the sequence is an elementary substructure of all the later structures in the sequence. Then there is a unique smallest L-structureBwhich contains all the structures in the sequence as substructures; this structureBis an elementary extension of all the structures in the sequence.

The elementary amalgamation theorem:

Suppose L is a first-order language,Ais an L-structure andB,Care two elementary extensions ofA. Then there are an elementary extensionDofBand an elementary embeddingeofCintoDsuch that (i) for each elementaofA,e(a)=a, and (ii) ifcis an element ofCbut not ofA, thene(c)is not inB.

The latter is a consequence of the compactness theorem in the next section.

The upward Loewenheim-Skolem theorem:

Suppose L is a first-order language which has κ formulas,Ais an L-structure whose cardinality is an infinite cardinal μ, and λ is a cardinal which is at least as great as both κ and μ. ThenAhas an elementary extension whose cardinality is λ.

There is a proof of this in the entry on classical logic. The name of the theorem is a little unfortunate, since the theorem was first proved by Tarski, and Skolem didn't even believe it (because he didn't believe in uncountable cardinals).

There is another proof using the elementary amalgamation theorem and
the elementary chain theorem. The compactness theorem and the diagram
lemma (see below) allow us to prove that *A* has a proper
elementary extension *A*′. Now use *A*′ and
again *A*′ for the structures *B* and *C* in
the elementary amalgamation theorem. Then *D* as in the theorem
is an elementary extension of *A*, and by (ii) in the theorem,
it must contain elements that are not in *A*′, so that it
is a proper elementary extension. Repeat to get a proper elementary
extension of *D*, and so on until you have an infinite
elementary chain. Use the elementary chain theorem to find an
elementary extension of *A* that sits on top of this chain. Keep
repeating these moves until you have an elementary extension of
*A* that has cardinality at least λ. Then if necessary
use the downward Loewenheim-Skolem theorem to pull the cardinality down
to exactly λ. This kind of argument is very common in
first-order model theory.

## 3. Five grand theorems

The five theorems reported in this section are in some sense the pillars of classical model theory. All of them are theorems about first-order model theory. A great deal of the work done in the third quarter of the twentieth century was devoted to working out the consequences of these theorems within first-order model theory, and the extent to which similar theorems hold for languages that are not first-order.

### 3.1 The compactness theorem

If T is a first-order theory, and every finite subset of T has a model, then T has a model.

There is a proof of this theorem in the entry on classical logic. The theorem has several useful paraphrases. For example it is equivalent to the following statement:

Suppose T is a first-order theory and φ is a first-order sentence. If T ⊨ φ then there is a finite subset U of T such that U ⊨ φ.

(See the entry on model theory for the notion ⊨ of model-theoretic consequence. To derive the second statement from the first, note that ‘T ⊨ φ’ is true if and only if there is no model of the theory T ∪ {¬ φ}.)

Anatolii Mal'tsev first gave the compactness theorem in 1938 (for first-order logic of any signature), and used it in 1940/1 to prove several theorems about groups; this seems to have been the first application of model theory within classical mathematics. Leon Henkin and Abraham Robinson independently rediscovered the theorem a few years later and gave some further applications. The theorem fails badly for nearly all infinitary languages.

### 3.2 The diagram lemma

If *A* is an L-structure, then we form the *diagram* of
*A* as follows. First add to L a supply of new individual
constants to serve as names for all the elements of *A*. (This
illustrates how in first-order model theory we easily find ourselves
using uncountable signatures. The ‘symbols’ in these
signatures are abstract set-theoretic objects, not marks on a page.)
Then using L and these new constants, the *diagram* of
*A* is the set of all the atomic sentences and negations of
atomic sentences that are true in *A*.

IfB′ is a model of the diagram ofA, andBisB′ with the new constants removed from the signature, then there is an embedding ofAintoB.

Namely, if an element of *A* is named by a new constant
*c*, then map that element to the element of *B*′
named *c*. A variant of this lemma is used in the proof of the
elementary amalgamation theorem.

### 3.3 The Lyndon interpolation theorem

This theorem may have the longest pedigree of any theorem of model theory, since it generalises the Laws of Distribution for syllogisms, which go back at least to the early Renaissance. The theorem is easiest to state if we assume that our first-order languages have symbols ∧,

∨ and ¬, but not → or ⇔. Then an occurrence of a predicate symbol R in a formula φ is said to be*positive*(resp.

