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Medieval Theories: Properties of Terms

First published Tue Feb 5, 2002; substantive revision Fri Jan 27, 2006

The theory of properties of terms (proprietates terminorum) was the basis of the medievals' semantic theory. It embraced those properties of linguistic expressions necessary to explain truth, fallacy and inference, the three central concepts of logical analysis. The theory evolved out of the work of Anselm and Abelard at the turn of the twelfth century, developed steadily through the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries and was still undergoing changes in the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries. It is generally agreed that its early stages were closely bound up with the theory of fallacies, but as a general semantic theory, it developed in response to a variety of needs, and one mistake of modern attempts at interpretation is to seek a unique rationale of one notion or another. Each notion evolved continually, satisfying one need at one time and another at a later date, and often several conflicting needs at the same time. Another mistake is to try to map each notion seriatim onto corresponding notions in contemporary semantic theory, but although one can see analogies and similarities, none of the medieval "properties" matches exactly any modern notion.

1. Historical Survey

William of Sherwood, writing from an Oxford perspective in the 1240s, identified four properties of terms: signification, supposition, copulation and appellation: "There are four properties of terms that we intend to distinguish now … These properties are signification, supposition, copulation, and appellation" (tr. Kretzmann, p. 105).[1] A different tradition is represented by Peter of Spain and Lambert of Lagny, namely, that of Paris. Lambert identifies five properties of terms: supposition, appellation, restriction, distribution and relation: "Now, there are many properties of terms: supposition, appellation, restriction, distribution [distinction], and relation … But because signification is, as it were, the fulfillment of a term, and the properties of terms are founded on signification, for the sake of clarity in what follows we must at the outset consider what the signification of a term is, and how it differs from supposition" (tr. Kretzmann and Stump, p. 104).[2] In his treatment he includes ampliation (a correlative to restriction) and thereby matches the sections in Peter of Spain's Tractatus: De suppositionibus (On Suppositions), De relativis (On Anaphora), De ampliationibus (On Ampliations), De appellationibus (On Appellations), De restrictionibus (On Restrictions), De distributionibus (On Distribution).

To these must be added further properties of terms which were important in the theory's gestation in the twelfth century but were later no longer included as distinct properties: univocation, equivocation, adjectivation, substantivation and so on. From the fourteenth century onwards, other properties were also abandoned, so that finally the important lasting properties were signification, supposition, ampliation and restriction, and the supposition of relatives.

Given the central importance which it later attained, it is surprising how late supposition was in being identified as one of the properties of terms. In the twelfth century, the primary distinction was that between signification, or univocation, and appellation. As early as Anselm's De Grammatico we find a distinction between significare per se (signify as such) and significare per aliud (signify relatively). The latter was also known as appellare (to name or appellate). Whereas in the former (per se) what was signified was a form, in the latter what was signified, or appellated, was a thing. A single form is common to a number of things we call by the same name, so one crucial problem in the philosophy of language is to understand how the different uses of a name are unified in the face of the distinctness of the many individuals talked about. In this way, we can understand the importance played in the twelfth century of univocation in contrast with appellation. Proper names, naming single items, are contrasted with appellative names, naming many. Univocation is the signification of a univocal word, described in the Fallacie Parvipontane as "retaining the signification of a name while varying its supposition/appellation" (my translation).[3]

Throughout much of the twelfth century, ‘supposition’ retained the linguistic sense it had had since at least the time of Priscian (4th century CE), namely, the placing of a name as subject. The relation of that name as subject to the thing named was called its appellation. This was the ability of a univocal appellative noun to name different things. The appellation of a name was not fixed, however. It could be ampliated or restricted by the predicate. So, for example, the predicate ‘opinabilis’ (credible) ampliates or extends the appellation of a name such as ‘man’ to cover a wider range, perhaps of no longer existing men, or of men who might have existed, or who might exist in the future. Thus, appellation came to mean the present correct application of a term (William of Sherwood, p. 74), which could be ampliated, or even restricted by, say, the apposition of an adjective: ‘white man’ appellates only white men, not all even presently existing men.

