Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Ibn Bajja

Aristotle's On the Soul in the Arabic tradition

There were at least two Arabic versions of the book On the Soul circulating, an ancient version from the 9th century, and a later one by Ishâq Ibn Hunayn (d. 910).The translations and their Latin and Hebrew versions show an intricate relationship.

The older version was edited by A. Badawi, Aristûtâlîs fî-n-nafs, Cairo: Maktabat al-Nahdah al-Misrîyah, 1954. The beginning of the manuscript is misleading since it attributes the translation to Ishâq Ibn Hunayn (d. 910) who is the author of the later version, or most part of it. It is not his known terminology, and loan-words are frequent. As possible author ‘Abd al-Masîh Ibn Nâ‘ima al-Himsî, who lived in the first half of the IX century, has been suggested.

Avicenna wrote annotations on the book On the soul, At-ta‛lîqât ‛alà hawâmish Kitâb an-nafs li-Aristâtâlîs (Badawî, 1947, pp. 75-116). He was using a manuscript which, for the most part, was the later translation. However, when it comes to De anima 431 a 14 we read: “Ishâq Ibn Hunayn translated the copy [of the text] to this point. From here on it is another translation with many corrections by the commentator” (Badawi. 1947, p. 109, note 1).

This observation matches with the statement made by Ibn an-Nadîm in his Fihrist (composed 987) that Ishâq Ibn Hunayn translated the book On the Soul twice (ed. G. Flügel, vol. 1, p. 251), and that the first time, the translation was not complete for a small part, illâ shay’an yasîran.

Michael Scotus translated Averroes' Long Commentary on the Soul from Arabic into Latin in the XIII century (Crawford 1953). The commentary includes the text of the book On the soul in the form of lemmas. Averroes used two Arabic translations; he preferred the translation by Ishâq Ibn Hunayn, but he quoted the older one as alia translatio also in nine passages (Crawford 1953, pp. 46, 86, 284, 452, 469, 480, 514, 519, 526), going through the entire book.

Zerahya ben She’atiel translated Aristotle's De anima from Arabic into Hebrew in Rome in the year 1284, and Gerrit Bos edited his translation(Leiden: Brill, 1994). The Hebrew version begins ascribing the Arabic translation to some Hunayn but says, at 431a 14, that “What Ishâq Ibn Hunayn translated from this treatise is being completed with [following] translation of Abû ‛Îsà Ibn Ish’âq from Syriac into Arabic:” (Bos 1994, p. 127, ll. 325-324). Bos follows M. Steinschneider and identifies Abû ‛Îsà with ‛Îsà Ibn Zur‛a (d. 1008) but we should not forget that confusions over names are frequent. Ishâq Ibn Hunayn (d. 901) is the son of another famous translator, Hunayn Ibn Ishâq (d. 873), who knew both Greek and Syriac, while his son knew only Syriac.

Although the remark coincides with that in the Ta‛lîqât of Avicenna, we only can put forward that the text of the Ta‛lîqât until 431a 14 was the same used by Averroes and by Zerahyah, i.e. the translation by Ishâq Ibn Hunayn. After 431a 14, the text used by Avicenna (d. 1037) would be completed with the old one. By contrast, Averroes (d. 1198) and Zerahya (in 1284) both relied on a text which was completed with a translation from Syriac into Arabic made by Ibn Zur‛a (d. 1008).

But we can ascertain first, that the newer version is extant in both its Latin and Hebrew versions, that its main part is by Ishâq Ibn Hunayn and that its last part could be by Ibn Zur‛a, and second, that the older version is extant complete in its Arabic original and then in a few Latin fragments of the so called alia translatio. I give here these examples taken from the version after 431a 14:

In 431a 14

  1. Scotus — Ishâq Ibn Hunayn: Et in anima sensibili inveniuntur ymagines secundum modos sensuum (Crawford 468).

    Hebrew: U-ba-nefesh ha-medabberet yimmasu dimionot ‛al dimion mi-mine ha-hushim (Bos 127).

    However the Latin rendered “sensible” and the Hebrew “rational” in this place, so there maybe a mistake in the Latin manuscripts.