*negative*) if it lies within the scope of an even (resp. odd) number of occurrences of ¬.

Suppose L and M are first-order languages, L ∪ M is the smallest first-order language containing both L and M, and L ∩ M is the language consisting of all the formulas which are in both L and M. Suppose T is a theory in L, U is a theory in M, and no (L ∪ M)-structure is both a model of T and a model of U. Then there is a sentence φ of L ∩ M which is true in all models of T and false in all models of U. (This sentence φ is called theinterpolant.) Moreover every predicate symbol with a positive occurrence in φ has a positive occurrence in some sentence of T and a negative occurrence in some sentence of U, and conversely every predicate symbol with a negative occurrence in φ has a negative occurrence in some sentence of T and a positive occurrence in some sentence of U.

There are several proofs of this theorem, and not all of them are model-theoretic. Without the last sentence, the theorem is known as Craig's interpolation theorem, since William Craig proved this version a few years before Roger Lyndon found the full statement in 1959. As Craig noted at the time, his interpolation theorem gives a neat proof of Evert Beth's definability theorem, which runs as follows.

Suppose that L is a first-order language and M is the first-order
language got by adding to L a new predicate symbol R. Suppose also that
T is a theory in M. We say that T *implicitly defines* R if it
is false that there are two M-structures which are models of T, have
the same elements and interpret all the symbols of L in the same way
but interpret the symbol R differently. We say that T *defines*
R *explicitly* if there is a formula
φ(*x*_{1},…,*x*_{n})
of L such that in every model of T, the formulas φ and
R(*x*_{1},…,*x*_{n}) are
satisfied by exactly the same *n*-tuples
(*a*_{1},…,*a*_{n}) of
elements. It is easy to see that if T defines R explicitly then it
defines R implicitly. (This fact is known as *Padoa's method*;
Padoa used the failure of implicit definability as a way of proving the
failure of explicit definability.) Beth's theorem is the converse:

Suppose that L, M, R and T are as above. If T defines R implicitly then T defines R explicitly.

### 3.4 The omitting types theorem

Suppose L is a first-order language which has countably many formulas. Suppose T is a complete theory in L, and Φ is a set of formulas of L which all have the free variablex. Finally suppose that every model of T contains an element which satisfies all the formulas in Φ. Then there is a formula ψ(x) of L such that in every model of T there is an element satisfying ψ, and every element that satisfies ψ in any model of T also satisfies all the formulas in Φ. (In other words, there is a finite reason why the ‘type’ Φ can't be ‘omitted’ in any model of T.)

This theorem, which goes back to the mid 1950s, very definitely
depends on the language being first-order and countable. It has several
useful generalisations, for example *model-theoretic forcing*,
which is an analogue of the forcing construction in
set theory.
In fact the games used for
model-theoretic forcing (see the entry on
logic and games)
can be adapted to prove the
omitting types theorem too. There are similar but more complicated
theorems for uncountable first-order languages; some of these can be
paraphrased as omitting types theorems for
infinitary languages.

### 3.5 The initial model theorem

A quantifier-free formula is said to be a *Horn formula* (after
Alfred Horn) if it has one of the three forms

- ψ,
- φ
_{1}∧ … ∧ φ_{n}→ ψ, - ¬(φ
_{1}∧ … ∧ φ_{n}),

where the formulas φ_{1}, …,
φ_{n}, ψ are all atomic. A *universal Horn
sentence* (also known to the computer scientists as a *Horn
clause*) is a sentence that consists of universal quantifiers
followed by a quantifier-free Horn formula; it is said to be
*strict* if no negation sign occurs in it (i.e. if it doesn't
come from a quantifier-free Horn formula of the third kind).

Let T be a theory consisting of strict universal Horn sentences. Then T has a modelAwith the property that for every modelBof T there is a unique homomorphism fromAtoB. (Such a modelAis called aninitial modelof T. It is unique up to isomorphism.)

This theorem is a generalisation, due to Mal'tsev, of a group-theoretic
construction called *construction by generators and relations*.
It is the main idea behind *algebraic specification*, which is
one approach to the specification of systems in computer science. The
required behaviour of the system is written down as a set of strict
universal Horn sentences, and then the initial model of these sentences
is an abstract version of the required system.

