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Justice and Bad Luck

First published Mon Jun 20, 2005

Some people appear to be worse off than others partly because they have had bad luck. Is that just? Many philosophers are inclined to answer this question negatively where certain kinds of case are concerned. To understand this inclination, we need a clear account of what luck involves. On some accounts, luck nullifies responsibility. On others, it nullifies desert. But whichever account is adopted, most observers believe that it matters whether a piece of luck is the outcome of an avoidable gamble deliberately engaged in. It is often said that justice requires luck to be ‘neutralized’. However, it is unclear whether a distributive pattern that eliminates the influence of luck can be described. Thus an agent's level of effort—something few would see as a matter of luck—might be inseparable from his level of talent, and this might challenge standard accounts of just deviation from equality (or, for that matter, other favored distributive patterns). Recently, it has been argued that theories of justice overemphasize compensation for bad luck and thereby fail to acknowledge the importance of equal dignity and equal standing.

1. Different Kinds of Luck

Luck is a pervasive feature of human life (Williams 1981, 21) and appears to arise in four main ways (Nagel 1979; Statman 1993, 11). First, the outcomes of our actions are affected by luck (resultant luck). Some years ago it may have seemed prudent to take a degree in computer science; someone who did so and completed a course just before the IT bubble burst unforeseeably may rightly see his ensuing unemployment as bad resultant luck. Second, the circumstances in which one acts introduce luck (circumstantial luck). A person who is offered proper incentives and plenty of time to deliberate may make a wiser decision than he would under less favorable conditions; it may be by accident that he finds himself in the favorable conditions and hence makes the wiser decision. Third, luck affects the kind of person you are (constitutive luck). Genetically, some people are at greater risk of cancer through smoking than others, and because of this it makes sense to say that some smokers are lucky to avoid cancer. Finally, there is luck in the way one's actions are determined by antecedent circumstances (antecedent causal luck). Children who grow up in a stimulating environment perhaps become more motivated than they would in a duller setting; yet children rarely determine the time and place in which they are raised. When we add up resultant, circumstantial, constitutive, and antecedent causal luck, the area of life that is free of luck seems to shrink “to an extensionless point” (Nagel 1979, 35; compare Parfit 1995, 10-12).

Luck that does not affect a person's interests is irrelevant from the point of view of justice. But luck that does—whether the interests are characterized in terms of welfare, resources, opportunities, capabilities to achieve functionings, or in some other way—certainly seems relevant. People who end up less well (or better) off than others as a result of luck often ask “Why me?” (Otsuka 2004, 151-152). For instance, many affluent people, reflecting on the situation of people in developing countries, would be inclined to think that it is simply the latter's bad luck to have been born in poor countries. They would further assume that it is their own good luck to have been born in affluent countries, that they do not deserve their favorable starting position, and that this makes the inequality unjust. If those who live in developing countries were in the situation they find themselves in through their own fault, and not victims of bad luck, no question of distributive justice would arise. But they are not, and it seems unfair and unjust that some people's prospects are much worse than others simply in virtue of birthplace. The underlying assumption seems to be that luck-affected differential standings are morally undesirable or unjust (Arneson 1989, 85; Temkin 1993, 200); but this assumption calls for philosophical clarification. Given the pervasiveness of luck, such clarification appears to be required whenever people end up unequally well off.

2. Distributive Justice

It is commonplace to distinguish between retributive justice and distributive justice. In both cases the issue of bad luck arises, and offhand it seems that the role one ascribes to luck in one area will constrain the role one can ascribe to luck elsewhere: if luck raises questions about the significance of desert in the sphere of distributive justice, it will probably have similar repercussions vis-a-vis desert and retributive justice (Sandel 1982, 91-92; Scheffler 1992, 306). In the present entry, however, we shall focus on relations between luck and distributive justice.

In fact it will be useful to narrow the focus further to a particular family of theories of distributive justice—namely, those involving an end-result principle of justice (Nozick 1974, 153-155). End-result principles entail that one can judge whether a certain distribution of goods is desirable without knowing how it came about. The following are well-known principles of this kind and/or theories giving a central role to them. (a) Crude egalitarianism, given which it is bad or unjust if some people are worse off than others. (b) Prioritarianism, given which we should maximize the sum of welfare that is weighted to ensure that benefits at lower levels of welfare have more weight than those at higher levels. (c) The difference principle, given which it is unjust if the worst off are less well off than they could be. (Strictly speaking, Rawls himself says that the difference principle applies to the basic structure of society, so for Rawls it applies only indirectly to outcomes. On this understanding, the difference principle is not, in any straightforward sense, an end-state principle. Here I prefer to treat the difference principle as one that applies directly to outcomes. Many observers handle the difference principle this way, and some subscribe to such a principle on merit, regardless of whether it should be labeled “the difference principle.” Some writers, such as Jerry Cohen, think that Rawls ought to understand his principle in this way, in view of the principle's rationale.) Finally, there is (d) utilitarianism, given which we should maximize the sum of welfare.