Later, however, ‘supposition’ came to replace ‘appellation’, and the latter term underwent its own transformation. Supposition became the major property of an occurrence of a term in a proposition (including now predicates, and even parts of predicates), distinguishing what in particular was being spoken of on some occasion of utterance by some particular use of a word, from that word's general property (signification) of meaning. The term ‘man’ signifies the form of man wherever the term occurs, but each occurrence of the term ‘man’ supposits for (the individuals in) possibly distinct classes or groups of men (but note that it supposits for the men, not the classes).

Given the literal meaning of ‘supponere’ as "acting as subject", it is unsurprising that several authors, even as late as Vincent Ferrer in the 1370s, restricted supposition to subject terms, preferring to speak instead of copulation as the corresponding property of the predicate. Those reservations aside, however, the natural similarity in function of subject and predicate in picking out varying classes of things while remaining a univocal term, led most authors to extend the notion of supposition to all terms. At the same time, talk of univocation was superseded by signification, by implication univocal signification unless equivocation was identified.

A major shift in focus occurred in the early fourteenth century, probably occasioned by William of Ockham — certainly, he was the leading figure. On the one hand, signification came to be understood entirely extensionally, given Ockham's antipathy towards real universals. Accordingly, what was taken to be signified by a term were the things of which it can be truly predicated instead of a form or property which they share. For example, whereas hitherto the term ‘man’ had been taken to signify humanity, and ‘white’ whiteness, for Ockham the former signifies (all) men and the latter all white things. From this perspective, the contrast found in thirteenth century authors between (as Peter of Spain called it) natural supposition versus accidental supposition, becomes redundant. Natural supposition was the term's extension, accidental supposition that range of things it supposited for in a particular proposition. For Peter, the term signifies a form, and supposits naturally for a class of objects, whereas an occurrence of the term supposits accidentally on an occasion of use for a group of those objects. For Ockham, the term signifies that class, the form being no more than a fictum (a figment of the mind) or (in his later works) the mental act (of conceiving of those things) itself. Thus natural supposition (William of Sherwood calls it habitual supposition, the Tractatus de proprietatibus sermonum, absolute supposition) drops out as unnecessary.

From the early fourteenth century, supposition came to dominate among the properties. Ampliation and restriction were already functions of supposition (or appellation as it had been), copulation as the naming function of predication is subsumed under supposition, and relatio, the connection of anaphoric terms to their antecedents, becomes a discussion of the supposition of those terms. Finally, distribution is treated as a particular mode or type of supposition, confused and distributive supposition. Indeed, in the final phase, it could seriously be asked if supposition was indeed a property of terms, as does Albert of Saxony (Quaestiones circa Logicam, q. 12). For like others, he defines supposition as ‘acceptio termini’ (the act of acceptance of a term) of various kinds, and so is as much a property of the speaker as of a term.

2. Signification

Signification contrasts with the other properties of terms in one major respect, for the other properties (perhaps with the exception of appellation in some authors, and natural supposition) are all properties of terms relative to their occurrence in particular propositions — indeed, they are properties of occurrences of terms. Signification, however, is had by a term prior to its particular uses or occurrences: "Now signification differs from supposition in that signification is prior to supposition" (Lambert, tr. Kretzmann and Stump, p. 105).[4] Indeed, the other properties are dependent on the signification of the term. For example, an occurrence of a term can only supposit for certain objects in virtue of its signifying them, among others, or signifying some property they share.

A twelfth century commentary on the Perihermeneias says that at the time of Aristotle, there was a great debate over the principal signification of utterances: was it ‘res’ (things) or incorporeal natures (Plato) or sensus (sensations) or imaginationes (representations) or intellectus (concepts)? In fact, medieval philosophers of language were heir to two conflicting semantic theories. According to Aristotle, the greatest authority from the ancient world, words name things by signifying concepts in the mind (Boethius translated his term as passiones animae — affections of the soul) which are likenesses abstracted from them. But Augustine, the greatest of the Church fathers, had held that words signify things by means of those concepts. This led the medievals to the question: do words signify concepts or things? The question had already been asked by Alexander of Aphrodisias and his answer was transmitted to the medievals in Boethius' second commentary on Aristotle's Perihermeneias (De Interpretatione): "Alexander asked, if they are names of things, why does Aristotle say that they are primarily signs of concepts … He says that although spoken words are names of things, we do not use them to signify things, but [to signify] those affections of the soul which are produced in us by them" (my translation).[5] So words primarily signify concepts.

