Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Inductive Logic

The Effect on EQI of Partitioning the Outcome Space More Finely — and Proof of the Nonnegativity of EQI Theorem

Here again we will only explicitly treat the case where condition-independence is assumed. If result-independence holds as well, all occurrences of ‘(ck−1·ek−1)’ may be dropped, which gives the theorem stated in the text. If neither independence condition holds, all occurrences of ck·(ck−1·ek−1)’ here are replaced by ‘cn·ek−1’, and occurrences of ‘b·ck−1’ are replaced by ‘b·cn’.

Given some experiment or observation (or series of them) c, is there any special advantage to parsing the space of possible outcomes O into more, rather than fewer alternatives? Couldn't we do as well at confirming hypotheses by parsing the space of outcomes into only two or three alternatives − e.g., one possible outcome that hi says is very likely and hj says is rather unlikely (e.g., describing a rejection region for hj), one that hi says is rather unlikely and hj says is very likely (e.g., describing a rejection region for hi), and perhaps a third outcome on which hi and hj pretty much agree? The answer is no, we cannot generally do as well at confirming hypotheses this way. In general, parsing the space of outcomes into more empirically distinct alternatives results in a better measure of confirmation. To see this intuitively, suppose some outcome description q can be parsed into two distinct outcome descriptions, q1 and q2 (where q is equivalent to (q1q2)), and suppose that hi differs from hj much more on the likelihood of q1 than on the likelihood of q2. Then, intuitively, when q is found to be true, whichever of the more precise descriptions, q1 or q2, is true should make a difference in how strongly the hypotheses are supported. So reporting whichever of q1 or q2 occurs will be more informative than simply reporting q. If the outcome of the experiment is only described as q, relevant information is lost.

It turns out that EQI measures how well possible outcomes can distinguish between hypotheses in a way that reflects the intuition that a finer partition of outcomes is more informative. The numerical value of EQI is always made larger by parsing the outcome space more finely, provided that the likelihoods for outcomes in the finer parsing differ at least a bit form the likelihoods for outcomes of a less refined parsing. This is important for our main convergence result because in that theorem we want EQI to be positive, and the larger the better.

The following Partition Theorem implies the Nonnegativity of EQI theorem. It show that each EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)] must be non-negative, and will be positive just in case for at least one possible outcome oku, P[oku | hj·b·ck·(ck−1·ek−1)]  ≠  P[oku | hi·b·ck·(ck−1·ek−1)]. It also shows that EQI[ck | hi/hj |b·(ck−1·ek−1)] generally becomes larger with finer partitionings of the outcome space.

Notice that this result (when proved) implies that

EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·ck−1] = {ek−1} EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)] · P[ek−1 | hi·b·ck−1]

must be non-negative, and will be positive iff for at least one possible outcome oku,

P[oku | hj·b·ck·(c k−1·ek−1)]  ≠  P[oku | hi·b·ck·(c k−1·ek−1)].

And since,

EQI[cn | hi/hj | b] = ∑k=1n EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·ck−1],

we also get that the average EQI, EQI [cn | hi/hj | b], must be non-negative, and must be positive iff for some k,

P[oku | hj·b·ck·(c k−1·ek−1)]  ≠  P[oku | hi·b·ck·(c k−1·ek−1)];

and it becomes larger as finer partitionings make the component EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)] larger.

Partition Theorem:
For any positive real numbers r1, r2, s1, s2:
  1. if r1/s1 > (r1+r2)/(s1+s2), then (r1+r2) log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)] < r1 log[r1/s1] + r2 log[r2/s2]; and
  2. if r1/s1 = (r1+r2)/(s1+s2), then r1 log[r1/s1] + r2 log[r2/s2] = (r1+r2) log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)].

For the Proof, first notice that

r1/s1 = (r1+r2)/(s1+s2) iff r1s1 + r1s2 = s1r1 + s1r2
iff r1/s1 = r2/s2.

We establish case (2) first. Suppose the antecedent of case (2) holds. Then,

r1 log[r1/s1] + r2 log[r2/s2]
= r1 log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)] + r2 log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)]
= (r1 + r2) log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)].