There are two reasons for narrowing the focus in this way. First, some end-result principles have been defended on the basis of considerations about luck. Thus it is often suggested that considerations about neutralizing luck favor the difference principle over ‘historical’ principles of justice, i.e., principles defining justice in terms of the way a distribution of goods comes about. No such suggestion has been made on behalf of non-end-result principles. Take Nozick's entitlement view. On this view, it may be a matter of luck what people are entitled to, and yet Nozick explicitly claims that this does not erode the relevant entitlements (Nozick 1974, 225). Second, many have inserted into end-result principles clauses that allow for deviations from the prescribed end-result provided that these deviations do not reflect luck. For instance, most contemporary egalitarians believe that an unequal distribution that is not a matter of bad luck for the worse off could be just. Luck plays no comparable role in historical principles.

John Rawls' work explains why the concept of luck has had a central place in discussions of justice over the last 30 years. In an immensely influential section of his A Theory of Justice he introduced the metaphors of the social and natural lotteries. The underlying idea is that every person's starting point in society is the outcome of a social lottery (the political, social, and economic circumstances into which each person is born) and a natural lottery (the biological potentials each person is born with). Rawls says that the outcome of each of person's social and natural lottery is, like the outcomes of ordinary lotteries, a matter of good or bad “fortune” or “luck” (Rawls 1971, 74, 75). Hence, since one cannot possibly merit, or deserve, an outcome of this kind, people's starting positions cannot be justified by appeal to merit or desert (Rawls 1971, 7, 104). It can be seen, then, that Rawls' social and natural lotteries provide negative support of his theory of justice. They undermine alternative theories in which distributions of social and economic benefits deviating from that prescribed by the difference principle are tolerated (Nozick 1974, 216; Arneson 2001, 76). They also underpin Rawls' claim that a system of natural liberty—one in which formal equality of opportunity obtains in that “all have at least the same legal rights to all advantaged social positions” (Rawls 1971, 72) and applicants are assessed on their merits alone—is unjust because “it permits distributive shares to be improperly influenced by” the outcomes of the social and natural lottery.

Luck also plays an important positive role in Rawls' work. Since we can regard people's inborn talents as a matter of luck, it is appropriate, Rawls thinks, to regard these as a “common asset.” This means that “[t]hose who have been favored by nature…. may gain from their good fortune only on terms that improve the situation of those who have lost out” (Rawls 1971, 101. This point is put somewhat less strongly in the second edition of A Theory of Justice). This is exactly what the difference principle, in one of its versions, says. Moreover, if we assume an independently plausible principle of redress which says that “undeserved inequalities… are to be compensated for”, and if people's lives are shaped by undeserved outcomes of the social and the natural lottery, then we can say that the difference principle “does achieve some of the intent of the [principle of redress]” (Rawls 1971, 101). (While it is undeniable that luck plays a role in A Theory of Justice, and that the considerations described above are congenial to luck-egalitarians, some commentators argue that this role is exaggerated when Rawls is understood in luck-egalitarian fashion (Scheffler 2003, 8-12, 24-31). In Section Eight I ask whether the luck-neutralizing aim can play a positive role in justifying equality, an issue that is, of course, distinct from the question whether it has been widely thought to be capable of playing such a role.)

Luck has been examined closely in the writings of successive egalitarians (Arneson 1989; Cohen 1989; Dworkin 2000; Nagel 1991; Rakowski 1991; Roemer 1993). Ronald Dworkin holds that differences in wealth generated by differences “traceable to genetic luck” (Dworkin 2000, 92) are unfair. He describes a hypothetical insurance device which, on the one hand, neutralizes “the effects of differential talents” (Dworkin 2000, 91) and, on the other hand, is insensitive to the different ambitions people have in their lives (Kymlicka 2002, 75-79). Similarly, G. A. Cohen writes that “anyone who thinks that initial advantage and inherent capacity are unjust distributors thinks so because he believes that they make a person's fate depend too much on sheer luck” (Cohen 1989, 932). In his view, “the fundamental distinction for an egalitarian is between choice and luck in the shaping of people's fates” (Cohen 1989, 907).

Luck is also appealed to by some who believe that benefits matter more, morally speaking, the worse off those to whom the benefits accrue are. Thus Richard J. Arneson has recently defended a version of prioritarianism accommodating the “generic egalitarian intuition” that “fortunate individuals should give up resources to improve the life prospects of those whose initial conditions are unpropitious [i.e., the upshot of bad luck]” (Arneson 1999, 227). According to this view, “the moral value of achieving a gain (avoiding a loss) for a person” is “greater, the lower the person's lifetime expectation of well-being prior to receipt of the benefit (avoidance of the loss)” and “greater, the larger the degree to which the person deserves this gain (loss avoidance)” (Arneson 1999, 239-240).

Finally, while no one has argued that utilitarianism is grounded in reflections on luck, it has certainly been argued that non-luck considerations qualify our obligation to maximize welfare. Fred Feldman, for instance, defends a version of consequentialism that adjusts utility for justice on the basis that a pleasure is more valuable if it is deserved and less valuable, or perhaps even disvaluable, if it is undeserved (Feldman 1997). Given an appropriate account of desert, this position might be looked upon as luck-utilitarianism (or luck-consequentialism). On one version of this kind of view (one differing from Feldman's), the moral value of an outcome always increases with increasing welfare for individuals. But as is the case with Arneson's responsibility-sensitive prioritarianism, on this view the moral value of an extra unit of welfare to a person is “greater, the larger the degree to which the person deserves this gain (loss avoidance).”