  2. Scotus — alia translatio: Apud autem animam rationabilem ymago est quasi res sensibiles (Craword 469).

    Arabic: Wa-amma ‛ind an-nafsi an-nâtiqati fa-t-takhyîlu bi-manzilati al-ashyâ’i al-mahsûsati (Badawi 77: 7-8)

In 431b 17-19

  1. Scotus — Ishâq Ibn Hunayn: et cogitatio nostra in postremo erit utrum possit intelligere aliquam rerum abstractarum, cum hoc quod ipse est abstractus a magnitudine, aut non. (Crawford 479).

    Hebrew: We-yihyeh mahshabatenu ba-aharito be-she-im yihyeh efshar lo she-yaskil shum davar min ha-‛inyanim ha-mufshatim ‛im she-hu mufshat min ha-giddul im lo(Bos 128).

  2. Scotus — alia translatio: et in postremo prescrutabimur utrum intellectus, essendo in corpore,non separatus ab eo, possit comprehendere aliquod eorum que separantur a corporibus aut non (Crawford 480)

    Arabic: Wa-sa-nanzuru akhîran in kâna yumkinu l-‛aqla wa-huwa fî l-jism, idrâku shay’in min mufâriqâti l-ajsâdi, aw laysa yumkinuhu dhâlika (Badawi, 78: 12-13).

In 432b 30 - 433a 1

  1. Scotus — Ishâq Ibn Hunayn: ut multotiens opinantur aliquid esse delectabile aut timorosum et non mittimur ad timorem; cor autem movetur quando aliud membrum delectatur. (Crawford 514).

    Hebrew: kemo mah she-ye’amen harbeh ba-davar min ha-devarim she-hu o ‛arev o mefahed, ve lo bi-shloah’ ‛al ha-pahad; omnam ha-lev yitno‛a‛ ke-she-yimmase’ [ever] aher ha-hana’ah. (Bos 132).

  2. Scotus — alia translatio: multotiens cogitat intellectus in aliquo timoroso aut in aliquo delectabili, sed non propter hoc erit timor aut delectatio; cor autem movetur motu timoris, sed non ex intellectu (Crawford 514).

    Arabic: wa-kathîran mâ yatafakkaru al-‛aqlu fî shay’in mukhîfin aw fî shay’in mulidhdhin fa-lâ yakûnu l-khawfu ‛an amrin wa-lâ li-l-ladhdhati harakata; fa-inna l-qalba yataharraku harakata l-khawfi, wa-laysa dhâlika ‛an il-‛aqli (Badawi 81: 10-12).

In 433a 25

  1. Scotus — Ishâq Ibn Hunayn: Et desiderium movet motu qui non intrat cogitationem. Et desiderium est aliquis appetitus (Crawford 518).

    Hebrew: We ha-ta’awah tani‛a tenu‛ah einah nikneset be-mahshabah. We-ha-teshuqah hi’ ta’awah ahat. (Bos 133)

  2. Scotus — alia translatio: Appetitus autem movet sine cogitatione, quia appetitus est modus desiderii (Crawford 519)

    Arabic: wa-amma ash-shahwatu fa-innama tuharriku bi-ghayri firkrin li’anna ash-shahwata inmma hiya darbun min ash-shawqi. (Badawi 82: 17-18)

In 433b 21

  1. Scotus — Ishâq Ibn Hunayn: Et dico modo universaliter quod corpus movetur modo consimilitudinis. Ubi enim est principium, illic etiam finis, sicut motus girativus. In hoc enim invenitur gibbositas et concavitas, illud autem finis, hoc autem principium (Crawford 525).

    Hebrew: We-omer ‛atah bi-klal ki ha-guph yitna‛e tenu‛ah keliit ki be-maqom she-tihyeh ha-hathalah sham gam ken tihyeh ha-‛amidah, kemo ha-tenu‛ah ha-kilulit. Ki ba-zeh yimmase’ ha-gibbonut we-ha-halalut omnam yihyeh oto takhlit ve-omnam zeh tihyeh hathalah (Bos 134).

    We cannot but conjecture that Ishâq translated the Greek gigglymos “hinge-joint” as lawlab, “spiral”, following Themistius kamâ tanqalibu l-jihâtu fî l-lawlab ‛alà t-tabdîl wa-l-mihwaru thâbitun (“and the lynchpin is stable”, Lyons 1973, p. 223, ll. 10-11) because Ish’âq is also the translator of Themistius' Paraphrase. Scotus seems to have understood its meaning right but not Zerahyah.

