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Measurement in Quantum Theory

First published Tue Oct 12, 1999; substantive revision Fri Oct 29, 1999

From the inception of Quantum Mechanics (QM) the concept of measurement has proved a source of difficulty. The Einstein-Bohr debates, out of which both the Einstein Podolski Rosen paradox and Schrödinger's cat paradox developed, centered upon this difficulty. The problem of measurement in quantum mechanics arises out of the fact that several principles of the theory appear to be in conflict. In particular, the dynamic principles of quantum mechanics seem to be in conflict with the postulate of collapse. David Albert puts the problem nicely when he says:

The dynamics and the postulate of collapse are flatly in contradiction with one another ... the postulate of collapse seems to be right about what happens when we make measurements, and the dynamics seems to be bizarrely wrong about what happens when we make measurements, and yet the dynamics seems to be right about what happens whenever we aren't making measurements. (Albert 1992, 79)
This has come to be known as "the measurement problem" and in what follows, we study the details and examine some of the implications of this problem.

The measurement problem is not just an interpretational problem internal to QM. It raises broader issues as well, such more general philosophical debates between, on the one hand, Cartesian and Lockean accounts of observation as the creation of "inner reflections" and, on the other, neo-Kantean conceptions of observation as a quasi-externalized physiological process. In this article I trace the history of these debates, and indicate some of the interpretative strategies that they stimulated.

The Birth of the Measurement Problem

The measurement problem in QM (Quantum Mechanics) grew out of early debates over Niels Bohr's "Copenhagen interpretation". Bohr maintained that the physical properties of quantum systems depend in a fundamental way upon experimental conditions, including conditions of measurement. This doctrine appeared explicitly in Bohr's 1935 reply to Einstein, Podolski, and Rosen: "The procedure of measurement has an essential influence on the conditions on which the very definition of the physical quantities in question rests" (Bohr 1935, 1025; see too Bohr 1929). To be specific, Bohr endorsed the following principle:
(P) If a quantity Q is measured in system S at time t then Q has a particular value in S at t.[1]

But, instead of taking the dependence of properties upon experimental conditions to be causal in nature, he proposed an analogy with the dependence of relations of simultaneity upon frames of reference postulated by special relativity theory: "The theory of relativity reminds us of the subjective [observer dependent] character of all physical phenomena, a character which depends essentially upon the state of motion of the observer" (Bohr 1929, 73). In general terms, then, Bohr proposed that, like temporal relations in special relativity, properties in QM exhibit a hidden relationalism - "hidden", that is, from a classical, Newtonian point of view. Paul Feyerabend gave a clear exposition of this Bohrian position in his "Problems of Microphysics" essay (Feyerabend, 1962). It can also be found in earlier commentaries upon Bohr by Vladimir Fock and Philip Frank (Jammer 1974, section 6.5).

Many of Bohr's colleagues, including his young protege Werner Heisenberg, misunderstood or rejected the relationalist metaphysics underpinning Bohr's endorsement of (P). Instead, they favored the positivistic, anti-metaphysical approach expressed in Heisenberg's influential book, The Physical Principles of the Quantum Theory (Heisenberg 1930): "It seems necessary to demand that no concept enter a theory which has not been experimentally verified at least to the same degree of accuracy as the experiments to be explained by the theory" (1).[2] On this view, (P) may be strengthened to the principle (P):

(P) It is meaningless to assign Q a value q for S at t unless Q is measured to have value q for S at t.

Heisenberg's approach, as presented in The Physical Principles of the Quantum Theory, quickly became a popular way of reading (or misreading, as Bohr would claim) the philosophically more forbidding complexities of the Copenhagen interpretation. As Max Jammer points out: "It would be difficult to find a textbook of the period [1930-1950] which denied that the numerical value of a physical quantity has no meaning whatsoever until an observation has been performed" (Jammer 1974, 246).