3. Thin Luck

The concept of luck is a curious one (Dennett 1984, 92). To avoid various pitfalls, it helps to distinguish thin and thick notions of luck (as suggested by Hurley 2003, 107-109). To say that something is a matter of thin luck for someone is to say merely that this person does not stand in a certain moral relationship to a certain object, where such moral relationship essentially involves this individual in his or her capacity as a rational agent. To say that something is a matter of thick luck is to say this and to commit oneself to a certain account of the non-moral properties in virtue of which this moral relationship obtains. Accordingly, a thick concept of luck is a more specific version of the corresponding thin concept of luck. In either case, to say that something is a matter of luck for someone, in the sense of “luck” that is relevant to justice, is to imply that it affects this person's interests for good or bad.

There are several varieties of thin notions of luck. One is the following kind of responsibility luck:

(1) Y is a matter of luck for X if, and only if, X is not morally responsible for Y.

In this definition, like those set out below, “X” ranges over individuals and “Y” ranges over items that can be a matter of luck for an individual, e.g., events, states of affairs, personality traits, actions, omissions, and much else. A number of views about what makes an agent responsible for something have been taken. On responsibility for actions (and omissions), some emphasize the role of the ability to act otherwise (Ayer 1982; Moore 1912), while others focus on whether an act is appropriately related to the agent's real self (Frankfurt 1988; Watson 1982). To say that an outcome conforms to (1) is to remain neutral on which of these accounts is correct.

Thin notions of luck need not be notions of responsibility luck. Thus the following notion of desert luck is thin:

(2) Y is a matter of thin luck for X if, and only if, it is not the case that X deserves Y.

As with responsibility, a number of views about what makes an agent deserving have been taken. Some accounts hold the basis of desert to be the value of one's contribution, while others hold the desert basis to be one's level of effort. People who think that justice should neutralize the luck specified by (2) can disagree over these accounts.

It is worth emphasizing that thin responsibility luck and thin desert luck are independent of one another. First, X may be responsible for Y and yet not deserve Y. Thus a man who heroically throws himself on to a grenade to save his comrades, thereby losing his life, is responsible for his own death—indeed this is what makes his act praiseworthy—even if he did not deserve to die. Second, X may deserve Y without being responsible for Y. Thus a poor saint who stumbles, entirely fortuitously, upon a gold nugget might deserve (in the wider scheme of things) to be enriched by his discovery even though he is not responsible for making it.

Other thin notions of luck can be described, but thin desert luck and (especially) thin responsibility luck have received the lion's share of attention in the literature on distributive justice. While clearly different, they are occasionally conflated (as pointed out in Hurley 2003, 191-95).

4. Thick Luck

The claim that something is a matter of thin responsibility luck can be combined with various accounts of responsibility and thus various accounts of luck. It is these latter accounts—thick accounts of responsibility luck—that tell us what makes a person responsible for something. On the thick, control-based account of responsibility luck:

(3) Y is a matter of luck for X if, and only if, (i) X is not responsible for Y; and (ii) X is not responsible for Y if, and only if, X does not and did not control Y (Otsuka 2002, 40; Zimmerman 1993, 219).

A competing thick, choice-based account of responsibility luck says:

(4) Y is a matter of luck for X if, and only if, (i) X is not responsible for Y; and (ii) X is not responsible for Y if, and only if, Y is not, in an appropriate way, the result of a choice made by X (Cohen 1989, 916).

To see how these control-based and choice-based notions diverge, consider a Frankfurtian scenario in which Y comes about as a result of X's choice, but X did not control whether Y came about because had X not chosen to bring about Y, then Y would have been realized through some alternative causal means (Frankfurt 1988). Conversely, in a case in which X fails to make up his mind whether to prevent Y coming about and then finds he can no longer control the outcome, it might be said that Y does not come about as a result of X's choice even if X controlled Y.

Often it makes a crucial difference which items Y ranges over (see Cohen 1989, 927; Price 1999). Suppose, for instance, that a person deliberately, and in full control, cultivates a preference for spending leisure hours driving about in her car reasonably foreseeing that the prices of gas will stay low (Arneson 1990, 186). Unfortunately, and unpredictably, the price of gas skyrockets and her preference becomes very costly. In this case, the fact that this person prefers to spend her leisure hours driving her car is neither bad control luck, nor bad choice luck. However, the fact that she is worse off as a result of her preference may be both, since she neither chose to act in such way to make this fact obtain, nor controlled whether it did.

It has been argued that both the control-based and choice-based thick notions of luck are too broad. Most people neither control nor choose their religion, yet it seems odd to ask for compensation for feelings of guilt engendered by religious belief on the grounds that it is a matter of bad luck that one holds those beliefs (Scanlon 1975; Cohen 1989, 935-939). To accommodate this intuition G. A. Cohen introduces the notion of counterfactual choice. One can explain this notion with the following claim:

(5) Y is a matter of luck for X if, and only if, (i) X is not responsible for Y; and (ii) X is not responsible for Y if, and only if, Y is not the result of a choice made by X and X would not choose Y if X could.

Given the opportunity to do so, the theist would not choose to be free of the feelings of guilt engendered by his religious convictions. Therefore, it is not a matter of luck that he has such feelings and so justice does not require him to be compensated for the feelings. As Cohen says, the costs of the unchosen and uncontrolled commitments of the religious believer “are so intrinsically connected with his commitments that they” are not bad luck (Cohen 1989, 937). Hence, if by “responsible for” we simply mean “should bear the costs of” (compare Ripstein 1994, 19n), the theist is responsible for his religiously mandated feelings of guilt.

