Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Special Obligations

First published Thu 17 Oct, 2002

Special obligations are obligations owed to some subset of persons, in contrast to natural duties that are owed to all persons simply qua persons. Common sense morality seems to understand us as having special obligations to those to whom we stand in some sort of special relationship, e.g., our friends, our family members, our colleagues, our fellow citizens, and those to whom we have made promises or commitments of some sort. Special obligations are often appealed to in arguments against consequentialism, because consequentialism is unable to accommodate agent-relative reasons and genuinely special obligations are agent-relative reasons. Attempts to defend special obligations run up against objections from insiders -- why suppose that I am obligated to do more for certain persons just because I happen to stand in some special relationship to them? -- and also from outsiders -- why do other persons get more benefits just because they happen to stand in special relationships to other persons? Attempts to ground special obligations have appealed to diverse states of affairs, including the intrinsic nature of the special relationship, the nature of the party to whom the obligations are owed, the expectations of the party to whom the obligations are owed, and the nature of persons as psychological continuants bound by relations between mental states.

1. Special Obligations and Consequentialism

What is special about special obligations? One way to answer this question is to contrast special obligations with some type of duty or obligation that is not special. One example of such a ‘non-special’ type of duty or obligation is that recognized by consequentialists. (I will contrast special obligations with another type of non-special duty in section III). According to one version of consequentialism, the right action is that action which, of all alternatives available to the agent, produces the greatest net sum of intrinsic value, where intrinsic value is value as an end or for its own sake and not merely as a means to something other than itself. (There are, of course, many forms of consequentialism. The important feature of such views for our purposes is that they understand right action as a function of and solely of the consequences (actual, probable, or possible) of the action and its alternatives. I will be presupposing a version of actual consequence act-consequentialism in what follows. But my comments apply mutatis mutandis to other versions of consequentialism.)

But now consider how, according to the consequentialist, I ought to treat my friends (or family members, or colleagues, ...). If my friend's well-being is no more intrinsically valuable than the well-being of any other person, then I ought to be impartial, at least in my actions, between promoting the good of my friend and promoting the good of a complete stranger. Thus, the mere fact that someone is my friend (or my mother, or my colleague, or my fellow citizen) does not imply that I have any obligations to such a person that I do not have to any and all persons. Similarly, the mere fact that I have promised someone to benefit her in some way does not, considered in itself, imply that I have any obligation to benefit that person: my promisee's good carries no greater weight than does the good of any other person. On the other hand, commonsense morality, in contrast with consequentialism, seems to regard the mere fact that a person is my friend or that I made a promise to that person as morally significant. For example, most people do not think that I am justified in breaking a promise merely because slightly more good would result from my breaking the promise than from my keeping the promise. Similarly,most people think that if I have a choice between benefitting a friend or providing an equal benefit to a stranger that I ought to benefit my friend. Consequentialism, in so far as it diverges from commonsense morality on these points, strikes many as an unacceptable moral theory.

Of course, the consequentialist has more than one possible reply to these sorts of worries about her view. First, the consequentialist can argue that, in fact, each person acting so as to benefit her friends, loved ones, promisees, etc., will have the best overall consequences. Promising, for example, is an instrumentally valuable institution, and each of us should do her part to support that institution: one thing that each of us can do is to keep her own promises. Promises also create expectations in their recipients, and the harm of unrealized expectations or hopes needs to be taken into account when we consider whether the breaking of a promise has better consequences than the keeping of a promise. Similarly, each of us ought to take special care of her loved ones, because friendship is a valuable institution. Also, we are well positioned to take care of our loved ones: our efforts are more likely to be efficacious than if we were to attempt to benefit persons distant from us whom we do not know and people often experience greater emotional harm when they are slighted by their intimates than when they are slighted by strangers. As John Stuart Mill remarked in Utilitarianism, “[f]ew hurts which human beings can sustain are greater, and none wound more, than when that on which they habitually and with full assurance relied fails them in the hour of need” (59).

In The Methods of Ethics, Henry Sidgwick appealed to the considerations mentioned in the previous paragraph in an attempt “to show that the commonly received view of special claims and duties arising out of special relations, though prima facie opposed to the impartial universality of the Utilitarian principle, is really maintained by a well-considered application of that principle” (439). Our ‘natural benevolent affections’ guide us to do good toward some small sector of humankind (a small sector composed of our friends, promisees, colleagues, family, etc.), and stifling such natural tendencies would leave only “a very feeble counterpoise to self-love” and thus little from which to develop a more extended and generalized benevolence (434). Also, given the naturalness of certain affections, we come to expect others to act on them, and so pain is caused by deviations from these expectations (439). Thus, consequentialists have for a long time been aware of the apparently counterintuitive implications of their theory with respect to special obligations and been at pains to show that such implications are merely apparent.

This move, however, does not accommodate genuinely special obligations within a consequentialist view. The consequentialist justification for an agent's giving greater attention to the well-being of her intimates is that her doing so will best promote intrinsic value. The reason that each of us has to promote the good of her intimates does not have any weight that counters the weight of our duty to maximize intrinsic value; rather, whatever weight our reason to promote the good of our intimates has, it has derivatively as a means of our fulfilling our fundamental or basic duty to maximize value. Whenever we can maximize value by ignoring our intimates or by breaking a promise, then we, in such circumstances, have no even prima facie reasons to take care of our intimates or to keep our promises. Thus, on this account, the consequentialist secures only derivatively special obligations: reasons to take special care of a select group of people that are derived from a more general duty to care for all persons as such. Each agent has the same fundamental duty or reason to maximize value, but each of us, given our unique causal and epistemic position, ought to perform different actions in order to be fulfilling that fundamental shared duty.