Bohr disagreed with Heisenberg's extreme positivistic gloss of the Copenhagen interpretation that reduced questions of "definability to measurability" (Jammer 1974, 69). The disagreement was no casual matter. Heisenberg reports a discussion that arose while preparing his 1927 Zeitschrift für Physik paper in the following terms: "I remember that it ended with my breaking out in tears because I just couldn't stand this pressure from Bohr" (Jammer 1974, 65). Nevertheless, the two men agreed in broad terms that ways of describing quantum systems depended upon experimental conditions. This agreement was sufficient to create at least the appearance of a unified Copenhagen position.[3]

The assumptions that framed the Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation were, in turn, rejected by Albert Einstein (Jammer 1974, chap.5; see too Bohr 1949). Einstein's disagreement with the Copenhagen school came to a head in the famous exchange with Bohr at the fifth Solvay conference (1927) and in the no less famous Einstein, Podolski, Rosen paper of 1935. Arguing from what might be called a "realist" position, Einstein contended that under ideal conditions observations (and measurements more generally) function like "mirrors" (or, as Crary argues, camera obscura) reflecting an independently existing reality (Crary 1995, 48). In particular, in the Einstein, Podolski, Rosen paper, we find the following criterion for the existence of physical reality: "If without in any way disturbing a system we can predict with certainty...the value of a physical quantity, then there exists an element of physical reality corresponding to this physical quantity" (Einstein et al 1935, 778). This criterion characterizes physical reality in terms of objectivity, meaning its independence from any direct measurement. By implication, then, when a direct measurement of physical reality occurs it merely passively reflects rather than actively constituting that which is observed.

Einstein's position has roots in Cartesian as well as empiricist, and specifically Lockean, notions of perception. This realist position opposes the Kantian metaphor of the "veil of perception" that pictures the apparatus of observation as like a pair of spectacles through which a highly mediated sight of the world can be glimpsed. To be specific, according to Kant, rather than simply reflecting an independently existing reality, "appearances" are constituted through the act of perception in a way that conforms them to the fundamental categories of sensible intuition. As Kant made the point in the Transcendental Aesthetic: "Not only are the drops of rain mere appearances, but...even their round shape, and even the space in which they fall, are nothing in themselves, but merely modifications of fundamental forms of our sensible intuition, and...the transcendental object remains unknown to us" (Kant 1973, 85).

By contrast, the realism that I am associating with Einstein takes the point of view that, insofar as they are real, when we observe rain drops under ideal conditions we are seeing objects "in themselves", that is, as they exist independently of being perceived. In other words, not only do the rain drops exist independently of our observations but also, in observing them, what we see reflects how they really are. In William Blake's succinct formulation, "As the eye [sees], such the object [is]" (Crary 1995, 70). According to this "realist" point of view, ideal observations not only reflect the way things are during but also immediately before and after observation.[4]

Such realism was opposed by both Bohr and Heisenberg.[5] Bohr took a position that, by taking acts of observation and measurement more generally as constitutive of phenomena, aligned him more closely with a Kantian point of view. To be specific, Bohr took it that "measurement has an essential [by which I take him to mean constitutive] influence on the conditions on which the very definition of the physical quantities in question rests" (Bohr 1935, 1025).

As Henry Folse points out, however, it is misleading to take the parallel between Bohr and Kant too far (Folse 1985, 49 and 217-221). Bohr strongly opposed the Kantian position that "space and time as well as cause and effect had to be taken as a priori categories for the comprehension of all knowledge" (Folse 1985, 218). This opposition between Bohr and Kant reflected a deeper division. Whereas for Kant "concepts played their role prior to experience and give form to what is experienced" (Folse, 220), for Bohr it was the other way around, that is, objective reality, in particular conditions of observation, determine the applicability of concepts. Thus, although for Bohr no less than for Kant, observation took on a role in determining the forms that structure the world of visible objects, the two men conceived the way in which that role is discharged quite differently. For Kant subjective experience was structured in terms of certain prior forms, whereas Bohr argued for a hidden relationalism in the domain of appearances, contending that the properties in terms of which a system is described are relative to the conditions of measurement.