Just as there are different accounts of thick responsibility luck, there are different accounts of thick desert luck. These correspond to competing accounts of the basis of desert. One notion is that of thick, non-comparative desert luck, which can be elaborated as follows:

(6) Y is a matter of luck for X if, and only if, (i) it is not the case that X deserves Y; and (ii) X deserves Y if, and only if, it is fitting that X has Y given the moral or prudential merits of X.

The notion fleshed out here contrasts with that of thick, comparative desert luck:

(7) Y is a matter of luck for X if, and only if, (i) it is not the case that X deserves Y; and (ii) X deserves Y if, and only if, it is fitting that X has Y given the relative moral or prudential merits of X and Z and given what Z has.

It may be a matter of bad thick, non-comparative desert luck that the crops of a talented, hard-working farmer are destroyed by cold weather. If, however, the crops of a farmer who is even more hard-working and talented are also destroyed, it will not be a matter of bad thick, comparative desert luck that the first farmer's crops are destroyed.

The list of thick notions of luck mentioned so far is not intended to be exhaustive, and each notion may of course be developed in several directions. Clearly, thick luck is quite complex.

5. Independent Notions of Luck

Some accounts of luck are neither thin accounts of luck nor aim at capturing a general moral notion such as responsibility or desert. Instead they appeal to an independent conception of luck. Lottery luck is arguably one example:

(8) Y is a matter of luck for X if Y, from the perspective of X, is the outcome of a lottery.

The underlying idea here is that there is a sense in which the outcome of a (fair) lottery is a matter of luck for the person who participates in it whether or not he is responsible for it—as some accounts of responsibility imply and others do not. It can be maintained that justice is concerned with this notion of luck independently of how it relates to responsibility and desert. Thus an egalitarian may think that it is bad if people are unequally well off as a result of differential lottery luck even if he has not made up his mind whether people are responsible for differential lottery luck.

In principle, one could also care about choice and control luck independently of how these relate to thin luck, e.g., responsibility and desert. However, philosophers who think that justice is a matter of eliminating differential luck have studied choice and control mainly because they assume that the absence of choice and control nullifies responsibility or desert.

6. How Much Luck is There?

Accounts of responsibility or desert affect how much luck there is in the world. If, on the one hand, one accepts a hard deterministic account of responsibility, everything is a matter of responsibility luck. A hard deterministic account of responsibility says that responsibility and determinism are incompatible, that determinism is true, and, hence, that no one is ever responsible for anything. If, on the other hand, one accepts a compatibilist, reason responsiveness account of responsibility, many outcomes will not be a matter of responsibility luck, at least for some agents. A compatibilist, reason responsiveness account of responsibility for outcomes says that an agent is responsible for outcomes that he or she brings about in the right sort of way through the agent's actions (or omissions) where these issue from an action-generating process that is sufficiently sensitive to practical reasons, e.g., normal human deliberation, and that actions may issue from such mechanisms whether or not determinism obtains (Fischer and Ravizza 1998).

One issue which has received quite a lot of attention in the debate about justice and luck is the regression principle governing luck:

(9) If the causes of Y are a matter of luck for X, so is Y.

If this principle is coupled with control or choice accounts of luck, everything turns into luck. For if we couple (9) with, say, the thick, choice-based account of responsibility luck, it follows that for my present reckless driving not to be a matter of (bad) luck, it will have to be the case that I am responsible for, and hence have chosen, the causes of my present reckless driving. In turn, for me to be responsible for these causes I will in turn have to be responsible for, and hence have chosen, the causes of these causes of my reckless driving; and so on. Obviously, at some point, moving back through the causal chain (e.g., prior to my coming into existence, if not long before that), choice, and thus responsibility, will peter out. So it will follow that I am not responsible for my present reckless driving: it is my bad luck that I drive my car in a totally irresponsible way. Generalizing this sort of reasoning, it seems no one would ever be responsible for anything—that everything would be a matter of responsibility luck. As Thomas Nagel writes “Everything seems to result from the combined influence of factors, antecedent and posterior to action, that are not within the agent's control. Since he cannot be responsible for them, he cannot be responsible for their results” (Nagel 1979, 35; compare Strawson 1994).

The view that everything is a matter of responsibility (and desert) luck obviously flies in the face of our everyday ascriptions of responsibility. Accordingly, this implication of the regression principle is often deployed in a corresponding reductio ad absurdum (Hurley 1993, 183; Hurley 2003; Nozick 1974, 225; Sher 1997, 67-69; Zaitchik 1977, 371-373). However, this reductio is perhaps too hasty. It has been argued that the principle (applied to control) is not simply a matter of “generalization from certain clear cases.” Rather, it is a condition that we “are actually being persuaded” is correct when we apply it to cases “beyond the original set”, where, on reflection, we find that “control is absent” (Nagel 1979, 26-27). If this is right, it seems we need an alternative explanation of why moral responsibility is absent in those cases where control of causes is absent. So, for instance, if we agree that a person who offends, as an adult, as a result of childhood deprivation is not responsible for his action, we need to explain what, here, nullifies responsibility if not lack of control over causes of the agent's actions. That is, we need to explain why certain kinds of causal background to action threaten control while others do not even if we are dealing with cases with the shared feature that the agent does not control the early parts of those causal backgrounds.