But then, of course, whatever derivative reason an agent has to care for her intimates is determined by the nature of her contingent, empirical circumstances. If I find myself causally and epistemically positioned to do greater good by ignoring my intimates and serving the needs of strangers, then that is what I ought to do, according to the consequentialist. In fact, if I have the choice of providing x units of good to my friend or x+1 units of good to a complete stranger, then, barring any further long-run negative effects on my character, my friendship, or the institution of friendship, I ought to provide the x+1 units of good to the stranger. Commonsense morality, however, as we have seen, regards the fact of my standing in the friendship relation to someone as morally significant in and of itself. In so far as the consequentialist is unable to grant friendship (or promising, etc.) any such independent moral significance, it remains out of step with commonsense understanding of the status of special obligations.

Another move that the consequentialist can make is to claim that each person taking care of her own intimates (or keeping her own promises) is an intrinsically valuable state of affairs. And my taking care of my intimates is an essential part of this intrinsically valuable state of affairs: it is not merely a contingent matter that I, rather than others, am better placed to promote it. Thus, it seems that I have reason to take care of my intimates that no one else has, and I have no similar reason to take care of persons other than my intimates. But this too is only a derivatively special obligation: it is derived from the fundamental duty to maximize value. If I can produce more value by promoting your taking care of your intimates than by taking care of my own, then I ought to do the former rather than the latter. Perhaps your intimate relationships are more valuable than my own, and I could promote more good by devoting myself to helping you to maintain your relationships to family, friends, colleagues, and promisees. In such circumstances, I ought to devote my resources to promoting your devotion to your intimates. My reason to pay special attention to certain persons provides no independent counter-weight to my reason to maximize overall value: I must be, at bottom, impartial, at least in action, as between my own intimate relationships (or my own promises) and anyone else's intimate relationships (or promises).

2. Special Obligations and Agent-Relativity

I have stressed that the alleged difficulties that consequentialism has in accommodating the commonsense understanding of special obligations arise from the fact that the consequentialist can allow only derivatively, not genuinely, special obligations. Another way to express this point is to say that the consequentialist allows only agent-neutral reasons, whereas special obligations, as understood by commonsense, are agent-relative reasons. Derek Parfit understands agent-neutral as opposed to agent-relative reasons in the following way:

Suppose we claim that there is a reason to relieve some person's suffering. This reason is objective if it is a reason for everyone -- for anyone who could relieve this person's suffering. I call such reasons agent-neutral. ... When I call some reason agent-relative, I am not claiming that this reason cannot be a reason for other agents. All that I am claiming is that it may not be (143).
Thomas Nagel explicates the difference between agent-neutral and agent-relative reasons in a slightly different way:
If a reason can be given a general form which does not include an essential reference to the person who has it, it is an agent-neutral reason. For example, if it is a reason for anyone to do or want something that it would reduce the amount of wretchedness in the world, then that is a neutral reason. If on the other hand the general form of a reason does include an essential reference to the person who has it, it is an agent-relative reason. For example, if it is a reason for anyone to do or want something that it would be in his interest, then that is a relative reason. In such a case, if something were in Jones's interest but contrary to Smith's, Jones would have reason to want it to happen and Smith would have the same reason to want it not to happen (152-153).
We can see how, then, special obligations would be understood by Parfit and Nagel as agent-relative reasons: my reason to take care of my friend by giving her encouraging words may not be shared by anyone else (even when in a position which makes it possible for her to do that), and the “form of the reason ... include[s] an essential reference to the person who has it” -- I have reason to give my friend encouraging words. Although some have challenged these ways of differentiating between agent-relative and agent-neutral reasons, the distinction in some form remains a useful way of talking about special obligations as opposed to, say, consequentialist reasons.

Do we have such genuinely agent-relative special obligations? We can see the difficulty in accepting special obligations through another contrast, this one with natural duties as understood by commonsense morality.

3. Special Obligations and Natural Duties

Although commonsense morality seems firmly committed to special obligations, and seems firmly committed to an understanding of such obligations that cannot be accommodated by consequentialism, difficulties remain in trying to provide some grounds for such obligations. We can see these difficulties more clearly if we contrast special obligations with a type of duty recognized by commonsense morality that is not special, i.e. natural duties. Natural duties are “moral requirements which apply to all men [and women] irrespective of status or of acts performed...owed by all persons to all others” (Simmons 1979, 13). It is plausible to suppose that the fundamental or basic justification of why we have natural duties is the intrinsic nature of persons, i.e. the intrinsic nature of those to whom the duties are owed (moral patients). For example, consider my duty to tell the person sitting next to me at a bar that Joe Schmoe slipped poison into her drink. It may seem to be the case that I am morally required to tell only a limited class of people that someone has put poison into their drink, namely, the class consisting of the person sitting next to me right now whose drink is such that I know that it is poisoned. However, the fundamental or basic justification for my having that duty is the nature of the person to whom the duty is owed -- she is rational, or sentient, or [substitute your preferred characterization of a moral patient] -- and her nature is sufficient to ground the duty. My proximity to the person and my knowledge of the poison in her drink facilitate my being able to fulfill my (natural) duty of mutual aid, but it is not a part of the fundamental explanation of why I have such a duty in the first place. So it is the nature of the action, i.e. warning the relevant sort of being of imminent danger, that renders the action morally required. Anyone else in the same causal and epistemic position would similarly have a duty to warn of the poison in the drink. I occupy no peculiar status or role and have performed no prior actions such that if I did not occupy that role or had not performed those actions, I would have no duty to warn of the poison in the drink.