But the matter was not settled, other than that whatever view a medieval philosopher took, it had to be made to accord with the authority of Aristotle, perhaps in extremis by reinterpreting Aristotle's words. Abelard refers to a distinction between significatio intellectuum (signification of concepts) and significatio rei (signification of the thing), more properly called nomination or appellation (see De Rijk, Logica Modernorum, vol. II(1), pp. 190–9). Similarly, the Tractatus de proprietatibus sermonum asks whether words signify concepts (intellectuum) or things, and responds: both, but primarily a thing via a concept as medium (op.cit. II (2), p. 703).

A particular novelty of the thirteenth century, however, was to conceive of the concept itself as a sign. We find this in Lambert of Lagny: "The signification of a term is the concept of a thing, a concept on which an utterance is imposed by the will of the person instituting that term. For, as Aristotle maintains in the first book of De Interpretatione (16a3–5), utterances are signs of states in the soul — i.e., in the understanding — but concepts are the signs of things" (tr. Kretzmann and Stump, p. 104).[6] Hence by transitivity, utterances which are signs of concepts which are signs of things are themselves signs of things: "An utterance that is a sign of a sign … [is] a sign of the concept directly but a sign of the thing indirectly" (tr. Kretzmann and Stump, p. 105).[7] For example, ‘man’ immediately signifies the concept man, but by mediation of the concept it signifies the second substance or form of man. Accordingly, it can supposit for what fall under man, e.g., Plato and Socrates. But it does not signify Plato or Socrates.

As noted above, this last distinction was elided by Ockham, in removing the universal, the form. ‘Man’, he says, signifies Plato and Socrates and all men equally. Once signification is treated extensionally in this way, its only difference from supposition lies in its priority: a general term signifies all those things of which it can be truly predicated (Ockham, Summa Logicae I c. 33).

3. Supposition and Copulation

Just as signification corresponds most closely — though not exactly — to contemporary ideas of meaning or sense, so supposition corresponds in some ways to modern notions of reference, denotation and extension. The comparison is far from exact, however. One major difference is that the medievals distinguished many different modes (modi) of supposition. Despite the difference between different authors' semantic theories, particularly as they developed over the centuries, there is a remarkable consistency in the terminology and interrelation of the different modes.

The major division is between material, simple and personal supposition. Material supposition is when a term stands for a linguistic item as such. Often, of course, this will be a case of autonymy, when it stands for itself. William Sherwood writes: "It is called material when a word itself supposits either [A] for the very utterance itself or [B] for the word itself, composed of the utterance and the signification — as if we were to say [A] ‘man is a monosyllable’ or [B] ‘man is a name’" (tr. Kretzmann, p. 107).[8] Writing in Paris nearly a hundred years later, Thomas Maulfelt put it like this: "Material supposition is a term standing for itself or for another similar to it in sound or writing suppositing in the same way or otherwise which it was not imposed to signify or for some other sound which is not inferior to it, and which it does not signify naturally and properly" (my translation).[9] ‘Noun’ supposits materially for itself when we say ‘Noun has four letters’ — or ‘"Noun" has four letters’; it doesn't supposit materially, but personally for itself, when we say ‘A noun is a part of speech’.

Simple supposition is harder to characterize generally. A common description is to say it occurs when a term supposits for the universal or form which it signifies. However, not everyone believed that terms signified universals. (See the entry on the medieval problem of universals.) So whereas William of Sherwood wrote "It is simple when a word supposits what it signifies for what it signifies" (tr. Kretzmann p. 107),[10] and Walter Burleigh likewise: "supposition is simple when a common term or an aggregated singular term supposits for what it signifies" (tr. Spade p. 82),[11] William of Ockham appears to characterize simple supposition quite differently: "Simple supposition occurs when a term supposits for an intention of the soul and is not functioning significatively" (tr. Loux p. 190).[12] But in fact, the difference between them is not in their theories of supposition, but rather of signification. As we noted earlier, Ockham believes that a general term like ‘man’ signifies individual men like Plato and Socrates; Burleigh that it signifies a second substance (the universal), man. Burleigh appeals to the authority of Aristotle: "‘man' is the name of a second substance; therefore, the term ‘man' signifies a second substance. And it does not signify a second substance that is a genus. Therefore, it signifies a species" (tr. Spade p. 87).[13] Ockham, however, dismissed real universals, and (at least in his later theory represented in Summa Logicae) believed the only universals were words, including words of the inner mental language, mental acts. So for him, a spoken or written term has simple supposition when it stands for the mental act to which it is subordinated by the conventions of signification, that is, the mental act abstracted from those things which the word conventionally signifies.