  2. Scotus — alia translatio: Dicamus igitur breviter quod motor es quasi habens eandem dispositionem in suo principio et in suo fine, sicut illud quod digitur Grece gigglimus. Est enim in eo gibbositas et concauitas, et unum eorum est finis et aliud principium (Crawford 526).

    Arabic: Fa-inna nakhtasiru fa-naqûlu bi-ijâzin inna l-muharrika ka-âlatin huwa alladhî bi-hâlin wâhidatin min bad’i-hi wa-nihâyatihi, mithla ma yusammà bi-l-yûnânîyatin jinjilmûs, fa-inna fî-hi ahadun (sic) wa-thaniyatan: fa-ahadu hadhayni nihâyatun wa-l-âkharu bad’u-hu (Badawi 83: 19-21).

    The Arabic and the Latin run parallel, in an approximate way, up to gigglimus and thereafter the Hebrew follows the Greek but the Arabic diverges and becomes unintelligible.

As for the text transmitted by Avicenna's Ta‛lîqât Gätje did not hesitate to identify the first part, i.e., that reaching until 431a 14 (Badawi 1947, p. 109, note 1) with the later translation preserved in the lemmas of the Long Commentary, and in the Hebrew translation. Besides A.L. Ivry (2001) utilized Averroes' Middle Commentary on the Soul and reinforced Gâtje's position. Gätje however found enough evidence to identify the second part with the older translation (Gätje 1971, p. 38) and aligned with R. Frank who already in 1958 argued that the last part of the third book was none other than the version edited by Badawi.

The issue remains open, and Elamrani-Jamal holds the view that there were three translations, but different from those here mentioned. Elamrani-Jamal takes into consideration the above mentioned statement made by Ibn an-Nadîm and affirms that 1) the first translation done by Ishâq Ibn Hunayn is preserved in the glosses of Avicenna, 2) the complete translation transmitted by its Hebrew version and by the lemmas of Scotus' Latin version could be the second translation of Ish’âq, but Elamrani-Jamal is not sure and calls it anonymous, and 3) the translation published by Badawi (1954) and preserved in the references to alia translatio in Scotus' Latin version, (2003, p. 351) is by an anonymous translator.

The main difficulty for establishing a third translation on the basis of Avicenna's Ta‛lîqât is not only the scarceness of the fragments but also their approximate, not literal, character. For instance, if we take the longest fragment above, Badawi 83: 19-21, and check it with the parallel passage in Frank's inventory (1958, p. 239), in the Ta‛lîqât (Badawi 1947, p. 114, ll. 12-14) we read:

Ayyu anna al-âlata allatî bi-hâ yuharriku sh-shawqu yajibu an takûna ‛udwan fî l-wasati huwa al-bad’u wa-ilayhi l-intihâ’u, ka-l-markazi wa-l-mihwari (approximative 433b 21-22).

The presence of the term âlah, “instrument” points to the older version, since the term is not present in the later one. We can consider it as circumstantial evidence in favor of the thesis of Frank and Gätje, but not in favor of a third translation. As for the clarifying comparison ka-l-markazi wa-l-mihwari, “like the center and the axis”, it echoes Themistius' words wa-l-mihwar thâbit (Lyons 1973, p. 223, l. 11) which translated his original tēn peronēn menousan (“and the linchpin is stable”, Heinze, p. 121, ll. 12-13). Therefore, the question arises whether Avicenna was relying here more on Themistius' Paraphrase of On the soul than on Aristotle's book. But there are no compelling reasons to suspect that Avicenna was not reading the same or similar version that Averroes and Zerahyah did.

As a result of these observations, we should establish one first anonymous translation, that edited by Badawi, a second translation by Ishâq Ibn Hunayn which is the source of the Latin and Hebrew translations, and a third translation maybe by Ibn Zur‛a, partially recorded, which completes the second. We do not know which translation Avempace was reading. By contrast, we know that Averroes had two translations at hand and that he preferred the second by Ishâq Ibn Hunayn to the old one.