Special obligations, on the other hand, are owed not (necessarily) to all persons, but to some (possibly) limited class of persons,[1] where the fundamental or basic justification for the having of such obligations cannot be the intrinsic nature of the obligee as such (or, at least, not only the intrinsic nature of the obligee: after all, the obligee must have the requisite properties in order to qualify as a moral patient before she can be owed any obligations or duties at all.) After all, those to whom I owe special obligations are not necessarily more worthy or needy (and are certainly not more sentient or rational) than those to whom I do not owe any special obligations. Rather, the relationship between me and my obligee is fundamental to any explanation of my special obligations to that obligee. Consider, for example, my obligation to keep my promise to you to remind you, whenever you start to drink alcohol, that you have given it up for Lent. The fundamental explanation of why I have an obligation to remind you that you have given up alcohol for Lent is not that you have the requisite features to qualify as a moral patient in conjunction with the nature of the action of reminding persons when they have given up alcohol as part of a religious commitment. My relation to you (my status as defined by past action), i.e.that I have made a promise to you, does not simply facilitate my fulfilling some more general duty, but, rather, is part of the basic explanation of why I have the obligation to remind you of your commitment. (There are difficulties with this specification of special obligations as opposed to natural duties. In order to remove the difficulties, one would need to explain why certain contingent features of persons such as causal position are not partly constitutive of ‘status’ or best seen as a result of ‘acts performed.’ In other words, one who intends to attribute to moral agents some type of genuinely special obligation owes an account of what sorts of status or position or what types of acts performed are such that, as a result of being in such a position or having performed such acts, one has obligations that are not derived from some more general obligation that one has to all persons considered as such.[2]).

As I have said, common sense morality seems to regard persons as having certain special obligations, in particular, special obligations to one's friends, one's family, those persons to whom one has made a promise, and one's fellow citizens. As I indicated in the first section, appeal to these special obligations has often been used as a weapon against the consequentialist: persons have special obligations, consequentialism cannot accommodate such obligations, therefore consequentialism is false. As I have said, the consequentialist has attempted to show the ways in which she can justify our acting as though we have special obligations, but must deny that we actually have any non-derivative special obligations. The consequentialist can, at this point, join forces with any moral theorist who accepts natural duties while rejecting special obligations. Consequentialists and defenders of natural duties base the duties that they defend on some intrinsic feature of the state of affairs to be promoted or of the person to whom the duty is owed. They can then press the defender of special obligations to offer some account of the grounds of alleged non-derivative special obligations: why suppose that we have reasons to benefit some persons merely because of some special relationship that we stand in to those persons, our own status or position, or past actions that we have performed?

4. Special Obligations and Voluntarism

Now we can consider how the consequentialist, or anyone who claims that special obligations are not genuinely special but only derivatively so, can turn the burden of proof back upon the defender of special obligations. In what follows, I follow Samuel Scheffler's exposition of what he calls the voluntarist and the distributive objections to any claim that persons have non-derivative special obligations. First, the voluntarist objection arises when we consider the perspective of the person supposed to have special obligations over and above natural duties. Why suppose that I acquire additional moral obligations simply by, for example, being a member of some group or standing in some relationship to another? Why suppose that I am obliged to sacrifice more for another person simply because that person is my intimate or colleague or fellow citizen?

Unlike natural duties, special obligations are grounded on something other than (or, in addition to) the intrinsic nature of the obligee. The voluntarist worries support the view that special obligations can only be acquired through the voluntary actions of the agent whose obligations they are.[3] (It is important to recognize that voluntarism is a thesis about special obligations alone. The question being pressed by the voluntarist concerns obligations over and above those owed to all persons in virtue of their intrinsic nature or those that we have to promote intrinsically valuable states of affairs.) Thus, the voluntarist will grant that special obligations are acquired through promises and contracts, because, in making a promise or contract, the agent voluntarily agrees to bear a certain burden for the person to whom she makes the promise or contract. But other sorts of purported special obligations, in particular those owed to family members or to fellow citizens, would not be acquired through the voluntary actions of the obligor: one does not choose to be born into a certain family or as a citizen of a given country, so why suppose that, simply as a result of luck, either good or bad, I have obligations, over and above my natural duties or my consequentialist duties, to my family members and to my fellow citizens?

Those who accept the voluntarist thesis concerning special obligations take one of several approaches, including the following: (i) they limit special obligations to the straightforwardly contractual or promissory, (ii) they attempt to show that all of the special obligations that they defend really are contractual or promissory in nature, or (iii) they show that while not all special obligations are contractual, they nevertheless are similar in a relevant respect.