## 4. Three useful constructions

A construction is a procedure for building a structure. We have already seen several constructions in the theorems above: for example the omitting types construction and the initial model construction. Here are three more.

### 4.1 Products and reduced products

If *A* and *B* are L-structures, we form their
*product* *C* = *A* `X` *B* as
follows. The elements of *C* are the ordered pairs
(*a*,*b*) where *a* is an element of *A*
and *b* is an element of *B*. The predicate symbols are
interpreted ‘pointwise’, i.e. so that for example

(a,b)is in P^{C}if and only ifais in P^{A}andbis in P^{B}.

The structures *A* and *B* are called the
*factors* of *A* `X` *B*. In the same way
we can form products of any number of structures. If all the factors of
a product are the same structure *A*, the product is called a
*power* of *A*. A theorem called the *Feferman-Vaught
theorem* tells us how to work out the complete theory of the
product from the complete theories of its factors.

This construction has some variants. We can define an equivalence
relation on the domain of a product *C*, and then take a
structure *D* whose elements are the equivalence classes; the
predicate symbols are interpreted in *D* so as to make the
natural map from dom(*C*) to dom(*D*) a homomorphism. In
this case the structure *D* is called a *reduced product*
of the factors of *C*. It is a *reduced power* of
*A* if all the factors are equal to *A*; in this case the
*diagonal map* from *A* to *D* is the one got by
taking each element *a* to the equivalence class of the element
(*a*,*a*,…).

Suppose we use a set *I* to index the factors in a product
*C*. An *ultrafilter* over *I* is a set *U*
of subsets of *I* with the properties

- if sets
*X*and*Y*are in*U*then so is their intersection*X ∩ Y*; - if
*X*is in*U*and*X ⊆ Y ⊆ I*then*Y*is in*U*; - for each subset
*X*of*I*, exactly one of*X*and its complement*I*\ X is in*U*.

If we have an ultrafilter *U* over *I*, then we can
construct a reduced product from *C* by making two elements of
*C* equivalent if and only if the set of indices at which they
are equal is a set in the ultrafilter *U*. This is indeed an
equivalence relation on the domain of *C*, and the resulting
reduced product is called an *ultraproduct* of the factors of
*C*. If *C* is a power of *A* then this
ultraproduct is called an *ultrapower* of *A*, and it is
sometimes written *U*-prod *A*. A theorem called
*Łoś's theorem* describes what sentences are true in
an ultraproduct. Its most useful consequence is the following:

IfUis an ultrafilter then the diagonal map fromAtoU-prodAis an elementary embedding.

If the ultrafilter *U* is *nonprincipal*, i.e. contains
no finite sets, then the diagonal map is not onto the domain of
*U*-prod *A*, and in fact *U*-prod *A* is
generally much larger than *A*. So we have a way of constructing
large elementary extensions. The axiom of choice guarantees that every
infinite set has many nonprincipal ultrafilters over it. Ultrapowers
are an essential tool for handling large cardinals in set theory (see
the entry on
set theory).

A remarkable (but in practice not terribly useful) theorem of
Saharon Shelah tells us that a pair of structures *A* and
*B* are elementarily equivalent if and only if they have
ultrapowers that are isomorphic to each other.

### 4.2 Saturation

Suppose *A* is an L-structure, *X* is a set of elements
of *A*, *B* is an elementary extension of *A* and
*b*, *c* are two elements of *B*. Then *b*
and *c* are said to have *the same type over X* if for
every formula
φ(*v*_{1},…,*v*_{n+1})
of L and every *n*-tuple d of elements of *X*,

B⊨ φ[b,d] ⇔B⊨ φ[c,d].

We say that *A* is *saturated* if whenever *X* is
a set of elements of *A*, of cardinality less than that of
*A*, and *B* is any elementary extension of *A*,
we always have that every element of *B* has the same type over
*X* as some element already in *A*.

This rather heavy definition gives little clue how useful saturated structures are. If every structure had a saturated elementary extension, many of the results of model theory would be much easier to prove. Unfortunately the existence of saturated elementary extensions depends on features of the surrounding universe of sets. There are technical ways around this obstacle, for example using weakenings of the notion of saturation. We have two main ways of constructing saturated elementary extensions. One is by ultrapowers, using cleverly constructed ultrafilters. The other is by taking unions of elementary chains, generalising the proof we gave for the upward Loewenheim-Skolem theorem.

