Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Relativism

The Cognitive Construction of Reality

On the face of it the doctrine that reality is socially constructed seems so odd that it may be worth documenting the claim that people have said things that strongly suggest it. This may be less necessary now, when talk of social construction has become so common, but there are hints on reality relativism in many earlier writers as well.

1. Construction

The American field linguistic Edward Sapir says

The fact of the matter is that the ‘real world’ is to a large extent unconsciously built up on the language habits of the group. No two languages are ever sufficiently similar to be considered as representing the same social reality. The worlds in which different societies live are distinct worlds, not merely the same worlds with different labels attached (1929, p. 209).
Karl Mannheim speaks of:
…the world as “world” exists only with reference to the knowing mind, and the mental activity of the subject determines the form in which it appears. …This is the first state stage in the dissolution of an ontological dogmatism which regarded the “world” as existing independently of us, in a fixed and definitive form (1929/1936, p. 66).
Here is the American philosopher C. I. Lewis
The world of experience is not given in experience: it is constructed by thought from the data of sense (1929, p. 29).
And the German philosopher Ernst Cassirer:
The beginning of thought and speech is not this: we do not simply seize on and name certain distinctions that are somewhere present in feeling or intuition; on the contrary, on our own initiative we draw certain dividing lines, effect certain separations and connections, by virtue of which distinct individual configurations emerge from the uniform flux of consciousness (1923/1955, p. 280).
R. G. Collingwood:
…any system of classification or division, whether the things classified or divided are colors or things that happen of themselves, is a system not ‘discovered’ but ‘devised’ by thought. The act of thought by which it is laid down is not proposition but supposition (1940, p. 196).
…the formulation in terms of ‘comparison’, in speaking of ‘facts’ or ‘realities’, easily tempts one into the absolutistic view according to which we are said to search for an absolute reality whose nature is assumed as fixed independently of the language chosen for its description. The answer to a question concerning reality however depends not only up that “reality” or upon the facts, but also up on the structure (and the set of concepts) of the language used for the description (1949, p. 126).
Peter Winch:
What is real and what is unreal shows itself in the sense that language has. …it is within the religious use of language that the conception of God's reality has its place’ (1970, p. 81-82)
Stuart Hampshire:
We can set no theoretical limit to the number of different ways reality could be divided into recurrent elements and the purposes of thought and action (1959, pp. 39-40).

We acquire in infancy the principles of individuation that now seem natural to us [and] we gradually come to single out other types of persisting things in our experience; and our experience is always itself being modified by the conceptual framework at all times imposed on it. At any time after infancy we are looking at a world already divided for us into persisting things of many different types, and with our attention already fixed upon a particular range of resemblance (1959, pp. 39-40).

And Kuhn:
There is, I think, no theory independent way to reconstruct phrases like ‘really there’; the notion of a match between the ontology of a theory and its ‘real’ counterpart in nature now seems to be illusive in principle (1970b, p. 206).
Here is a recent, very distinguished philosopher, Hilary Putnam:
‘Objects’ do not exist independently of conceptual schemes. We cut up the world into objects when we introduce one or another scheme of description (1981, p. 52).

If, as I maintain, ‘objects’ themselves are as much made as discovered, as much products of our conceptual invention as of the ‘objective’ factor in experience, the factor independent of our will, then of course objects intrinsically belong under certain labels because those labels are just the tools we use to construct a version of the world with such objects in the first place [Putnam, 1981, p. 54, italics his].

And one can find similar passages throughout the works of Nelson Goodman, and his “ways of world making.”
…the structure of the world of presystematic language is simply a world-structure under one world-description and not the structure of the world independent of any description; and the correspondence asked for relates two world-descriptions rather than a description to such a world-in-itself.

Occasionally the objection is raised that to speak of descriptions of the world implies that there is such a thing as the world. One might as well point to pictures of Don Quixote to prove that there is one and only one such person. “Picture of Don Quixote” and “description of the world” are one-place predicates and are better replaced by “Don-Quixote-picture” and “world-description” …. Rather than there being one and only one Don Quixote, there is none; rather than there being one and only one world, there may be many. This does not mean that all world-descriptions are equally true; but it does raise the question what distinguishes true from false ones (1972, pp. 3-4).

2. Different Worlds

Some authors make related points by saying that people with very different concepts and beliefs live in “different worlds.” Thus the anthropologist John Beattie notes that while in one sense members of quite different cultures inhabit the same world, “in another and important sense they inhabit very different ones” (1966, p. 75). Speaking of thinkers of earlier times C. I. Lewis says

Quite literally, men of those days lived in a different world because their instruments of intellectual interpretation were so different [1929, p. 253].
Michael Polanyi tells us that the switch to a radically new scientific view
…produces disciples forming a school, the members of which are separated for the time being by a logical gap from those outside it. They think differently, speak a different language, live in a different world, … [Polanyi, 1958, p 151].
Many writers want to speak of different worlds in a robust, but not quite literal way, and they often struggle to find just the right metaphor. As Kuhn puts it:
In a sense that I am unable to explicate further, the proponents of competing paradigms practice their trades in different worlds. …Practicing in different worlds, the two groups of scientists see different things when the look from the same direction (1970b, p. 150).

Return to Relativism: §1: A Framework for Relativism
Return to Relativism: §2: Dependent Variables: What is Relative?
Return to Relativism: §3: Independent Variables: Relative to What?
Return to Relativism: §4: Arguments For Relativism
Return to Relativism: §5: Arguments Against Relativism
Return to Relativism: Table of Contents