Let us begin with option (i). According to this option, in addition to whatever natural duties we have, we have only those further obligations that we have acquired through explicit promises or contracts. (I will not here attempt to offer any sort of analysis of the concepts of a promise or a contract.) The difficulty with this option is that it does little to accommodate the range of special obligations acknowledged by commonsense morality. For example, most of us do not make the sorts of promises that we make to spouses to all of our friends. I have never explicitly promised my best friend to love and care for her. This difficulty is even more apparent in the case of familial relationships. We do not enter into contracts with our parents of the form: take care of me as a child and I will reciprocate when you are older and need care. Nonetheless, it does seem that parents and children owe one another a special degree of concern and commitment. If the defender of special obligations is attempting to accommodate commonsense morality, then she will have done so to a very limited extent if she allows only those special obligations that are acquired through explicit contracts or promises.

So consider (ii), i.e. claiming that while some special obligations may initially appear to be non-contractual in nature, they are really contractual. We can see, for example, Locke's famous appeal to the notion of tacit consent in the political context as an instance of this second strategy. In the Second Treatise of Government, Locke claims that we have special political obligations, i.e. obligations to our own government that we do not have to all governments. He himself, however, imagines someone responding, when he proposes that these special political obligations are contractual in nature, "[t]hat all men being born under government, some or other, it is impossible any of them should ever be free, and at liberty to unite together, and begin a new one, or ever be able to erect a lawful government" (61). In other words, given our situations as being born into particular governments, it certainly doesn't appear that our special obligations to our governments are contractual in nature. Thus, if we accept voluntarism (as Locke clearly did), then it seems that we cannot have special political obligations.

Locke famously appeals to the notion of tacit consent in order to accommodate special political obligations given his voluntarist commitment: "every man, that hath any possessions, or enjoyment, of any part of the dominions of any government, doth thereby give his tacit consent, and is as far forth obliged to obedience to the laws of that government, during such enjoyment, as any one under it (64). We can understand a person as giving tacit or implicit, as opposed to express or explicit, consent, when her consent is expressed via refraining from some action or type of action. As A. John Simmons has argued, either refraining from or performing some action can only be taken as indicative of consent when certain conditions are met: the person must be aware that she is in a situation in which consent is appropriate and/or expected, it must be made clear in some way what must be done or not done in order to give consent, it must be clear when action is to be taken or avoided, and the consent-giving action or failure to act must be possible and not extraordinarily costly. It has been argued that the political context, at least as it is in the modern nation-state, fails to meet any of the above conditions, and so it is implausible, if one accepts voluntarism and the claim that all voluntarily assumed obligations are contractual in nature, to suppose that persons in modern nation-states have special political obligations.

While appeal to tacit consent is most familiar in the context of attempting to ground special political obligations, one could also use this notion in order to ground, for example, special obligations to friends. Again, however, one would have to show that friendship is a context that meets the conditions as described by Simmons, and it seems implausible to suppose that it is. Further, however, some would have a further objection to construing obligations of friendship as contractual: such a model seems to misconstrue the nature of friendship as involving, as Aristotle claimed, concern for the other for the other's own sake. Whether or not one can accommodate obligations of friendship (or obligations of parents to care for their children) as grounded on tacit consent, it seems quite clear that, for example, familial obligations, such as those of children to parents, do not involve anything like a promise or contract, either express or tacit. Again, as with option (i), option (ii) does not go far toward accommodating the range of special obligations recognized by commonsense morality.

The third strategy available to a voluntarist defender of special obligations is to argue that while it is not the case that all special obligations are reducible to contractual obligations, nonetheless, all special obligations share the feature of voluntary assumption with contractual obligations. All special obligations, according to this account, are forms of voluntary commitments undertaken by the individual moral agent. While not all actions that constitute the undertaking of a commitment mimic those involved in the making of a promise or contract, they are all such that the agent can choose whether or not to perform them. Also, while promises and contracts are temporally discrete events, a commitment may be undertaken via a temporally extended series of events, each of which, in and of itself, has no moral significance: it is only the series taken as a whole that generates or grounds special obligations. While this strategy has the virtue of being able to accommodate obligations of friendship without distorting the nature of friendship, it, like the previous voluntarist options, holds out little hope of accommodating political or familial special obligations. At this point, the voluntarist is faced with a choice: either reject her initial commitment to voluntarism regarding special obligations or reject the commonsense claim about the extensive range of special obligations that we have.

Some have been dissatisfied with the seeming limitations placed on the extent of our special obligations by the voluntarist thesis. (Again, I am here discussing voluntarism with respect to special obligations alone. Voluntarism with respect to all of our duties would seriously delimit our moral responsibilities, and so, for that reason, is held by virtually no one.) Common sense morality, after all, seems to endorse a host of obligations derived from persons's roles or positions, even when these roles or positions are not occupied as the result of any voluntary choice on the part of the moral agent. Each of us occupies various roles; for example, I am my mother's daughter, my brother's sister, a university professor, a U.S. citizen, a resident of Iowa, etc. Some people occupy positions in religious communities as, e.g., Jews or Catholics or Hindus, some are members of armed forces, some belong to clubs, sports teams, etc. Our understandings of what it is to occupy a certain role often involves certain normative assumptions about the person's obligations in virtue of occupying that role. So, for example, in virtue of being an Orthodox Jew, Joe Schmoe is obligated not to eat pork, in virtue of being a philosophy professor, I am obligated to provide assistance to my students, and in virtue of being my mother's daughter, I am obligated to care for her when she is elderly. So role obligations, i.e. obligations that we have in virtue of occupying some role (whether or not voluntarily assumed), appear to be special obligations: they are usually owed to some limited class of persons and one acquires them through some actions of one's own or in virtue of one's status, not as a result of intrinsic features of the obligee or of the state of affairs to be promoted.