To get case (1), consider the following function of p: f(p) = p log[p/u] + (1−p) log[(1−p)/v], where we only assume that u > 0, v > 0, and 0 < p < 1. This function has its minimum value when p = u/(u+v). (This is easily verified by setting the derivative of f(p) with respect to p equal to 0 to find the minimum value of f(p); and it is easy to verified that this is a minimum rather than a maximum value.) At this minimum, where p = u/(u+v), we have

f(p) = u/(u+v) log[u+v] − v/(u+v) log[u+v]
= −log[u+v].

Thus, for all values of p other than u/(u+v),

−log[u+v] < f(p)
= p log[p/u] + (1−p) log[(1−p)/v].

That is, for pu/(u+v), −log[u+v] < p log[p/u] + (1−p) log[(1−p)/v]. Now, let p = r1/(r1+r2), let u = s1/(r1+r2), and let v = s2/(r1+r2). Plugging into the previous formula, and multiplying both sides by (r1+r2), we get:

  r1/(r1+r2) ≠ s1/(s1+s2) (i.e., if r1/s1 ≠ (r1+r2)/(s1+s2)),

  (r1+r2) log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)] < r1 log[r1/s1] + r2 log[r2/s2].

This completes the proof of the theorem.

To apply this result to EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)] recall that

EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)]
= {u: P[oku | hj·b·ck] > 0} log[P[oku | hi·b·ck·(c k−1·ek−1)] /
P[oku | hj·b·ck·(c k−1·ek−1)]] · P[oku | hi·b·ck·(c k−1·ek−1)].

Suppose ck has m alternative outcomes oku on which both

P[oku | hj·b·ck·(ck−1·e k−1)] > 0


P[oku | hi·b·ck·(ck−1·e k−1)] > 0.

Let's label their likelihoods relative to hi (i.e., their likelihoods P[oku | hi·b·ck·(ck−1·ek−1)]) as r1, r2, …, rm. And let's label their likelihoods relative to hj as s1, s2, …, sm. In terms of this notation,

EQI[ck | hi/hj |b] = m

u = 1

Notice also that (r1+r2+r3+…+rm) = 1 and (s1+s2+s3+…+sm) = 1.

Now, think of EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)] as generated by applying the theorem in successive steps:

0 = 1· log[1/1]
= (r1+r2+r3+…+rm)·log[(r 1+r2+r3+…+rm)/(s1+s 2+s3+…+sm)]
r1·log[r1/s1] + (r2+r3+…+rm)· log[(r2+r3+…+rm)/(s2+s 3+…+sm)]
r1·log[r1/s1] + r2·log[r2/s2] + (r3+…+rm)·log[(r3+…+rm)/(s 3+…+sm)]

u = 1
= EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)].

The theorem also says that at each step equality holds just in case

ru/su = (ru+ru+1+…+rm)/(su+su+1+…+s m),

which itself holds just in case

ru/su = (ru+1+…+rm)/(su+1+…+sm).


EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)] = 0

just in case

1 = (r1+r2+r3+…+rm)/(s1+s 2+s3+…+sm)
= r1/s1
= (r2+r3+…+rm)/(s2+s3+…+s m)
= r2/s2
= (r3+…+rm)/(s3+…+sm)
= r3/s3
= rm/sm.

That is,

EQI[ck | hi/hj  | b·(ck−1·ek−1)] = 0

just in case for all oku such that P[oku | hj·b·ck·(ck−1·ek−1)] > 0 and P[oku | hi·b·ck·(ck−1·ek−1)] > 0,

P[oku | hi·b·ck·(c k−1·ek−1)]/P[oku | hj·b·c k·(ck−1·ek−1)] = 1.


EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)] > 0;

and for each successive step in partitioning the outcome space to generate EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)], if

ru/su ≠ (ru+ru+1+…+rm)/(su+su+1+…+sm),

we have the strict inequality:

(ru+ru+1+…+rm) · log[(ru+ru+1+…+rm)/(su+s u+1+…+sm)] <
  ru·log[ru/su] + (ru+1+…+rm)·log[(ru+1+…+rm)/(su+1+…+sm)].

So each such partitioning of (oku∨oku+1∨…∨okm) into two separate propositions, oku and (oku+1∨…∨okm), adds a strictly positive contribution to the size of EQI[ck | hi/hj | b·(ck−1·ek−1)].

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