John Buridan famously eliminated simple supposition altogether, for this very reason, namely, that universals are words of a mental language, so terms suppositing for them are suppositing for a kind of linguistic item, and so such a case should be included under material supposition.

Material and simple supposition are contrasted with personal supposition, what we might call the standard case, where a term stands for ordinary objects — the objects it signifies (for Ockhamists) or for its supposita, as for example, Lambert (p. 209) or Burleigh express it: "Supposition is personal when a term supposits for its suppositum or supposita or some singular of which the term is accidentally predicated" (tr. Spade p. 81).[14] The contrast is a useful one, as is shown in the following standard fallacies:

Homo est dignissima creaturarum (Man is the worthiest of creatures)
Sortes est homo (Socrates is a man)
Ergo Sortes est dignissima creaturarum (So Socrates is the worthiest of creatures).

The premises are true and the conclusion false, so wherein lies the fallacy? It is one of equivocation or "four terms": ‘homo’ (‘man’) has simple supposition in the first premise and personal supposition in the second, so there is no unambiguous middle term to unite the premises. Again:

Currens est participium (Running is a participle)
Sortes est currens (Socrates is running)
Ergo Sortes est participium (So Socrates is a participle).

This time, ‘currens’ (‘running’) supposits differently in the two premises, materially in the first and personally in the second, explaining why putting the two truths together fallaciously leads to the false conclusion.

What determines whether a term has material, simple or personal supposition? One view might be that it depends on the intention of the speaker; another, that all propositions are ambiguous. However, the prevailing medieval view was that it was determined by the predicate, so that, e.g., a predicate like ‘is a noun’ requires material supposition for the subject, while ‘is a species’ requires simple supposition: "A subject, on the other hand, sometimes supposits a form separately and sometimes does not, depending on what the predicate demands, in accordance with the following [principle]: Subjects are of such sorts as the predicates may have allowed" (Sherwood, tr. Kretzmann, p. 113).[15] This slogan, talia subiecta qualia predicata permiserint (subjects are such as predicates permit), was commonly attributed to Boethius; but Sherwood correctly points out that Boethius' point was different, and his phrase was the converse: "talia [predicata] qualia subiecta permiserint" — see De Rijk, Logica Modernorum II (1), p. 561.

In the fourteenth and fifteenth centuries, it became commonplace to require a nota materialitatis (a sign of the material use) for a term in material supposition. Such a sign was to prefix ‘iste terminus’ (‘this term’) or ‘ly’ (taken from the French definite article) to the term. Without such an indication, the term was considered to have personal supposition by default.

Personal supposition is divided by most authors into discrete and common supposition, the first that of singular terms (proper names, demonstrative phrases and so on), the latter that of general terms. Common personal supposition is again divided, namely, into determinate and confused, and the latter into confused and distributive and merely confused supposition. These three modes are well illustrated by the four categorical forms (see the entry on the traditional square of opposition):

(A) All A are B

(E) No A are B

(I) Some A are B

(O) Some A are not B.

The subject of (I)- and (O)-, and the predicate of (I)-propositions, have determinate supposition; the subject and predicate of (E)-, the subject of (A)-, and the predicate of (O)-propositions have confused and distributive supposition; and the predicate of (A)-propositions has merely confused supposition. This is common doctrine; what varies is how these modes are characterised. "It is determinate", writes William of Sherwood, "when the locution can be expounded by means of some single thing" (tr. Kretzmann, p. 108), but adds a doubt: "It seems that when I say ‘a man is running’ [i.e. an I-proposition] the term ‘man’ does not supposit determinately, since [A] the proposition is indefinite, and [B] it is uncertain for whom the term ‘man’ supposits. Therefore it supposits [A] indefinitely and [B] uncertainly; therefore indeterminately" (pp. 115–6).[16] But this is simply a matter of terminology, he replies — determinate supposition means suppositing for one, not for many, but for no particular one, for that would constitute discrete supposition. Note, however, that for Ockham, Burleigh and others, a term with determinate supposition supposits for everything of which it can be truly predicated. The sense in which it is true of one, rather than many, is that the proposition is true if true of one. The term still supposits for all. As Burleigh says: "The supposition called ‘determinate’, not because a term suppositing determinately in this way supposits for one suppositum and not for another. Rather the supposition is called ‘determinate' because for the truth of a proposition in which the common term supposits determinately it is required that the proposition be made true for some determinate suppositum" (tr. Spade pp. 102–3).[17]