But, of course, we always need to distinguish between moral and non-moral (or reason-giving and non-reason-giving) obligations of role (or position). It is true that our very understanding of certain roles seems to involve the having of certain obligations, duties, or responsibilities. To be a daughter, for example, involves certain care-taking responsibilities toward parents, just as being a professor of philosophy involves obligations to students, colleagues, and the profession more generally. But, analogously, being the commandant of a concentration camp in Nazi Germany seemed to involve certain obligations of role, including using slave labor as productively as possible and killing as many Jews as possible on a daily basis. Also, Orthodox Jewish women have certain role obligations to be submissive to their husbands and to refrain from certain forms of work, study, and participation in religious observance. However, the sense in which a commandant of a camp has obligations of role does not seem to be a moral or reason-giving sense, and it is at least an open question as to whether Orthodox Jewish women have obligations to be submissive to the male members of their community. Such language of obligations of roles seems to involve merely others' expectations of persons holding such positions. Why, a voluntarist (or anyone else, for that matter) will ask, should we suppose that such expectations are sufficient for the having of obligations in the reason-giving or moral sense?

Anti-voluntarists have taken at least five different routes to responding to this voluntarist worry about the normative status of obligations of role or position (the names that I here use are not necessarily used by those who take one or the other of these options): (i) the ‘true community’ view, (ii) the ‘reflective acceptance’ view, (iii) the ‘justice view’, (iv) the appeal to value, and (v) the ‘constitutive commitment’ view. In assessing these various options, we need to keep in mind the range of roles that people can occupy, ranging from being the parent of or being a university professor to being the commandant of a concentration camp or the member of a terrorist organization. If roles or positions generate moral or reason-giving obligations, we need some conception of roles that does not yield the implausible implication that Nazis had moral obligations to herd Jews into gas chambers. Further, we need some conception of a role or position that does not reduce all obligations to obligations of role or position. If natural duties are not to be rendered obligations of role or position, we need to be told why being a moral agent is not a role, but being an American is. In other words, what descriptions of a person constitute statements of that person's obligation-generating roles and which do not? Why is the fact that I am my mother's daughter constitutive of a role that I occupy whereas being a human being or being a person born in the latter half of May on the cusp of Taurus and Gemini is not?

Let us begin with (i) as advocated by Ronald Dworkin. Dworkin uses the term ‘associative [or, communal] obligations’ to refer to what have been called obligations of role. By ‘associative obligations’ Dworkin means "the special responsibilities social practice attaches to membership in some biological or social group, like the responsibilities of family or friends or neighbors" (196). Because his understanding of these obligations is not such as to require ‘choice or consent,’ Dworkin thinks that we can construe special political obligations as associative obligations.

However, according to Dworkin, only in a true community do members have associative obligations toward one another. Whereas a bare community is one that "meets the genetic or geographical or other historical conditions identified by social practice as capable of constituting a fraternal community," the members of a true community meet the following four conditions (201):

First, they must regard the group's obligations as special, holding distinctly within the group, rather than as general duties its members owe equally to persons outside it. Second, they must accept that these responsibilities are personal: that they run directly from each member to each other member, not just to the group as a whole in some collective sense. ... Third, members must see these responsibilities as flowing from a more general responsibility each has of concern for the well-being of others in the group ... Fourth, members must suppose that the group's practices show not only concern but an equal concern for all members. (199-200)

Thus, on Dworkin's account, mere social expectation is not sufficient to create associative obligations: persons must meet certain psychological requirements in order for their group, be it a friendship, a family, or a nation-state, to be the sort of community such that membership in that community, independent of choice or consent, grounds associative obligations.

Returning to the issues that I raised about role positions, we can notice that a community could satisfy Dworkin's requirements for being a true community and yet be such that we might not want to regard its members as having special moral obligations to one another. Consider a white supremacist organization: it might very well meet all of the criteria that Dworkin lays out as both necessary and sufficient for a community's being a true community. But is it really the case that members of white supremacist organizations have special moral obligations in virtue of being a member of, e.g., Aryan Nation? One response is that in fact they do have prima facie special obligations of role to one another, but that, given the hideous nature of the aims of Aryan Nation, those obligations are never their all-things-considered duties, i.e. their obligations of role are always outweighed by their natural duties or duties of justice. But the question then remains: why do white supremacists have special, additional moral obligations toward one another simply in virtue of their having a joint commitment to the immoral treatment of blacks and Jews?