Addressing this problem, Fischer and Ravizza suggest that a “process of taking responsibility is necessary for moral responsibility” (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 200). They add that, since processes are necessarily historical, it follows that their account of responsibility attends to an action's genesis or origins. With the same problem in mind, Susan Hurley suggests that responsibility requires that the process “by which reason-responsive mechanisms and self-perceptions in relation to these mechanisms are acquired” (Hurley 2003, 51) is one in which the agent is equipped with mechanisms that are sufficiently responsive to objective reasons (Hurley 2003, 51-2). That is, the reasons for which the agent acts must match the reasons for action that there in fact are sufficiently well, although this match need not be perfect. Whether either of these suggestions accommodates cases where, initially, responsibility seems to be undermined by lack of control of causes, remains to be seen.

For a brief discussion of the notion of constitutive luck see the following supplementary document:

Constitutive Luck

7. Option Luck Versus Brute Luck

Most observers agree that not all bad luck is unjust. Luck-egalitarians, for example, often separate option luck and brute luck and deny that bad instances of the former are unjust.

Canonically, Ronald Dworkin explains option luck as follows: “Option luck is a matter of how deliberate and calculated gambles turn out—whether someone gains or loses through accepting an isolated risk he or she should have anticipated and might have declined” (Dworkin 2000, 73). Brute luck is “a matter of how risks fall out that are not in that sense deliberate gambles” (Dworkin 2000, 73). If I suddenly go blind as a result of a genetic condition, my brute luck is bad, but if I buy a lottery ticket and win, my option luck is good.

The availability of insurance provides a link between brute and option luck. For “the decision to buy or reject […] insurance is a calculated gamble” (Dworkin 2000, 74). This means that a person may suffer bad brute luck, and for that reason end up worse off than others, and yet the resulting inequality might reflect differential option luck (see, however, Otsuka 2002, 43-51). Roughly, this will be so if the person who ends up worse off could have insured against the sort of bad brute luck that she later suffered but declined to do so (Dworkin 2000, 74, 77). So although it may be bad brute luck that I suddenly go blind as a result of a genetic condition, the fact that I end up worse off as a result of going blind (if this occurs) will reflect bad option luck provided suitable insurance was available to me. (This is not to say that suitable insurance against the risk of becoming blind is possible. I am neither denying nor affirming that no amount of money can compensate one for the loss of one's ability to see; nor am I denying, or affirming, that although some, presumably large, amount of money can compensate one for becoming blind, the required insurance policy will be unreasonably expensive. If suitable insurance against the risk of becoming blind is not possible or possible but unreasonably expensive, it follows that ending up worse off as a result of this is, to some extent at least, a matter of bad brute luck.)

Dworkin's distinction needs to be clarified and amended in certain ways (Lippert-Rasmussen 2001; Vallentyne 2002). Consider, for instance, a case where I can choose between two alternatives. One involves a 75% chance of having one's crop destroyed by cold weather. The other one involves a 70% chance of having one's crop destroyed by flooding. In one sense, obviously, either risk is avoidable. Yet, if one were to go for the first alternative, and if one's crops were destroyed by cold weather, it would seem odd to say that the full extent to which one becomes worse off as a result of that choice is a matter of bad option luck. After all, the chances of becoming just as badly off via a different causal route, had I chosen the other alternative, were almost as great. So it seems we should often think of a given piece of luck as a mixture of brute luck and option luck where the exact mixture depends on the extent to which one could influence the expected value of the outcome of one's choice. In the present case, I could only marginally influence the expected value of the outcome. Hence the disadvantages resulting from my choice should be seen as mostly a matter of bad brute luck.

Setting aside refinements to it, in what way does Dworkin's distinction matter from the point view of justice? We can split this question into two, one concerning brute luck and one concerning option luck. Most egalitarians believe that justice requires the nullification of all differential effects of brute luck (Cohen 1989, 908, 931; Dworkin 2000; Rakowski 1991), feeling that it cannot be just that some people are worse off than others simply because they have been unfortunate, say, to have been born with bad genes. Not all egalitarians, however, take this position. Peter Vallentyne believes that while it is true that justice requires compensation for congenital dispositions to develop serious diseases, this is because justice requires not the neutralization of bad brute luck but equality of initial prospects (Vallentyne 2002, 543). This equality obtains between two people when at some early stage in their development—say, the time at which they become sentient—their prospects are equally good. A genetic defect, at this point in time, would limit one's opportunities, and so such defects will often provide grounds for compensation. However, if two people face the same initial risk of developing malaria and have equally good initial opportunities, justice does not require us to compensate the one who gets malaria as a result of bad brute luck.

It is an advantage of Vallentyne's approach (over brute luck neutralizing egalitarianism) that it avoids the costs incurred in neutralizing the effects of differential brute luck. Of course, such costs may lower everyone's ex ante prospects. Hence, brute luck egalitarians are committed implausibly, in such cases, to worsening everybody's prospects—or, at least, to saying that it would be better to do so from the point of view of equality even if it may not be better tout court. However, as Vallentyne concedes, initial equality of opportunity also raises problems. Suppose we live in a caste society but make sure that babies are assigned starting positions in that society by a fair lottery. This society may well realize initial equality of opportunity, yet it does not seem just (Barry 1989, 224n). Indeed, it is far from clear that the lottery reduces the injustice of this society at all.