All that William of Sherwood can offer to characterize confused supposition is to say that it is had when a term supposits for many, then resorting to examples for its divisions. Peter of Spain tries harder: "Confused supposition is the acceptance of a general term for many by means of a universal sign" (my translation),[18] and confused and distributive when it supposits for all. But this is still unclear, and eventually a solution was found, in the doctrine of ascent and descent. Call the individual things falling under a general term its "inferiors", and call the singular proposition resulting from a general proposition by replacing a general term (with its qualifier) by a term with discrete supposition for one of its inferiors, one of the proposition's "singulars". Then the inference from a general proposition to one of its singulars is called "descent", the converse inference, "ascent". If descent under a term is valid, or at least is valid without changing the rest of the proposition, it is called "mobile", otherwise "immobile". Walter Burleigh, William of Ockham and their followers could then define the three modes of common personal supposition as follows:

  1. An occurrence of a general term in a proposition has determinate supposition when one can descend validly from the proposition to the complete disjunction of its singulars with respect to that term, and conversely can ascend validly from any singular;
  2. Otherwise, it is confused, and (i) is confused and distributive if one can validly descend from the proposition to the indefinite conjunction of its singulars with respect to that term; otherwise (ii) it is merely confused.

In this last case, 2 (ii), Ockham noted: "it is possible to descend by way of a proposition with a disjunctive predicate and it is possible to infer the original proposition from any [singular]" (tr. Loux p. 201).[19] Thus the predicate of an A-proposition has merely confused supposition since from ‘Every man is an animal’ one can validly infer ‘Every man is this animal or that animal and so on for all animals’, and conversely, from ‘Every man is this animal’ (were it ever true) one could infer that every man was an animal.

A final complication came at the end of the fourteenth century and subsequently, when it was asked: "Are there only three modes of common personal supposition?" Some answered, ‘Yes’; but others distinguished two modes of merely confused supposition, or equivalently distinguished a fourth case, 2 (iii), collective supposition, where descent was permissible to a proposition with a conjunctive predicate. The standard example was ‘All the apostles of God are 12’, which entails ‘Matthew and Mark and so on are 12’, with a conjunctive subject.

Several recent commentators have asked what the medieval theory of modes of common personal supposition was: was it a theory of inference, of quantification, of truth-conditions, of fallacies, or what? Asking these questions may help us to come to terms with the theory; but if pressed too hard, they are unhelpful. The medievals' theory was none of these things; it was their theoretical basis with which to pose and answer semantic questions.

All modes of supposition so far described fall under what was variously called proper supposition or accidental supposition or, excluding material supposition, formal supposition. Distinct from these were what Peter of Spain called natural supposition, mentioned earlier in the discussion of signification, and what Ockham and others call improper supposition, covering metaphor and other figures of speech.

Moreover, various authors before the fourteenth century, and at least one fourteenth century author, too (namely, Vincent Ferrer) differed a little from what has been said in not attributing supposition to predicate terms, calling the corresponding property of predicates, "copulation". However, even in the early thirteenth century, this distinction was fading. William of Sherwood makes it clearly: substantive names and pronouns supposit, whereas adjectives, participles and verbs copulate — all those terms which are attributed to something by means of the copula ‘is’. Many of the divisions of supposition are repeated for copulation, but only the modes of common personal supposition: "every copulating word signifies in adjunction to a substantive and thus is copulated personally … [and] every copulating word is the name of an accident, but every name of an accident is common; therefore no copulation is discrete" (Sherwood, tr. Kretzmann, p. 121).[20] However, even in Lambert and Peter of Spain, there is only an empty nod towards copulation. Lambert notes that properly speaking, supposition attaches to substantives, while copulation is appropriate for adjectival terms. But broadly speaking, he says, supposition belongs to both (op.cit., pp. 208/109). The distinction is clearly unnecessary and useless, and although the term is preserved in, e.g., Walter Burleigh's De Puritate, his discussion headed ‘On Copulation’ is in fact a discussion of the uses of the copula, ‘est’.