So let us consider approach (ii), the reflective acceptance view, as advocated by Michael Hardimon in his "Role Obligations." Hardimon aims to offer an account of obligations attached to certain institutionally defined roles, namely "political, familial, and occupational roles" (334), where a role is a "[constellation] of institutionally specified rights and duties organized around an institutionally specified social function" (334). A role obligation, according to Hardimon, is "a moral requirement, which attaches to an institutional role, whose content is fixed by the function of the role, and whose normative force flows from the role" (334). Some role obligations attach to unchosen social roles, but only to social roles that are reflectively acceptable:

To say that a social role is reflectively acceptable is to say that one would accept it upon reflection. Determining whether a given social role is reflectively acceptable involves stepping back from that role in thought and asking whether it is a role people ought to occupy and play. Determining that a given social role is reflectively acceptable involves judging that it is (in some sense) meaningful, rational, or good. (348)

Thus, on Hardimon's account, it is hypothetical rather than actual consent that grounds unchosen special obligations. (Some have interpreted Locke as in fact appealing to hypothetical rather than to actual consent. It is important to see that hypothetical consent is not really consent, and so a view such as Hardimon's is not a voluntarist view, as Hardimon himself readily acknowledges.)

The obvious question for Hardimon's view is why we need to appeal to the notion of reflective acceptance at all. It seems that what Hardimon is really appealing to as a necessary condition of a role's generating obligations is that's role being ‘meaningful, rational, or good’. As we saw, a difficulty with (i), the true community view, is that it leaves open the possibility that occupying a role in an unjust community still generates obligations. Hardimon is clearly worried about this issue and so makes appeal to what one would judge good or just if one were to make such a judgment (and, I take it, judge correctly). But then the hypothetical judgment is really epiphenomenal with respect to the justification and we are left with (iii), the justice view: one has obligations in virtue of occupying a role if and only if one's filling that role and the institution in which one would be filling that role meet certain conditions of morality or justice.

Is this justice or morality condition, however, sufficient? Suppose that all of my neighbors organize the “West Side Reading Group,” which will meet once a month at the local coffee house to discuss edifying books, articles, etc. Members of the group are obligated to attend a certain number of meetings a year, participate in discussions, and recommend books or articles to other members of the group. Everyone who lives in a certain sector of the west side of town is a member of the group. Given that I live in that part of the west side of town, I am thereby a member of the group. Do I have obligations to attend meetings, etc.? The group appears to be just and to have good ends. Given that I am well-read, it would be good if I were to contribute to the group, and my participating would certainly not be unjust or immoral. But why suppose that I have special obligations to other members of the reading group simply because those others have decided to describe me in a certain way, even if their group is a good group with just and worthy goals in which I could participate without violating any requirements of justice or morality?

A similar difficulty plagues (iv), the appeal to value, as defended by Samuel Scheffler in his "Relationships and Responsibilities." Scheffler argues that relationships give rise to special obligations only when persons have reason to value the relationships. Scheffler's argument has the following form:

(1) We have good reason to value (noninstrumentally) certain relationships with other persons.

(2) To value (noninstrumentally) relationships with others is, in part, to see those relationships as a source of reasons, that is, as a source of special obligations.

(3) Therefore, we have good reason to see ourselves as having special obligations.

Scheffler's claim is that the very act of valuing certain types of relationships involves seeing ourselves as having special obligations. If we have reason to value the relationship, then we have reason to understand ourselves as having special obligations, regardless of whether we have chosen to enter or to maintain the relationship. The plausibility of Scheffler's view depends, to a large extent, upon what counts as a relationship in this context. Do I stand in the relevant sort of relationship to other members of the West Side Reading Group? As I said above, it seems that I have reason to value being a member of the group in so far as my being in the group would promote my well-being and the well-being of the other members. So, according to Scheffler, I have reason to see myself as having special obligations to other members of the group. But it hardly seems that I am not fulfilling obligations when I fail to go to meetings.

The final view that I will consider, Michael Sandel's antivoluntarism, is motivated by dissatisfaction with Western liberal political theory as exemplified by, for example, Locke and John Rawls. Sandel claims that adherence to voluntarism is inconsistent with the nature of the person. Sandel advocates (v), the claim that certain roles that we find ourselves in, understood as involving special obligations, are ‘constitutive commitments.’ The person is not free to make all of her own commitments, because the self cannot be understood separately from certain commitments, such as those arising from family or political community. Sandel is objecting to what he takes to be the standard, liberal picture of the self: free to choose her own ends and only having those special obligations that result from her voluntary choices.

The plausibility of Sandel's version of anti-voluntarism depends, of course, upon the plausibility of the claim that persons are partially constituted by their relationships to other persons or groups of persons. In order to assess the plausibility of that claim, we need to disambiguate two possible readings of it, a causal reading and a metaphysical reading. The first, causal reading of the claim is obviously true: persons are the sort of persons that they are as a result of their causal interactions with other persons and groups of persons. Nobody would deny this causal reading of Sandel's claim, but it is not at all clear how it would support any normative conclusions. After all, other persons can have negative as well as positive effects on my character and personality. Why suppose that I have special obligations as a result of interactions over which I might have no control?