The existence of partially saturated elementary extensions of the
field * R* of real numbers is the main technical
fact behind Abraham Robinson's

*nonstandard analysis*. See Section 4 of the entry on model theory for more information on this. Though model theory provided the first steps in nonstandard analysis, this branch of analysis rapidly became a subject in its own right, and its links with first-order model theory today are rather slim.

### 4.3 Ehrenfeucht-Mostowski models

Let *A* be an L-structure, *X* a set of elements of
*A* and < a linear ordering of *X* (not necessarily
definable by a first-order formula). We say that (*X*,<) is
an *indiscernible sequence* in *A* if for every natural
number *n*, and all elements
*a*_{1},…,*a*_{n},*b*_{
1},…,*b* _{n} of *A* such
that *a*_{1} < … <
*a*_{n} and *b*_{1} <
… < *b*_{n}, the map taking each
*a*_{i} to the corresponding
*b*_{i} is an elementary map. If T is a theory
with infinite models, then T has models that are the Skolem hulls (see
the entry on
classical logic)
of
indiscernible sequences. These models are known as
*Ehrenfeucht-Mostowski models*, after the two Polish model
theorists who first carried out this construction in the mid 1950s.
These models tend to be the opposite of saturated; we can arrange that
very few types over sets of elements are represented among their
elements. Some important distinctions between different models of set
theory can be expressed in terms of the indiscernible sequences within
these models; see the entry on
set theory.

## 5. Three successful programmes

Every healthy branch of mathematics needs a set of problems that form a serious challenge for its researchers. We close with a brief introduction to some of the research programmes that drove first-order model theory forwards in the second half of the twentieth century. The book of Marcja and Toffalori in the bibliography gives further information abou these programmes. There are other current programmes besides these; see for example the handbook edited by Yuri Ershov, which is about model theory when the structures are built recursively.

### 5.1. Categoricity and classification

In 1904 Oswald Veblen stole a term from Kant and described a theory as
*categorical* if it has just one model up to isomorphism (i.e.
it has a model and all its models are isomorphic to each other). The
depressing news is that there are no categorical first-order theories
with infinite models; we can see this at once from the upward
Loewenheim-Skolem theorem. In fact if T is a first-order theory with
infinite models, then the strongest kind of categoricity we can hope
for in T is that for certain infinite cardinals κ, T has exactly
one model of cardinality κ, up to isomorphism. This property of T
is called κ-*categoricity*.

Now there is a heuristic principle that many people have used, though it seems to have no simple formulation. I suggest ‘Few is beautiful’. The principle says that if a first-order theory T constrains its models (of a particular cardinality) to be all similar to each other, this can only be because the models of T have few irregularities and asymmetries. So there should be a good structural description of these models. One should expect that they are ‘good structures’ from the point of view of classical mathematics. As a first step, one easily sees from the upward and downward Loewenheim-Skolem theorems that if T is κ-categorical for some κ at least as large as the number of formulas in the language of T, then T must be a complete theory. From now on, T is a complete theory with infinite models; and for simplicity we shall assume that the language of T is countable.

In 1954 Jerzy Łoś announced that he could only find three kinds of example of theories T that are κ-categorical. Namely:

- T is
*totally categorical*if it is κ-categorical for every infinite cardinal κ. A typical example is the complete theory of an infinite-dimensional vector space over a finite field. - T is
*uncountably categorical*(but not totally categorical) if it is κ-categorical precisely when κ is uncountable. Essentially the only example that Łoś could find was the complete theory of an algebraically closed field; this is uncountably categorical by a well-known theorem of Steinitz. - T is
*countably categorical*(but not uncountably categorical) if it is κ-categorical precisely when κ is countable. A typical example is the complete theory of a dense linear ordering with no first or last element; this is countably categorical by a well-known theorem of Cantor.

Łoś asked whether there are any other possibilities besides these three. (Of course most complete theories are not κ-categorical for any κ.)