This difference between Bohr and Kant may be seen as an aspect, indeed radicalization, of a more general shift in nineteenth century conceptions of vision, exemplified in Johannes Müller's compendious summary of current physiology, Handbuch der Physiologie des Menschen (1833). Müller (a mentor of the influential physicist Hermann von Helmholtz) may be seen as physiologizing the Kantian conception of observation. As Jonathon Crary makes the point:

His [Müller's] work, in spite of his praise of Kant, implies something quite different. Far from being apodictic or universal in nature, like the ‘spectacles’ of time and space, our physiological apparatus is again and again shown to be defective, inconsistent, prey to illusion, and, in a crucial manner, susceptible to external procedures of manipulation and stimulation that have the essential capacity to produce experience for the subject.(Crary 1995, 92)
Crary implies here that during the nineteenth century observation, and specifically vision, were both reconceptualized not as a Kantian universal faculty but rather as physiological processes. In particular, it was assumed that observable phenomena were conditioned, not by universal forms of sensible intuition, but rather by the sorts of external physical factors that affected bodily and specifically physiological processes in general.

Bohr extended the nineteenth century concept by proposing that the "external procedures" that influence vision affect not only how we see but also the scientific concepts in terms of which what we see should be described. Even more radically, Bohr proposed that the "external procedures" that affect sensible intuitions include the processes of observation themselves. Thus Bohr stood at the end of a long historical trajectory. Both Kant and Descartes conceived the apparatus of observation as an inner mental faculty, analogous to a pair of spectacles (Kant) or a camera obscura (Descartes) mobilizing the perceptions of some inner Eye. In the nineteenth century, vision was projected outwards, reconceived as a bodily, and specifically physiological process (Müller, Helmholtz, and Johann Friedrich Herbart, Kant's successor at Königsberg). Bohr, then, completed the process of externalization by severing observation from the body, including it as one among many "external procedures" that affect accounts of what we see.[6]

Like Bohr, Heisenberg opposed Einstein's "realism". But whereas Bohr's opposition was rooted in a neo-Kantian relationalism that reversed Kant by externalizing the inner mental faculties, Heisenberg opposed Einstein from a more straightforwardly positivistic standpoint that disagreed not only with Einstein but also with Bohr.[7]

To be specific, Heisenberg took as meaningless the sorts of metaphysical speculations about the "true nature of reality" that preoccupied both Einstein and Bohr, speculations that, according to Heisenberg, betrayed their metaphysical nature by divorcing questions of truth from more concrete issues of what is observed:

It is possible to ask whether there is still concealed behind the statistical universe of perception a ‘true’ universe in which the law of causality would be valid. But such speculation seems to us to be without value and meaningless, for physics must confine itself to the description of the relationship between perceptions.(Heisenberg 1927, 197)

The End of Copenhagen Monocracy

By embedding QM within the formal theory of Hilbert spaces, John von Neumann, a brilliant pure mathematician, provided the first rigorous axiomatic treatment of QM (von Neumann 1955 - the original German edition of this book appeared in 1932). Unlike Bohr and Einstein, he took seriously QM's formalism, not only providing the theory with rigorous mathematical foundations but also allowing a new conceptual architectonic to emerge from within the theory itself rather than following Heisenberg, Bohr, and Einstein who imposed a system of concepts a priori.