The second, metaphysical reading of Sandel's claim needs more defense. According to Sandel, certain of my relationships to other persons are partly constitutive of the person that I am. According to the metaphysical reading of that claim, I would not be the same person that I now am if, for example, I had not been born in the U.S. In other words, I am necessarily an American. At best, such a claim is controversial, at worst, obviously false. After all, I certainly seem to be able to conceive of myself as having been born in France, having been born an Orthodox Jew, or being born an only child instead of having a brother as I do. So before we can even ask whether a ‘constitutive commitment’ would have normative implications, we need to be told quite a bit more as to why we should view ourselves as being partly constituted by the relationships in which we happen to stand to other people. On either reading of Sandel's claim, the constitutive commitments view faces all of the difficulties inherent in any form of relativism: if I am born in a sexist culture, for example, why suppose that I thereby have obligations to obey the men in my life? A view such as Sandel's seems to make it the case that I am morally obligated as a result of the social structures into which I am born, no matter how morally repugnant those social structures might be. It is this sort of worry that gives even greater credence to the voluntarist thesis with respect to special obligations.

5. Special Obligations and the Distributive Objection

Finally, let us return to the second of the objections to special obligations, what Scheffler calls ‘the distributive objection.’ Special obligations are owed to those that we can think of as ‘insiders’: those to whom promises have been made, members of a given family, citizens of a certain nation, etc. If I owe more to my intimates, then, it seems, I am justified in doing more for them than for other persons, even if the latter are more needy than my intimates. This sort of worry is, of course, in part what motivates a consequentialist theory: no person's well-being is more valuable than that of any other person, and so we are unjustified in failing to be impartial between intimates and strangers. Whereas there may be good consequentialist reasons for acting as though we have special obligations, as we have seen, the consequentialist (and any other defender of the distributive objection) will insist that a commitment to genuinely special obligations gives weight to morally insignificant contingent features of persons.

The distributive objection is troubling: it forces us to find some justification for that feature of common sense morality that C. D. Broad called ‘self-referential altruism,’ the view that each of us has special obligations to her family, her friends, her fellow citizens, etc. Defenders of special obligations need to show why our pre-theoretical commitment to such obligations is more than merely a reflection of our constitution as, in Hume's terms, ‘limited altruists.’ Advocates of evolutionary ethics will suggest that, given that we can offer a story about why beliefs to the effect that we owe more to certain persons than to others have survival advantage, we have reason to discount the claim that we have genuine special obligations. It has been claimed that we are hard-wired to promote the continuance of our genetic inheritance. Doing what we need to do to protect genetically related persons (and others willing to protect such persons), then, is evolutionarily advantageous. Thus, acting as though and believing that we have special obligations (at least to friends and family members) is advantageous.

Of course, there are difficulties with appeal to an evolutionary account of the source of our beliefs about our obligations. All that such an appeal does is to propose a causal hypothesis about the genesis of our beliefs. Even if that causal hypothesis is true, it does not show that the belief that we have special obligations is false. People often acquire true beliefs as a result of mechanisms that do not provide any evidence or justification for the belief. For all that we know, our acceptance of modus ponens as an inferential rule might be due to the selective advantage accruing to those who use that rule, but, I take it, few would see that as undermining the validity of that rule of inference.

Leaving aside any such evolutionary considerations, however, still leaves us with the fact that the intuitive pull of special obligations competes with the intuitive pull of the consequentialist stance. In order to avoid the latter and to respond to charges of parochialism, the defender of special obligations needs to deal with the distributive objection.

One potential response is to insist that upon acquiring special obligations, a moral agent does not owe less to other persons, but, rather, simply owes more to her intimates. Thus, in addition to our duty of benevolence, we have, as Ross claimed, special obligations to those who “stand to me in the relation of promisee to promiser, of creditor to debtor, of wife to husband, of child to parent, of friend to friend, of fellow countryman to fellow countryman, and the like” (19). The more such relationships that I stand in, the more obligations I acquire. Unless my duty of benevolence is a maximizing duty, there is no reason to suppose that I cannot balance that duty with my special obligations. Of course, even if my obligations to ‘outsiders’ have not decreased, it is still true that ‘insiders’ will be benefitted more than ‘outsiders,’ and that might still be worrisome. However, given that ‘insiders’ also have to bear the cost of benefitting other ‘insiders,’ the relative balance of costs and benefits might remain the same for insiders and outsiders. But, the defender of special obligations might say, as long as I benefit everyone to the extent to which I owe them benefits, why is the relative balance of costs and benefits relevant? Only on the most radical of egalitarian views is the equalizing of that balance considered an end in itself of morality.

In any case, this reply to the distributive objection depends upon the claim that we can balance our special obligations against our natural or consequentialist duties. According to most defenders of special obligations, such obligations are prima facie obligations, i.e. they are obligations with a certain weight that can be counterbalanced by the weight of other special obligations or of other types of obligations. In order to figure out what our all-things-considered duty is, we need to weigh all of our reasons for action and decide which is the strongest or weightiest in the circumstances. One advantage of a theory such as consequentialism is that, given that it regards all of our obligations or duties as derivative from one fundamental duty (the duty to maximize value), we do not need to try to determine which of our duties is strongest in any given instance. Once we allow non-derivative, genuinely special obligations in our moral theory, we are left with the question as to whether we can ever know when a special obligation outweighs another special obligation or a natural duty. Moral philosophers such as Ross give us no answer to this question, and it is plausible to suppose that there is no general rule that we can use for weighing duties against one another. Perhaps the best answer is that, once we know what our obligations are, it is self-evident as to which is the strongest, always remembering that ‘self-evident’ does not mean ‘obvious,’ but, rather, ‘can be known or justifiably believed without any process of reasoning or inference.’ At this point, we are involved in controversies in moral epistemology that are beyond the scope of this piece.

