Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Coercion

[1] For now the notion of a threat will be left undefined, but see note 6 below, as well as the discussion of current disputes over the nature of threats in section II B-D.

[2] Aquinas' view here is quite complicated, in that he distinguishes the voluntariness of the particular act done from fear from the involuntariness of acting from fear more generally. (See Aquinas, 1920 [1273]: I.II Q6 A6.)

[3] No instances appear in his Two Treatises of Government where his political views are most thoroughly spelled out. All told, throughout Locke's public writings there are just a handful of instances of terms “coercion” and “coerce” in the Essays on the Law of Nature, and “coercive” in “A Third Letter for Toleration.” His uses in these contexts seem consistent with, e.g., Hobbes's use of the term “coercive” in the Leviathan.

[4] The first part of the Metaphysics of Morals.

[5] Although these conditions are framed in terms of keeping someone from doing something, they are intended to cover inducing someone to take an action, as well.

[6] The word “threat” in English seems to have two different senses, corresponding to two different purposes one might have in making a threat. One sense picks out claims in which one agent advertises that he will effect adverse consequences on another at some point in the future. “I'm going to kill you,” or “you'll pay for that,” are threats in this sense. A different sense picks out claims made by one agent to motivate another into action by linking the latter's conduct to the possibility of adverse consequences the former may or will effect as a result. “If you touch that, I'll slug you,” and “violators will be prosecuted,” are examples of this latter sort. “Threats” in this sense are almost always susceptible of a conditional analysis (where the antecedent makes reference to the conduct of the threat's recipient), but not all conditional threats are motivational in character. “If it rains tomorrow, I'll kill you” does not apparently aim to motivate action by the threat's recipient. (A similar distinction can be made amongst senses of the term “offer.”) From hereon in this entry, “threat” and “conditional threat” will be used interchangeably, and will refer exclusively to claims made with a motivational purpose. This usage reflects standard practice in the contemporary coercion literature. I will use “unconditional threat” to pick out the former, non-motivational sense, where it is understood that they may in fact be conditional in form, though not conditioned on conduct by its recipient.

[7] One might note that this way of using the term “proposal,” although common in this literature, is rather at odds with most ordinary uses. The point of adopting this terminology seems to be that it helps bring out similarities in the way coercion and ordinary offers both alter the coercee's payoff structure for acting. But whereas our ordinary understanding of proposals might be thought to include that it is open to the recipient either to accept or reject them, the notion of coercion might be thought to imply that, in some way, it is not open to the coercee to reject it.

[8] One might also wish to include in this latter sort of coercion direct destructive actions against a person's property taken with an aim to alter or constrain what the property owner or user is able to do.

[9] It is worth emphasizing that the preference depicted here is comparative, to be expressed between the two consequents, and does not suggest that one consequent must be desired (ceteris paribus) while the other must be disvalued (ceteris paribus). If the proposal is an offer, one likely wants the offer to be made – that is, that the conditional with the preferred consequent govern the possibilities for action; but one may be indifferent to whether the conditional with the less-preferred consequent be operable or not. Similarly, if a proposal is a threat, one wishes that the conditional with the least favored consequent were not operative; it may be a matter of indifference, however, whether the other conditional is operative or not.

[10] The other case is that of a drug dealer who threatens to withhold drug sales from one of his regular, addicted customers, unless the customer agrees to carry out an assault on a target the dealer has chosen.

[11] It is hard to say, using just Gorr's stated principles and discussion of cases, whether he would grant that the examples here would count as coercive on his account. Gorr attempts to constrain what sorts of preferences might count for purposes of setting the baseline; for instance, he requires that Q's preferences range over P's actual possible acts, and not over P's omissions (otherwise, the shopkeeper's omitting to give away goods for free would count as a threat to deprive someone of such goods). On similar grounds, Gorr also requires that “it is not the case that Q desires that P not bring about A solely because P's bringing about A would be incompatible with P's bringing about some other state of affairs the obtaining of which Q does desire” (Gorr, 1986: p. 388). The examples in the text here show that some cases of ordinary interaction will likely slip past these constraints. Even if he denies these, he admits overtly that he would count as coercive the following situation: Suppose P has a habit, plan or activity that Q dislikes or disapproves of severely, and P proposes to cease such activity iff Q pays some sum. So if Jones disapproves of Smith's TV watching, and Smith proposes to alter it for a fee, this would be coercive. (See Gorr, 1986: p. 391.)

[12] See Wertheimer, 1987; other notable moralized-baseline accounts include Oberdiek, 1976; Gunderson, 1979; Raz, 1986; Carr, 1988; and Hetherington, 1999. In fairness to Wertheimer, he holds that there are multiple baselines that are useful for evaluating coercion claims; choosing which one to use depends on what is at issue in the claim. However, it seems that to answer the questions we are most interested in when discussing coercion − e.g., when is it wrongful and when does it alter coercee responsibility − requires use of a moralized baseline, on Wertheimer's analysis.