Turning now to option luck, three positions should be noted. First, some believe that justice requires the differential effects of option luck not to be nullified. Dworkin takes this view (Dworkin 2000; Rakowski 1991, 74). He thinks it would be unjust if the state were to compensate people who suffer bad option luck by taxing people who enjoy good option luck: “…people should pay the price of the life they have decided to lead, measured in what others give up in order that they can do so… But the price of a safer life, measured in this way, is precisely foregoing any chance of the gains whose prospect induces others to gamble” (Dworkin 2000, 74).

Others believe that justice permits but does not require the nullification of the effects of differential option luck. Peter Vallentyne defends this position. According to him, justice requires initial equality of opportunity, and this can be achieved through a scheme that provides equality of initial opportunities for advantage and no compensation for bad option outcome luck. However, initial equality of opportunity can also be achieved if the state, say, taxes all good option outcome luck (and all good brute luck) and compensates all bad option outcome luck (as well as all bad brute luck). This, in effect, will deprive people of the opportunity to gamble and hence ensure that everyone ends up equally well off. In Vallentyne's view, the latter is required by justice when, and only when, this increases the value of people's initial opportunities, and when the scheme is introduced publicly and proactively so that people know the rules of the game before it starts (Vallentyne 2002, 549, 555). The first of these conditions may be met where people are very risk averse and the transaction costs involved in the tax scheme are not very great.

In a third position, justice requires the nullification of some or all effects of differential option luck. This view comes in several versions. In one, justice requires compensation in some but not all cases of bad option luck. For instance, Marc Fleurbaey argues that justice has a sufficientarian component such that it requires differential option luck outcomes where some people are left very badly off to be eliminated. Suppose, for instance, that someone decides to use his motorcycle without wearing a helmet, knowing the risks involved, and ends up in a traffic accident in which he is seriously hurt as a result. According to Fleurbaey, justice requires us to help this person (Fleurbaey 1995, 40-41). Those attracted by Dworkin's position on bad option luck will reply that we confuse an obligation of justice with an obligation of charity. It would be unfair for the motorcycle driver to impose costs on us simply because he prefers to take the gamble of driving without helmet without insurance. He should pay the price of his decisions (which, of course, is not to say that he deserves his bad fate). By contrast, friends of Vallentyne's view might urge that there is nothing unjust about a system that publicly and proactively declares that bad outcome option luck will be compensated by means of taxing away good option luck. Hence, while a refusal to assist the unlucky motorcyclist need not be unjust, the imposition of assistance costs on others, under the circumstances mentioned, would not be unjust either.

A more extreme egalitarianism has it that it is better for justice if differential option luck differences—including those that do not involve some people being very badly off—are eliminated. For if what really drives egalitarians is the conviction that one group of people should not be worse off than others as a result of causes for which they are not responsible, then, arguably, it follows that differential option luck is bad. This view does not commit its advocates to the position that the state should prevent conduct that might lead to inequalities reflecting differential option luck: advocates of the view may be pluralists and insist that any such preventative measures would conflict with other values. Again, the claim that differential option luck is bad is consistent with the view that, given that people do choose to gamble, it is better if differential option luck is not eliminated, even if it would be better if people had chosen not to gamble in the first place (Lippert-Rasmussen 2001, 576).

8. Neutralizing Luck and Equality

Many passages in the luck egalitarian literature suggest that justice is luck-neutralization, not luck-amplification, and not luck-equalization. Consider, for instance, Rawls' remark that “Intuitively, the most obvious injustice of the system of natural liberty is that it permits distributive shares to be improperly influenced by these factors [i.e., social circumstances and such chance contingencies as accident and good fortune] so arbitrary from a moral point of view” (Rawls 1971, 71). On the admittedly disputable assumption that Rawls thinks that factors that are “arbitrary from a moral point of view” and affect people's interests are a matter of luck, one might read this passage as saying that under a just distribution, luck does not influence distributive shares (Rawls 1971, 72). As we saw in Section 2 a similar passage can be found in Cohen's work: “anyone who thinks that initial advantage and inherent capacity are unjust distributors thinks so because he believes that they make a person's fate depend too much on sheer luck” (Cohen 1989, 932). This passage can be read as suggesting that the aim of neutralizing luck justifies equality and that realizing equality will eliminate luck.

Such passages can, however, be read in other ways. Thus Rawls might simply mean to say that, while luck influences distributive shares under a just distribution, it does not do so improperly. Likewise, Cohen might be saying that, while people's fates depend on luck under a just distribution, they do not depend on sheer luck. And the fact that there is room for these different readings encourages us to ask exactly what role luck-neutralization can play in relation to a theory of distributive justice.