Von Neumann also intervened decisively into the measurement problem. Summarizing earlier work, he argued that a measurement on a quantum system involves two distinct processes that may be thought of as temporally contiguous stages (417-418).[8] In the first stage, the measured quantum system S interacts with M, a macroscopic measuring apparatus for the physical quantity Q. This interaction is governed by the linear, deterministic Schrödinger equation, and is represented in the following terms: at time t, when the measurement begins, S, the measured system, is in a state represented by a Hilbert space vector f that, like any vector in the Hilbert space of possible state vectors, is decomposable into a weighted sum - a "linear superposition" - of the set of so-called "eigenvectors" {fi} belonging to Q. In other words, f = cifi, for some set {ci} of complex numbers. fi, the eigenvector of Q corresponding to possible value qi, is that state of S at t for which, when S is in that state, there is unit probability that Q has value qi.[9] M, the measuring apparatus, is taken to be in a "ready" state g at time t when the measurement begins. According to the laws of QM, this entails that S+M at t is in the "tensor product" state cifi g.

By applying the Schrödinger equation to this product state, we deduce that at time t, when the first stage of the measurement terminates, the state of S+M is cifi gi, where gi is a state in which M registers the value qi.[10] Such states, represented by a linear combination of products of the form fi gi, have been dubbed "entangled states".[11]

After the first stage of the measurement process, a second non-linear, indeterministic process takes place, the "reduction of the wave packet", that involves S+M "jumping" (the famous "quantum leap") from the entangled state cifi gi into the state fi gi for some i. This, in turn (according to the laws of QM) means that S is in state fi and M is in the state gi, where gi, it is assumed, is the state in which M registers the value qi. Let t denote the time when this second and final stage of the measurement is finished.[12] It follows that at t, when the measurement as a whole terminates, M registers the value qi. Since the reduction of the wave-packet is indeterministic, there is no possibility of predicting which value M will register at t. We can conclude only that M will register some value.

The second stage of the measurement, with its radical, non-linear discontinuities, was from its introduction the source of many of the philosophical difficulties that plagued QM, including what von Neumann referred to as its "peculiar dual nature" (417). As Schrödinger was moved to say during a visit to Bohr's institute during September 1926: "If all this damned quantum jumping [verdamnte Quantenspringerei] were really to stay, I should be sorry I ever got involved with quantum theory" (Jammer 1974, 57)

QM has nothing else definite to say about the measurement process. To be specific, from within the resources of QM there is no way of predicting what value of Q will be registered. QM does, however, give us some additional statistical information, via the so called Born statistical interpretation:

The probability of qi being registered is |ci|2, where i is the coefficient of fi (the eigenvector of Q corresponding to value qi) when the initial measured state of S is expressed as a linear superposition of eigenvectors of Q.
In short, QM does not predict what the measured value will be but does at least tells us the probability distribution over various possible measured values.

Cats in Singlets

Von Neumann's formal work enables a clear exposition of various paradoxes that have haunted QM from its inception. One of these was the famous Schrödinger cat paradox (Schrödinger 1935b). This paradox dramatizes the fact that, according to QM, the observer's intervention at the end of the first stage of the measurement process precipitates S+M from a complex entangled state, that is from a superposition or hybrid of states for which M registers different possible values for Q, into a state for which M registers a single value. In short, the act of observation creates a paradoxical shift in M: from a hybrid state for which the value that M registers is "indeterminate" to a state in which M registers precisely one such value. In the case of the cat paradox, matters are so arranged that a cat being dead or alive corresponds to the differing states of M. Thus, it seems, the act of observing the cat precipitates it from a strange zombie-like state in which its state of morbidity is indeterminate to a state in which it is either dead or alive. "Looks can kill", as we might say.

The measurement problem was exacerbated by another paradox that arose in the context of the Einstein-Bohr debate: what has come to be called the EPR (Einstein-Podolski-Rosen) paradox (Einstein, Podolski, Rosen 1935). It should be stressed that in their original article EPR presented their argument as proof of the incompleteness rather than inconsistency of QM. Nevertheless, in the subsequent literature their argument quickly took on the role of a paradox, one that is most perspicuously presented in terms of the formalism developed by Bohm and Aharanov (Bohm and Aharanov 1957). Consider a pair of electrons S1, S2 at time t when they are in a so-called singlet state, represented by the vector