This question of Łoś was a tremendous stimulus to
research, and it led to a classic paper of Michael Morley in 1965 which
showed that Łoœ's three possibilities are in fact the only
ones. One central idea of Morley's analysis was that models of an
uncountably categorical theory have the smallest possible number of
types of element; this led directly to the branch of model theory
called *stability theory*, which studies theories that have a
limited number of element types. These theories have the remarkable
property that every infinite indiscernible sequence in any of their
models is indiscernible under any linear ordering whatever; so these
sequences are a kind of generalisation of bases of vector spaces.
Another idea implicit in Morley's work, but much clarified by later
work of William Marsh, John Baldwin and Alistair Lachlan, was that in
any model of an uncountably categorical theory there is a central core
(called a *strongly minimal set*) which carries a dependence
relation obeying similar laws to linear dependence in vector spaces. In
terms of this dependence relation one can define a dimension for the
model, and what remains of the model outside the core is so closely
tied to the core that the dimension determines the model up to
isomorphism.

Saharon Shelah developed Morley's ideas with great resourcefulness
and energy. His main aim was to stretch the ‘Few is
beautiful’ idea by showing that there are clear dividing lines
between kinds of theory T. On one side of a dividing line are theories
with some good structural property that forces the number of
nonisomorphic models of a given cardinality to be small. On the other
side, every theory has (for example) two models of the same cardinality
that are not isomorphic but are extremely hard to tell apart. Shelah
coined the name *classification theory* for this research,
though the name never caught on. The text of Lascar listed below is an
elegant introduction to this whole programme, from Los to Shelah.
Meanwhile Shelah himself has extended it far beyond first-order logic.
Even in the first-order case, Shelah had to invent new set-theoretic
techniques (such as proper forcing) to carry out his constructions.

### 5.2. Geometric model theory

Geometric model theory grew out of Michael Morley's 1965 paper, but in
a different direction from Shelah's work (though today it makes regular
use of technical tools developed by Shelah in his classification
programme). Morley had shown that models of an uncountably categorical
theory have structural properties that are interesting in their own
right, regardless of the complete theory of the structure; so it became
the custom to talk of *uncountably categorical structures*,
meaning models of uncountably categorical theories. (And likewise
*totally categorical structures*.) Independently Boris Zilber in
Siberia and Greg Cherlin in the United States noticed that any infinite
group that is definable in an uncountably categorical structure must
have many features in common with the algebraic groups studied by
algebraic geometers. Zilber in particular showed that many methods from
algebraic geometry generalise to the model-theoretic case. His secret
weapon was Bezout's Theorem from geometry, which he used to guide him
to solutions of very difficult model theoretic problems; for example
his theorem that no totally categorical theory can be axiomatised by a
finite number of axioms. (It was secret in the sense that it guided his
intuition but never appeared explicitly in his results.) Zilber also
noticed an important difference between the first and second of Los's
examples above. Namely, in a vector space the subspaces (i.e. the
subsets closed under linear dependence) form a modular lattice; but the
algebraically closed subsets of an algebraically closed field form a
lattice that is not modular.

Partly because of the difficulty of communications between Siberia
and the West, these results of Zilber took some time to digest, and in
part they had to be rediscovered in the West. But when the message did
finally get through, the result was a new branch of model theory which
has come to be known as *geometric model theory*. The programme
is broadly to classify structures according to (a) what groups or
fields are interpretable in them (in the sense sketched in the entry
on
model theory)
and (b) whether or not the
structures have ‘modular geometries’; and then to use this
classification to solve problems in model theory and geometry. Since
the mid 1980s the leader of this research has been Ehud Hrushovski. In
the early 1990s, using joint work with Zilber, Hrushovski gave a
model-theoretic proof (the first complete proof to be found) of the
geometric Mordell-Lang conjecture in all characteristics; this was a
conjecture in classical diophantine geometry. The book edited by
Bouscaren in the references below is devoted to Hrushovski's proof and
the necessary background in model theory. Both (a) and (b) are
fundamental to Hrushovski's argument.

### 5.3. O-minimality

Of the three programmes described here, this is the oldest, since it
grew out of Tarski's description of the complete theory of the field of
real numbers (which he proved by the method of quantifier elimination;
see section 2.2 of the entry on
Tarski's truth definitions).
In the course of giving this description,
Tarski had shown that every first-order formula φ(*x*) in
the relevant language, possibly with parameters, is satisfied by
exactly the same assignments as some boolean combination of formulas of
the form *x < s* or *t < x* where *s*,
*t* are constant terms naming parameters. Another way of saying
this is that

Every set of elements definable by a first-order formula is a finite union of open intervals with named endpoints, together with some finite set of elements.