4. Ampliation and Restriction

Some words have the effect of widening or narrowing the supposition of other terms in a proposition. For example, by qualifying ‘man’ with the adjective ‘white’, we restrict the supposition of ‘man’ in ‘A white man is running’ to white men; while a verb in the past tense ampliates the supposition of the subject to what were its supposita. For example, ‘A white thing was black’ means that something which is now white or was white in the past was black.

Lambert of Lagny describes the many aspects of a proposition which can produce ampliation or restriction. Some are natural, as when ‘rational’ restricts ‘animal’ to supposit only for men by being adjoined to it; other cases are ‘usualis’ — ‘use-governed’ in Kretzmann and Stump's translation: when we say ‘The king is coming’, we are taken to mean the king of the country where we are, so ‘king’ is restricted to supposit only for that king. Some ampliation and restriction is effected by consignification, that is, by an aspect of a word — by the tense of the verb, or by the gender of an adjective: in ‘homo est alba’, the feminine ending of ‘alba’ restricts ‘homo’ to supposit only for women. Other ampliation and restriction is effected by the signification of words — as in the case of ‘rational animal’ just mentioned, or in ‘Socrates' donkey’, where the possessive restricts ‘donkey’ to supposit only for Socrates' donkeys.

Peter of Spain notes that only general terms can be ampliated or restricted, and only terms having personal supposition.

Just as the past tense ampliates the subject to include past as well as present supposita, modal verbs ampliate the subject to possible supposita, as do verbs such as ‘I understand’, ‘I believe’, and indeed, notes Albert of Saxony, verbal nouns ending in ‘-bile’: ‘possible’, ‘audible’, ‘credible’, ‘capable of laughter’ and so on. Albert realises that even ‘supposit’ ampliates the subject: when we say ‘This term supposits for something’, what it supposits for need not actually exist, but might be past, future, possible or merely intelligible. Similarly, ‘must’ ampliates for possible supposita, for ‘A must be B’ means ‘It is not possible that A not be B’; but contradictories must clearly ampliate in the same way, and ‘It is possible that A not be B’ ampliates for possibilia. Ampliation over possibles means care is needed in inferences from ‘is’ to ‘can’: ‘A can be B’ need not follow from ‘A is B’, for ‘A can be B’ means that what is or can be A can be B, and even if A is B, not everything which can be A might be capable of being B. For example, ‘Every planet lighting our hemisphere can be the sun’ is false even though it in fact is the sun which lights it, since the moon might light our hemisphere but the moon cannot be the sun.[21]

It is an interesting fact that almost alone among terminist logicians, Ockham does not speak of ampliation and restriction. The reason appears to be that he disagrees with the truth-condition given above for ‘A white thing was black’, and similar cases. This proposition, he says, is ambiguous. Rather than meaning that what is or was white was black, it equivocates between ‘What is white was black’ and ‘What was black was white’: "in the case of every proposition of the past and of the future in which a general term or a demonstrative pronoun with a general term or a discrete term referring to some composite, we must distinguish [two senses]" (Summa Logicae II 7, p. 269, my translation).[21a] Whether Ockham realized that his theory improved on the ampliative theory is unclear; nonetheless, his account seems to accord better with intuition. For the ampliative account is disjunctive: it says that the proposition is true if either what was white was black or what is white was black. Then it is true if either disjunct is true; whereas on Ockham's account it has two different senses, and can be false on one while true on the other — true because something now white used to be black but false if nothing which used to be white was ever black. For a clearer case, take the first sex-change operation — for the first time, say, a woman was a man. But no one who was a woman had ever been a man, so it was (also) false that a woman was a man. The proposition ‘A woman was a man’ is ambiguous and "est distinguenda " (i.e., different senses must be distinguished). A famous example was ‘An old man will be a boy’, referring to someone not yet born — he will be an old man sometime, and will be a boy before that.