{(fx+ gx-) + (fx- gx+)}/2,
where fx+ and fx- represent the two possible eigenstates of the x-directed spin of S1 corresponding to the two possible spin values +1/2 and -1/2 respectively; gx- and gx+ represent the corresponding eigenstates for S2. From the Born statistical interpretation it is easy to deduce that when S1+S2 is in the singlet state, the x-spin values of S1 and S2 are anticorrelated, that is, the conditional probability of measuring the x-spin of S1 to have value +1/2 given that the x-spin of S2 is measured to have value -1/2 is 1, and vise versa. It is also a theorem of QM that the linear decomposition of the singlet state vector is invariant under rotation and in particular invariant under interchange of x and y:
(fx+ gx-) + (fx- gx+) = (fy+ gy-) + (fy- gy+)
Now suppose that S1 and S2 have been allowed to drift out of each other's spheres of influence, so that a disturbance of S1 can have no simultaneous effect upon S2. Suppose too that we measure the x-spin of S1 just before t, and that the value revealed by measurement is +1/2. In that case, the anti-correlation between the x-spin values for S1 and S2 makes it possible to predict with certainty that, in the event that the x-spin of S2 is measured just before t, the value revealed by measurement is -1/2. The possibility of making this prediction means that the x-spin measurement on S1 also counts as an x-spin measurement on S2, albeit an indirect measurement since it is carried out in a region of space remote from S2. By applying the reduction of the wave-packet postulate to this indirect measurement, we conclude that, at time t immediately after the measurement, the state of S2 is gx-, the eigenvector of x-spin for value -1/2.

But now assume that a second measurement has been carried out just before t, one that directly measures the spin of S2 in the y direction. There is no difficulty in simultaneously conducting both of these measurements since, because they take place in different regions of space, they cannot interfere with each other. By applying the reduction of the wave-packet postulate to this second measurement, we conclude that the state of S2 immediately post-measurement is either gy- or gy+, depending on whether the measured value for y-spin is -1/2 or +1/2. Thus we arrive at a direct contradiction, since the state of S2 post-measurement cannot be both gx- and one of gy- or gy+. Here, then, lies the nub of the EPR paradox, showing that QM is inconsistent with the reduction of the wave-packet postulate. (In its original form the EPR argument merely showed that without the reduction of the wave-packet postulate, QM is incomplete.[13])

The World of Many Interpretations

The measurement problem and its associated paradoxes have generated a multitude of responses. One such, based upon von Neumann's work with density operators, is due to Josef M. Jauch (Jauch 1968, chapter 11). The post measurement entangled state of S+M, cifi gi, is a "pure state", represented by a single Hilbert space vector. There are, however, other sorts of states in QM, namely "mixed states", represented not by single vectors but rather by so called density operators. It is characteristic of S being in a mixed state that, from the point of view of statistical distributions over possible results of measurements on S, S behaves as if, for some set of vectors {fi} and some set of numbers {pi} for which pi = 1, there is probability pi that S is in the state fi, for i = 1,2,.... (Mathematically, such a state is represented by a so-called density operator, pifi><fi |, where | fi><fi | is the projection operator onto the vector fi.[14]) Von Neumann proved that when S+M is in the entangled state cifi gi then S is in such a mixed state. In particular, S behaves as if there were probability |ci|2 of being in state fi, for i = 1,2...; similarly M is in a mixed state, behaving as if there were probability |ci|2 of being in state gi, for i = 1,2....(von Neumann 1955, 424).