A linearly ordered structure with this property is said to be
*o-minimal*. (The idea of the name is that o-minimality is an
analogue of ‘strong minimality’, in a form that makes sense
for structures that carry a linear ordering, whence ‘o-’
for ordering.)

In 1982 Lou van den Dries showed that the fact that the field of
real numbers is o-minimal gives a large amount of useful information
about the definable sets of higher dimension, such as the family of
definable subsets of the real plane. Soon after this, Julia Knight,
Anand Pillay and Charles Steinhorn noticed that if a structure
*A* is o-minimal, then so is any structure elementarily
equivalent to *A*, and that Van den Dries' analysis of
higher-dimensional definable set applies to all these structures. These
results led to much activity on the frontier between model theory and
function theory. Several old problems from model theory and function
theory were solved. Alex Wilkie showed that the field of real numbers
with a symbol for exponentiation is o-minimal and has a model-complete
complete theory, and thereby gave a positive answer to Tarski's old
problem of whether this structure allows a quantifier elimination
(though his method was very far from the syntactic analysis that Tarski
had in mind). We now know a wide range of ways of adding interesting
features to the field of real numbers in such a way that the resulting
structure is still o-minimal (and hence in some sense mathematically
tractable). Van den Dries has urged that o-minimal structures provide a
good setting for developing the ‘tame topology’ programme
of Alexander Grothendieck.

## Bibliography

- Beth, E. 1953, "On Padoa's method in the theory of definition",
*Nederl. Akad. Wetensch. Proc. Ser. A***56**, 330-339. - Bouscaren, E. ed. 1998,
*Model Theory and Algebraic Geometry: An introduction to E. Hrushovski's proof of the geometric Mordell-Lang conjecture*, Lecture Notes in Mathematics**1696**, Berlin : Springer-Verlag. - Buechler. S. 1996,
*Essential Stability Theory*, Berlin : Springer-Verlag,. - Chang, C. and Keisler, J. 1990,
*Model Theory*, Amsterdam : North-Holland. - Dries, L. van den 1998,
*Tame Topology and O-minimal Structures*, Cambridge : Cambridge University Press. - Ehrig, H. and Mahr, B. 1985,
*Fundamentals of Algebraic Specification I: Equations and Initial Semantics*, Berlin : Springer-Verlag. - Ershov, Y. ed. 1998,
*Handbook of Recursive Mathematics I, Recursive Model Theory*, New York : Elsevier. - Hart, B., Lachlan, A. and Valeriote, M. 1996,
*Algebraic Model Theory*, Dordrecht : Kluwer. - Haskell, D., Pillay, A. and Steinhorn, C. 2000,
*Model Theory, Algebra, and Geometry*, Cambridge : Cambridge University Press. - Hodges, W. 1993,
*Model Theory*, Cambridge : Cambridge University Press. - Hodges, W. 1998, "The laws of distribution for syllogisms",
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic***39**, 221-230. - Lascar, D. 1986,
*Stability in Model Theory*, Harlow : Longman. - Marcja, A. and Toffalori, C. 2003,
*A Guide to Classical and Modern Model Theory*, Dordrecht : Kluwer. - Marker, D. 2002,
*Model Theory: An Introduction*, New York : Springer-Verlag. - Morley, M. 1965, "Categoricity in power",
*Transactions of the American Mathematical Society***114**, 514-538. - Pillay, A. 1996,
*Geometric Stability Theory*, Oxford : Oxford University Press. - Poizat, B. 2000,
*A Course in Model Theory*, New York : Springer. - Shelah, S. 1990,
*Classification Theory*, Amsterdam : North-Holland. - Tarski, A. 1951,
*A Decision Method for Elementary Algebra and Geometry*, Berkeley, University of California Press. - Vaught, R. 1974, "Model theory before 1945", in
*Proceedings of the Tarski Symposium*, ed. L. Henkin et al., Providence RI : American Mathematical Society, 153-172.

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## Related Entries

logic: and games | logic: classical | logic: infinitary | model theory | set theory | Tarski, Alfred: truth definitions