Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Defeasible Reasoning

Models of Higher-Order Probability

A model of higher-order probability consists of W, a set of possible worlds, together with a function that assigns to each world w a probability function μw. Let's assume that these probability functions are non-standard, that is, they may assign infinitesimal probabilities to some sets of worlds. Let [W] be the partition of W in terms of probabilistic agreement: worlds w and w' belong to the same cell of [W] just in case they are assigned exactly the same probability function.

Let A be a subset of [W]. The set-theoretic union of A, bigcupA, is a proposition expressible entirely in terms of probabilities (that is, entirely in terms of Boolean combinations of ⇒ conditionals). In the finite case, Miller's principle states that, for all worlds w and all propositions B and C:

μw(C / BbigcupA) = Σw' ∈ bigcupA μw'(C / B) × μw({w})

The logic of extreme higher-order probabilities consists of Lewis's VC conditional logic, minus Strong Centering, and plus the following two axiom schemata, which I call Skyrms's axioms (Koons 2000, Appendix B):

(p ⇒ (qr)) ↔ ((p & q) ⇒ r)

[(p ⇒ ¬(qr)) & ¬((p & q) ⇒ ⊥)] ↔ ¬((p & q) ⇒ r)

In both cases, “p” must be a Boolean combination of ⇒-conditionals. The variables “q” and “r” may be replaced by any two formulas. The formula ¬((p & q) ⇒ ⊥) expresses the joint possibility of p and q (in the sense that they don't defeasibly imply a logical absurdity, ⊥).