It seems, then, that a solution to the measurement problem is within easy reach. We simply interpret the state of S when S+M is in the entangled state cifi gi as a new sort of "mixed" state in which there really is probability |ci|2 that S is in the state fi, for i = 1,2,.... The probability in question is not merely a subjective measure of ignorance (otherwise the state is really a pure state, as defined in the previous endnote) but instead is an "intrinsic" property of the system S, in particular, it may be thought of as an objective measure of a propensity of S at t to be in the state fi (Jauch 1968, 173-174). This, in turn, means that, already at the end of the first stage of the measurement, there is probability |ci|2 that Q has value qi in S (as above I am taking fi as the eigenvector of Q corresponding to value qi). By parity of reasoning, at the end of the first stage of the measurement, there is probability |ci|2 of M being in state gi and hence of registering the value qi for Q. Thus, it seems, the "reduction of the wave packet" is redundant, since already at the end of the first stage measurement the measuring apparatus registers the appropriate possible values with probabilities in agreement with the Born statistical interpretation. As such, those paradoxes of QM, such as EPR and Schrödinger's cat, that depend upon the reduction of the wave packet simply disappear.[15]

But a difficulty remains. The state of S+M at the end of measurement is still an entangled state for which, it seems, we cannot say that Q has value qi with probability |ci|2. Indeed, from the perspective of that combined state, it seems that the value of Q is indeterminate, suspended between the various possible values q1, q2, and so on. More seriously, it seems that the measuring apparatus suffers from a similar indeterminacy: that is, it is indeterminate which value it registers. In short, it seems that, from the point of view of the combined measuring and measured system, Schrödinger's cat paradox (although not his cat) survives unscathed.[16]

The Italian School of Daneri, Loinger, Prosperi, et al responded to this problem by advancing what has come to be called a "phase wash out" theory (Daneri, Loinger and Prosperi 1962). They showed that in virtue of statistical thermodynamic features of the measuring apparatus, the state of S+M at t (the end of the first stage of measurement) approximates a mixed state - also called the "reduced state" - in which there is probability |ci|2 that S+M is in the state represented by the product vector fi gi, for all the various i = 1,2,..... In this reduced state the nagging indeterminacy effects vanish.

A serious difficulty remains, however. It may well be true that S+M is approximately in a mixed state. But this does not solve the cat paradox. That is, although it may be true that to a good approximation Schrödinger's cat is either dead or alive, the air of paradox remains if, when we examine in detail the micro-correlations between the measured and measuring systems, we see that the cat is in a zombie like dead-and-alive state.

The "phase wash out" approach and Jauch's approach more generally suffer another drawback, one they share with hidden variable interpretations of QM (for a discussion of the latter interpretations, see Belinfante 1973). In the special situation described by the EPR paradox, for which the density operator of the measured system is an identity operator, these interpretations assign determinate values to all physical quantities for a particular quantum system.[17] Thus they fall prey to a new generation of paradoxes that depend upon Gleason's theorem and the related Kochen and Specker theorem.[18]

The paradoxes and questions raised by the measurement problem have spawned a host of interpretations of QM, including hidden variable theories that continue Einstein's search for a "complete" account of physical reality, and the Everett-Wheeler "many worlds interpretation" (Wheeler and Zureck 1983, II.3 and III.3; Bell 1987, chapters 4 and 20). Most physicists bypass these philosophical resolutions of the interpretative difficulties of QM, and revert instead to some version of the Bohr interpretation. Often that version is related closely to the early Heisenberg's positivistic, anti-metaphysical approach. It is as if the long history of failure to resolve the acrimonious disputes surrounding the interpretation of QM has led quantum physicists to become disenchanted with the garden of metaphysical delights. As John S. Bell has made the point, despite more than seventy years of interpreting QM and resolving the measurement problem, the Bohr interpretation in its more pragmatic, less metaphysical forms remains the "working philosophy" for the average physicist (Bell 1987, 189).[19]


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Einstein, Albert: Einstein-Bohr debates | physics: experiment in | physics: holism and nonseparability | quantum mechanics | quantum mechanics: Bohmian mechanics | quantum mechanics: collapse theories | quantum mechanics: Copenhagen interpretation of | quantum mechanics: Everett's relative-state formulation of | quantum mechanics: many-worlds interpretation of | quantum mechanics: modal interpretations of | quantum mechanics: the role of decoherence in | quantum theory: the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument in | Uncertainty Principle