Addressing this question, Susan Hurley distinguishes between a specificatory and a justificatory role for the aim of luck-neutralization. In the first role, the aim specifies what egalitarianism “is and what it demands” (Hurley 2003, 147). In the second, it provides a justification for favoring egalitarian over non-egalitarian theories of distributive justice. Hurley believes that the luck-neutralizing aim fails in both roles. If the aim were to play either role, it would have to be the case that the favored distribution—e.g., equality, utility maximization, or maximizing the position of the worst off—limits the influence of luck on outcomes. However, there is no clear sense in which this is the case (compare Parfit, 1995, 12). For the sake of simplicity, suppose the favored distribution is an equal one. Suppose also that the inequality that we are concerned with exists between two people who have each been stranded on a small island. Through sheer good luck, the first person's island is lush and fertile, and through sheer bad luck the other person's island is arid. It does not follow from the fact that this unequal outcome is the result of luck that, if we eliminate the inequality, the resulting equal outcome will not to the same degree be the result of luck, i.e., will not be one in which factors for which people are not responsible play no (or a smaller) causal role in bringing about the outcome. To see this, assume we are dealing with thick, control-based responsibility luck and imagine that a powerful egalitarian intervener dumps a shipload of fertilizer on the second island so that equality in the Robinson Crusoe-like setting is realized. Since neither of the two people controlled what happened, the resulting equality here is just as much a matter of luck for them as the prior inequality was. Since we can implement equality without eliminating luck, this shows that we can neither justify equality as a means of neutralizing luck, nor specify what equality requires as neutralizing luck. The same applies to other end-result principles (Hurley 2003, 146-80).

In response to this important point, it might be argued that when luck-egalitarians write about “neutralizing luck”, this is really short-hand for something like “eliminating the differential effects on people's interests of factors which from their perspective are a matter of luck.” This is no different from saying that affirmative action in favor of women is a way of neutralizing the effects of sexist discrimination. In saying this, we do not imagine that affirmative action programmes remove sexist discrimination and all its effects; we mean merely that the affirmative action program eliminates the differential effects on men and women of sexist discrimination (e.g., in university admissions). On this reading, considerations about luck serve, not to justify equality, but to select the appropriate egalitarian view from among the large family of views that ascribe intrinsic significance to equality. As Arneson puts it: “The argument for equal opportunity rather than straight equality is simply that it is morally fitting to hold individuals responsible for the foreseeable consequences of their voluntary choices” (Arneson 1989, 88). Equality is the default position, morally speaking. It is not justified by appeal to luck. Such an appeal, however, explains why some deviations from this default position need not be bad from an egalitarian point of view, for in the relevant deviations it is not a matter of luck that some people are worse off than others.

For a further discussion of the notion of bad and good luck, see the following supplementary document:

Bad Luck Versus Good Luck

9. Non-Separability of Luck and Effort

A number of luck egalitarian accounts suggest that how much talent people have is a matter of luck, whereas their levels of effort are not. Metaphorically speaking, the first is a matter of the cards one has been dealt, whereas the latter is a matter of how one chooses to play them. To be sure, it will often be plausible to say that one's present level of talent reflects past effort, and that one's level of effort is a matter of good or bad luck (Rawls 1971, 74). Partly for the sake of simplicity, and partly because the problem about separability will arise whichever way we make the cut between luck and non-luck with regard to talents and efforts, let us initially assume that while talents are wholly a matter of luck, one's levels of effort are wholly a matter of non-luck. Accordingly, people who have different levels of talent, but the same level of effort should end up equally well off if we neutralize the effects of luck, whereas people who have the same levels of talent but different levels of effort should end unequally well off. More generally, differences in effort should be reflected in differences in reward, but differences in talent should not. Under these assumptions we can easily identify a luck-neutralizing distribution under the assumption of a constant sum of rewards in the following four-person case:

Actual level of talents Actual level of efforts Actual distribution of rewards Luck-neutralizing distribution of rewards
Adam Low Low 10 17.5
Beatrice High High 30 22.5
Claude Low High 20 22.5
Dorothy High Low 20 17.5

This distribution neutralizes luck (not necessarily uniquely: there may be other luck-neutralizing distributions). Adam and Dorothy, who despite different levels of talent put in the same amount of effort, get the same level of reward. The same is true of Beatrice and Claude. Beatrice and Claude's levels of reward are higher than Adam and Dorothy's, reflecting their higher level of effort.

Assume next that level of effort is non-separable from level of talent. That is, assume that if a group of people's levels of talent had been different from what they actually are, so would their levels of effort. Assume that in our four-person case above the facts are as follows:

Actual level of talents Actual level of efforts Counter-
factual level of talents
factual level of efforts
Actual distri-
bution of rewards
izing distri-
bution of rewards
Adam Low Low High High 10 ?
Beatrice High High Low Low 30 ?
Claude Low High High High 20 ?
Dorothy High Low Low Low 20 ?

It no longer is clear which distribution neutralizes luck. Two responses seem possible, both of which may have unattractive implications.

First, suppose we insist that counterfactual levels of effort are simply irrelevant to luck-neutralization: ex hypothesi, one's actual levels of effort are not a matter of luck, and a luck-neutralizing distribution should fit the distribution of actual efforts. This view may fail to capture the full range of luck-egalitarian intuitions. After all, Adam—if for a moment we disregard problems about knowledge and indeterminacy in counterfactual choices (Hurley 2001, 66-69; Hurley 2003, 164-168)—might correctly say that his case is identical to Beatrice's, and that he was merely unlucky not to be talented. And given that the cause of their putting in different levels of effort is simply a matter of luck, how can Beatrice's higher level of effort justify a higher level of reward for her? In not being talented, Adam may have suffered from bad circumstantial luck. That is to say, the circumstances in which he decided on his levels of effort—his particular skills not being much in demand—may have ensured that those decisions were less prudent than they would have been in different contexts. Alternatively, Adam may have suffered from bad constitutive luck in that he could have been differently constituted, and had he been so he would have made greater effort.