Ockham also eschews talk of ampliation in giving his account of modal propositions. Does ‘A white thing can be black’ mean that what is or can be white can be black, i.e., that either what is white can be black or what can be white can be black, as the ampliative account demands? — cf., e.g., Albert of Saxony: "‘A white thing can be black’: this signifies that what is white or what can be white can be black" (my translation).[22] No, for this loses the sense in which it is self-contradictory to suggest that it is possible that a white thing be black. The proposition is ambiguous, in one sense self-contradictory, in the other true, Ockham notes (Summa Logicae II 10), because ‘This is black’ can be true if uttered pointing to something white: "‘A white thing can be black’ is true, because ‘This is black’ is possible, pointing to something for which ‘white’ supposits; but ‘A white thing is black’ is impossible" (my translation).[23]

5. Appellation

Perhaps the term with the most varied history is ‘appellatio’, though even so, one can discern a common thread running through it. It starts, we saw, as an equivalent of ‘nominatio’ in Anselm and Abelard, and by the thirteenth century is used to pick out the present extension of a term, that of which it can be truly predicated in the present tense: "Now it is essential to know that ‘appellation’ is used in four ways … Used in the fourth way, ‘appellation’ is the acceptance of a term for a suppositum or for supposita actually existing. And it is appellation spoken of in this fourth way that is meant at present" (Lambert, tr. Kretzmann and Stump pp. 113–4).[24] In Burleigh, at the turn of the fourteenth century, it almost usurps the place of ‘copulatio’, being for him the relation of the predicate to its inferiors: "Thus, just as supposition taken strictly is a property of the subject insofar as it is matched with the predicate, so appellation is a property of the predicate mathced with the subject or with an inferiors" (tr. Spade p. 131).[25] There are shades too, of Abelard: "a univocal general term appellates its inferiors but does not signify them".[26] But the crucial phrase which runs through the history of the term appears here too: "the predicate appellates its form" (op.cit., p. 48: "praedicatum appellat suam formam"). What he says he means by this is that the predicate be truly predicable at some time, in the present tense, of the supposita of the subject.

It is ampliation and restriction which distinguish this property of the predicate from properties of the subject. For, on the standard account, ‘A white thing was black’ is true only if ‘is black’ has been truly predicable of the supposita of the subject, namely, of what is or was white. In contrast, ‘A white thing is black’ may never have been true — indeed, in this case, it never will have since it is self-contradictory. So the subject does not always "appellate its form". A consequence pointed out by Albert of Saxony, among others, is that conversion needs application with care in such cases. Consider ‘The just will be justly damned’: this can be true, if those who are just sin in the future. But ‘Justly will the just be damned’ is false, for ‘Justly are the just damned’ will never be true. Similarly, ‘Socrates approaching you know’ can be true while ‘You know Socrates approaching’ (the "hooded man" fallacy from Aristotle's De Sophisticis Elenchis 179b1–3) may be false (for you know Socrates, but do not recognize him approaching). It is explained by reason of the fact that the predicate appellates its form (for ‘You know Socrates approaching’ requires that the predicate ‘know Socrates approaching’ be true of you and so is false), whereas ‘Socrates approaching you know’ requires only that ‘Him you know’ be true, referring to Socrates, and it is true. The doctrine of appellation could thus be used to diagnose familiar fallacies.

Scott, in his discussion of Buridan's sophism, ‘You know the one approaching’ (pp. 42–9), claims that Buridan's concept of appellation (which he misleadingly translates as ‘connotation’) in his diagnosis is novel, and Spade follows him in his commentary on Peter of Ailly (p.109 n.188). But the notion is clearly continuous with Burleigh's in that ‘appellating its form’ requires true predication via a demonstration. Indeed, it is continuous with Lambert's usage, for ‘chimera’ has no appellata precisely because ‘hoc est chimera’ (‘This is a chimera’) is false whatever is demonstrated. Admittedly, Buridan explicitly restricts appellation to appellative terms, that is, "every term connoting something other than what it supposits for" (Summulae de Dialiectica: Treatise on Suppositions, tr. Klima, p. 291), and it "appellates that which it connotes as pertaining to that which it supposits for". Thus ‘white’ connotes whiteness and supposits for white things. What appears to be novel in Buridan is the extension of the doctrine to intentional verbs, which, says Buridan (and Albert) cause the terms following them (the predicate) to appellate their rationes, that is, the concepts by which they signify what they do. Thus in ‘You know Socrates approaching’, the predicate ‘know Socrates approaching’ appellates its concept, the ratio ‘Socrates approaching’, so the proposition is false unless you are aware who it is; whereas in ‘Socrates approaching you know’, the subject ‘Socrates approaching’ does not appellate its concept, and so it suffices that ‘Him you know’ be true, where ‘him’ refers to Socrates.