[13] The question of what sort of action is required of the proposer to violate the recipient's rights, or to make the recipient worse off than she ought to be, is not without difficulty. Presumably failing to honor one's contract could be the content of a possible threatened consequence; but could failing to keep one's promise be? Similarly, throwing someone overboard at sea would violate her rights, but would refusing to save her (when it is easy to do, but not something one has already agreed to do) also count as violating her rights? If not, someone encountering a drowning person could demand an exorbitant payment from her for an easy and riskless rescue without thereby either threatening or, consequently, coercing her.

[14] In fairness to Frankfurt, he also explains earlier in the same essay that coercive threats need to meet three conditions: the coercee must be dependent on the coercer in order to meet his needs, a situation which the coercer then exploits (Frankfurt, 1988 [1973]: p. 71). This gives a very different picture of coercion from the one normally associated with Frankfurt. However this analysis seems to fall out of the picture in the second, more influential part of his essay.

[15] This last condition is actually part of a larger disjunct for Feinberg, the other half of which allows that the coercer may be bluffing, and thus does not actively do anything to constrain the coercee's options.

[16] It is worth noting here, however, that Feinberg later seems to severely qualify or even abandon this condition. He allows that one who makes a highly exploitative offer (e.g., a lecherous millionaire who propositions a woman in desperate financial straits) may still be engaging in coercion even if the exploiter did nothing to create or perpetuate the conditions he exploits.

[17] Wertheimer, for one, would appear to agree with this claim, but find it unproblematic. He is willing to accept that different moral tests apply in different circumstances, and no one test will decide responsibility in all kinds of cases, regardless of context.

[18] The law in this area is, however, rather messy, and derives from a relatively small number of actual cases at trial. For an insightful overview and attempt at clarification of these issues, see Christie, 1999.

[19] A classic philosophical example displaying a similar dynamic is Bernard Williams' anecdote about Jim, the wayward botanist in South America. Jim stumbles onto a military pogrom, and is given a choice of shooting one villager after which nineteen others will be released unharmed, or washing his hands of the business and letting the lot of twenty be shot by someone else. While some would suggest that if he chooses to shoot one, his responsibility is limited by virtue of being justified; one might suggest that either course Jim takes, he should be relieved of responsibility for any of the consequences on grounds that the consequences that become attached to his decision depend wholly on the will of someone else who attaches them. (See Williams, 1973.)

[20] When one makes a conditional threat, one can often convert the possibility of carrying out a harmful action into a means for extracting benefits from or constraints on action by the threatened party. By contrast, unconditional threats may instill fear in that party, but ultimately they are of little consequence unless one actually carries through on the unconditional threat, in which case the utility of making the unconditional threat may be dubious; issuing it in advance of attempting to bring about those consequences may just make it easier for its recipient to prepare for and avoid the advertised harmful consequence.

[21] These difficulties have been explored more thoroughly by those interested in strategic defense and game theory. For instance, see Kavka, 1978.

[22] And making a proposal per se is not necessarily problematic at all: one might, e.g., “propose” legislation for the purpose of forcing one's fellow legislators to put their opposition to it on the record.

[23] These might include communicating easily with other inmates or learning the rules of the yard. The point is not that these are as desirable as the options open to non-inmates, but simply that there are no strictly numerical ways of making this comparison that will capture what we think is important about freedom.

[24] One might suggest that one could judge the difference in freedom between the inmate and the unincarcerated by simply asking whether they would rather be in the other's place; presumably the answer is yes for the inmate, and no for the unincarcerated. But one can't be sure that people will always prefer more freedom to less. One might, for instance, join the military to gain the discipline that comes from having many fewer options than one has in civilian life. So preferences do not always mirror assessments of the amount of freedom two options entail.

[25] These include whether or when a state is justified in using coercion for purposes such as welfare promotion, paternalistic aims, and to foster general cooperation. Similarly, questions about whether coercive states are to be preferred to anarchy or whether coercion (as it is usually conceived) is essential to state function are not resolvable through the narrower consideration of coercion itself. For a discussion of a variety of possible connections between law, states, and coercion, see Lamond 2001, pp. 42-45.

[26] This difficulty is not dependent on whether one accepts a baseline approach. Both Wertheimer's (1987) baseline approach and Haksar's (1976) non-baseline approach lead to the result that Edmundson (1995) trumpets.

[27] There are two different reasons one might support such coercion against oneself. First, we could well assume that the criminal law must be general in form and in its use of coercive threats if it is to be practicable. One may of course wish that the laws applied only to everyone else, yet one might well support the imposition of a law that coerced oneself into doing what one would otherwise avoid, on the condition that such a use of coercion applied across the board. But secondly, one may also want to be subject to the criminal law oneself in order to facilitate interaction with others who would otherwise have reason to be wary or reticent in their dealings with one. Just as signing a contract gives others assurances of one's future actions, being subject to the coercive criminal law allows others a measure of assurance that one will act benignly towards them.

[28] So, Lamond argues, the law's authorization of coercive means is what makes it coercive, “irrespective of who is to carry them out” (Lamond, 2000: p. 40).