6. The Grounds of Special Obligations

So far I have set up some contrasts between special obligations and both consequentialist duties and natural duties, and have also discussed two objections to special obligations, the voluntarist objection and the distributive objection. In discussing responses to the voluntarist objection, I discussed some accounts of the grounds of special obligations. But there are some other important accounts that deserve mention. Given the number of types of special obligations that commonsense recognizes, presenting the various accounts that have been offered of their grounds would be a book-length task. So my discussion of the grounds of special obligations should not be taken as in any way exhaustive.

As I indicated above, voluntarists have often tried to assimilate all special obligations to promissory or contractual obligations. Even if such an assimilation were to be successful, we would still need an account of the basis of promissory obligations. Some have attempted to ground obligations to keep promises on the fact that when one makes a promise, one raises expectations in the one to whom the promise has been made. The promisee, then, has a right to have her expectations met, given the promisor's voluntary raising of her expectations. If you voluntarily lead me to expect that you will perform a given action, then I am likely to make plans on the basis of that expectation. You are obligated not to upset the plans that I have made on the basis of your voluntary actions that you knew would raise my expectations. This account of the basis of promissory obligations has been extended into other contexts, including those of friendship and the family (see especially Hoff Sommers' account of filial obligations). Our friends and family members come to rely upon us to act in certain ways with respect to them, and their reliance is due to our own voluntary past actions. Thus, as with our promisees, our friends and family members have a right not to be disappointed in their expectations, a right correlated with a duty on our part to meet their expectations.

One serious difficulty with this sort of grounding of special obligations is that it appeals to the psychological states of those to whom the obligations are owed. But consider a case in which the person to whom a promise is made does not expect the one making the promise to comply (Scanlon calls this the case of the Profligate Pal). If such expectations are not raised, are no obligations created? Parents often have little expectation that their children will care for them when they are elderly, but that does not seem sufficient to defeat the claim that children do in fact have special obligations to care for their parents. The defender of the expectations account could try appealing to legitimate even if only hypothetical expectations at this point, but we are still left wondering why I ought to meet expectations that have never actually been raised.

With respect to friendship, one could offer what I will call an ‘Aristotelian’ account of special obligations. Jennifer Whiting, for example, argues that we ought to take special care of our friends if and only if they are worthy of such concern. Thus, if I have a virtuous friend, I am required to care for her because her character renders her deserving and a suitable object of such concern. The obvious worry about any such Aristotelian account is its distance from commonsense. According to the Aristotelian account, I have special obligations to friends and family if and only if they are deserving of special concern. But commonsense allows that I have special obligations to friends and family members even if they are not particularly or especially virtuous. It seems that I have special obligations to help my intimates be virtuous, even if they are not yet virtuous. The Aristotelian cannot accommodate these sorts of claims.

Some defenders of special obligations have tried to draw upon claims about personal identity to support their views (see especially David Brink). If defenders of what is known as psychological reductionism are right, then me now is co-personal with me later as a result of the psychological relationship existing between me now and me later. Me later bears many psychological connections (either direct or indirect) to me now, and those connections form a causal chain from me now to me later. But these connections can also exist in the interpersonal case, e.g., I can share traits with my friends and this sharing of traits may be due to the interaction between us. If the relation of ‘identity’ between me now and me later supports reasons of prudence, we might suppose that the similar relation in the interpersonal case supports reasons of special obligation. Of course, this account requires far more development. Why suppose that we do in fact have reasons of prudence? Why suppose that similarity of relation grounds similarity of reasons? These questions need to be answered before any appeal to the metaphysics of personal identity can be used to ground special obligations.

I will mention one last account of the grounds of special obligations. The difficulties with the consequentialist account of special obligations arise from its only granting instrumental significance to special relationships, i.e. special relationships provide unique opportunities for promoting intrinsic value. But commonsense seems to accord moral significance to special relationships considered for their own sake, not in virtue of the opportunities that they afford. One could then argue that reasons of special obligation supervene upon relationships between friends, between promisor and promisee, etc. So there is no deeper account of special obligations: truths about reasons and the relationships upon which they supervene are self-evident. This was the intuitionist line adopted by W. D. Ross. Defense of this account of the grounds of special obligation requires meeting objections to an intuitionist moral epistemology, which, as a version of foundationalism, is a frequent target of attack in recent philosophical work.

7. Conclusion

We have seen that the issue as to whether we have special obligations is key to some of the central issues in contemporary ethics, including the viability of consequentialism (in all of its varieties) as a moral theory, the possibility and nature of agent-relative reasons, the relationship between voluntary action or association and the acquisition of duties or responsibilities, and the nature of self, family, friendship, and political community. In attempting to ground special obligations, the defender of special obligations must face issues about the role of the metaphysics of personal identity in determining features of morality and questions in moral epistemology, among other issues. Thus, the topic of special obligations is central to debates in both normative and meta- ethics.


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consequentialism | contracts, theories of | justice | morality and practical reason | personal identity | political obligation | value: intrinsic vs. extrinsic