6. Relation

Lambert of Lagny speaks explicitly of relation as a property of terms, but most authors describe the phenomenon as the supposition of relatives. The relation in question is that between anaphoric terms and their antecedents. Most treatises consist of a repetition of a standard taxonomy: there are relatives of substance and relatives of accident, relatives of identity and relatives of diversity. For example, relatives of substance and of identity are ‘who’, ‘he’, ‘his’, and among these, reciprocal relatives such as ‘himself’; of diversity are ‘another’ and ‘someone else’. The latter are said to refer back (referre) to their antecedent but to supposit for something different, as in, e.g., ‘Socrates is running and someone else is debating’. Relatives of accident include, first, of identity, ‘such as’, ‘like’, ‘when’, and of diversity, ‘in another way’, ‘other’; in, say, ‘Socrates is running and Plato is other’, ‘other’ refers back to ‘running’; in what way it differs will depend on the author's account of predicates.

In contrast to the extensive taxonomy, medieval discussions of relatives before the mid-fourteenth century seem rather short on theory, dealing with puzzles more by common sense and description than in any unified way. For example, the prevailing view is that relatives of identity preserve the supposition of their antecedent. Why, then, can they usually not replace the antecedent? Consider, e.g., ‘Every man sees himself’. Does ‘himself’ have the same supposition as ‘man’ (or ‘every man’) and if so, why can the antecedent not replace it? — for ‘Every man sees every man’ has a very different signification. Lambert claims that in the case of reciprocal relatives the reciprocal pronoun can replace the antecedent unless the antecedent is taken universally, as here. In this case, it still supposits for the same as its antecedent, but in a different way, namely, discretely. Ockham spells it out: "in ‘Every man sees himself’, ‘himself’ supposits for every man by means of confused and distributive mobile supposition: but it does this singularly since it is not possible to descend without altering the other extreme … thus, ‘Every man sees himself, therefore, Socrates sees Socrates’" (tr. Loux p. 218).[27] This is correct and sensible; but what is the theory to explain it?

Ockham claims that, although non-reciprocal relatives of identity always supposit for that for which their antecedent supposits, those whose antecedent is a general term occurring with personal supposition can never be replaced by their antecedent and result in an equivalent proposition. For example, ‘A man runs and he disputes’ is not convertible with ‘A man runs and a man disputes’. Buridan has two rules to explain what is happening (tr. Klima pp. 283–4):

  1. A relative of identity "refers back to its antecedent only with respect to those of the antecedent's supposita for which the categorical proposition in which its antecedent occurred was verified"
  2. A relative of identity "supposits or is taken in a proposition as is its antecedent, namely, materially if materially, personally if personally, distributively if distributively, determinately if determinately, merely confusedly if merely confusedly", except as in 1.

Hence, in e.g., ‘Man is a species and it is predicable of many’, or ‘Socrates runs and he disputes’, the relative can be replaced without loss of meaning by its antecedent. But in ‘A man runs and he disputes’, it cannot, for the supposition would change. ‘He’ supposits only for men who are running, whereas ‘a man’, if it replaced it, would supposit for all men.

Another issue concerned identifying the contradictory of a proposition containing a relative. In the case of a categorical containing a relative of identity such as ‘A which is B is C’, it is ‘A which is B is not C’, says Albert of Saxony (Perutilis Logica II 8, f. 14rb, ed. Muñoz García §§526–7). For the former is equivalent to ‘A is B and A is C’, and the latter to ‘A is not B or A is not C’, he says.

7. Conclusion

The medievals did not have a solution to every semantic puzzle with which they were faced, any more than do contemporary philosophers. But the theory of properties of terms was the basis of a rich semantic theory within which they were able to develop complete and fruitful theories which yielded significant insights — both for them and for us — into a broad range of semantic issues.


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Albert of Saxony | Anselm, Saint [Anselm of Bec, Anselm of Canterbury] | Aristotle, General Topics: logic | Buridan, John [Jean] | fallacies: medieval theories of | medieval philosophy | Ockham [Occam], William | semiotics: medieval | square of opposition | universals: the medieval problem of