Second, we might say that actual as well as counterfactual levels of effort matter (compare Zimmerman 1993, 226). Rewards should match average effort across different possible worlds. Since Claude's levels of effort are high whatever his level of talent, Dorothy's are low whatever her level of talent, and Adam's and Beatrice's levels of effort varies with their level of talent, a luck-neutralizing distribution would leave Claude best off, Adam and Beatrice second-best off, and Dorothy worst off. The problem now is that people who actually make the same efforts, i.e., Adam and Dorothy and Beatrice and Claude, are rewarded differently. Beatrice might complain that her level of effort is as high as Claude's, and yet he gets rewarded more—and he does so, moreover, not solely as a consequence of how he actually conducted himself, but partly as a result of how he would have conducted himself had his level of talent been different from what it in fact is. When we focus on thick, responsibility control luck or thick, responsibility choice luck, it becomes unclear whether this is the right way to neutralize luck. For, on many accounts of responsibility, what I am responsible for depends on properties of the actual sequence of events and not on what I would have done in some counterfactual sequence of events in which my personality differs from the way it actually is. It appears that, to reconcile such thick accounts of luck with neutralizing luck on the basis of counterfactual levels of effort, we would need to endorse a regressive conception of responsibility on which to be responsible for something one has to be responsible for its causes. This would solve the problem of accounting for which distribution neutralizes luck in that, as argued above, it now seems that the only distribution that neutralizes luck is an equal one. However, it would also prevent luck-egalitarians from claiming that people with different levels of talent should be rewarded differently. Hence, while the non-separability of talent and effort does not refute luck-egalitarianism, two ways of resolving the issues it raises generate further problems.

10. Equal Status, Humiliating Revelations and the Critique of Luck-Egalitarianism

Most egalitarians want to compensate people for bad brute luck but not bad option luck. Moreover, they have tended to assume that this is essentially what justice is about. Recently, this attitude has been criticized as either leaving out of the picture an important non-distributive egalitarian concern or, more radically, being a misconstrual of egalitarian justice.

Jonathan Wolff defends the moderate position that while distributive concerns about bad brute luck are part of what justice is about, that is not the whole story: “Distributive justice should be limited in its application by other egalitarian concerns” (Wolff 1998, 122), for the ideal of justice also includes the view that we should respect one another as equals. According to Wolff, this introduces a reason not to strive for perfect equality of opportunity. For making people equally well off in terms of opportunity would require “shameful revelations” on the part of people who must, for instance, pass on to others (and thus themselves come to terms with) the information that they have no talent.

Wolff's point is well made, but luck-egalitarians may be able to accommodate it. First, insofar as they accept Wolff's factual observation, they may think that this points to a strong (welfarist) luck-egalitarian reason not to implement equality of opportunity: we can know in advance that collecting the relevant information is likely to make some of those who are already worse off through bad luck even worse off. Of course, this would not show that if we could collect the relevant information without bad side effects, we should not aim to compensate bad brute luck alone. Additionally, luck-egalitarians may simply concede that the pursuit of the luck-egalitarian ideal is constrained by other ideals, including that of equal respect. In any case, luck-egalitarians are unlikely to claim that luck-neutralization is the only ideal, as that would imply that a world where everyone lives miserable lives is better, all things considered, than a world where half the people live tremendous lives and the other half live even better lives.

Like Wolff, Elizabeth Anderson argues that egalitarians believe people should live in communities based on principles that “express equal respect and concern for all citizens” (Anderson 1999, 289). Unlike Wolff, however, Anderson makes the more radical claim that (true) egalitarians have, in a way, no non-instrumental concern about distribution at all: they are concerned about distribution only indirectly, their direct concern being that members of the community should stand as equals. To achieve this, the elimination of differential brute luck, for instance, is not required. What is required is the ability of all to function as equal human beings in civil society and in political decision making.

Luck-egalitarians question whether this is plausible. Suppose resources are distributed in such a way that equal functioning in civil society and in political decision making is assured. Suppose, moreover, that we can choose between two distributions: one that benefits those who are worse off in terms of how well their lives go, and another that benefits those who are best off in terms of how well their lives go. Since this choice will not affect democratic equality, these options are equally good on Anderson's account. To many, this is an unattractive implication of her view. Of course, if the threshold of equal functioning is very high the problem becomes less serious. However, with high thresholds a different problem becomes more serious. For if people should be assured of equal functioning at a very high level irrespective of whether they act (perhaps repeatedly) in irresponsibly foolish ways, it will not seem fair to impose the cost of their choices on others—i.e., the cost of bringing them up to the appropriate threshold of equal functioning (Arneson 2000, 347-348). Intuitively, then, the complaint is that democratic equality ascribes no significance to the fact that responsibility of choice can negate luck. It is far from clear that concern about equal status overturns the pivotal belief that justice is concerned with compensation for bad luck (see, however, Scheffler 2003).


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Related Entries

desert | equality | equality: of opportunity | justice | justice: distributive | luck: moral | moral responsibility


I wish to thank the editors of The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, the anonymous referee who reviewed the entry, as well as Mark D. Friedman, Nils Holtug and Paul Robinson for valuable comments.