Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to John Wyclif's Political Philosophy

1.See Janet Coleman, "Property and Poverty," in The Cambridge History of Medieval Political Thought c.350-c.1450, J. H. Burns, ed., Cambridge 1988, pp. 607-648, for an introduction to the complex relations between medieval theories of the legality and theology of property ownership.

2.Augustine, On The City of God, Book XIV, Chpt. 28, Basic Writings of St. Augustine, Whitney Oates, ed., New York, 1948, Vol. 2, p. 451.

3.Giles of Rome, On Ecclesiastical Power: The De Ecclesiastica Potestate of Aegidius Romanus, R. W. Dyson ed. and transl., Drew, NH, 1986, Part III, Chpt. 2, paragraph 4.

4.D. L. Burr, Olivi and Franciscan Poverty, Philadelphia, 1989, and M. D. Lambert, Franciscan Poverty, St. Bonaventure, NY, 1998.

5. For details of the controversy between John XXII and Ockham, see William Ockham, A Letter to the Friars Minor and Other Writings, A. S. McGrade and John Kilcullen, eds. and transl., Cambridge, 1995. See also McGrade 1974.

6.Fitzralph's arguments concerning the Franciscans await a thorough scholarly study. The first four books of De Pauperie Salvatoris were included in the Wyclif Society's 1890 edition of Wyclif's De Dominio Divino, while Richard Brock edited the latter books in "An Edition of Richard Fitzralph's De Pauperie Salvatoris, Books V, VI, and VII," unpublished Ph.D. dissertation, University of Colorado, 1954. See also Katherine Walsh, A Fourteenth Century Scholar and Primate: Richard Fitzralph of Oxford, Avignon and Armagh, Oxford, 1981, and James Doyne Dawson, "Richard Fitzralph and the Fourteenth-Century Poverty Controversies," Journal of Ecclesiastical History 34 (1983).

7.Wyclif gives a list of sixteen characteristics and proceeds to discuss only these six. This has prompted some scholars to suppose that his discussion of the remaining ten has been lost, leaving us with only a fragment of the original treatise. I believe that Wyclif recognized these six acts to be sufficient for his argument, abandoning the remaining ten as superfluous.

8.Compare Wyclif's discussion of justice and right in De Mandatis Divinis [DMD] 3 to that of Aquinas in Summa Theologica IaIIae Q.57, aa.1-4 and Q.58 aa.1-12. Aquinas argues that while right is the object of justice, natural reason is capable of ascertaining justice without an understanding of God's uncreated right. See also my "Wyclif on Rights," Journal of the History of Ideas 58 (1997): 1-20.

9. For a translation of DCD I, 1-10, see A. S. McGrade, John Kilcullen, and Matthew Kempshall, eds., The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts. Volume Two: Ethics and Politics, Cambridge, 2001, pp. 587-654. Also, for an online Latin text of the same, see John Wyclif, De Civili Dominio, Chs. 1-10: Collation

10. For fuller discussion of Wyclif's conceptions of royal responsibility to the realm, see Chpt. 6 of Lahey, 2002. See also William Farr, Wyclif as Legal Reformer, Leiden 1974, for consideration of Wyclif's use of English law in his vision of royal reform of the church.