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Modal Interpretations of Quantum Mechanics

First published Tue 12 Nov, 2002

The original ‘modal interpretation’ of quantum theory was born in the early 1970s, and at that time the phrase referred to a single interpretation, due to van Fraassen. The phrase now encompasses a wide class of interpretations, and is better taken to refer to a general approach to the analysis of the structure -- both conceptual and mathematical -- of quantum theory. I shall describe the history of modal interpretations, how the phrase has come to be (best) used in this way, and the general program of (at least some of) those who advocate this approach.

1. The Copenhagen Variant

By the early 1970s, researchers in philosophy of physics had become painfully aware of the nonlocality inherent in standard quantum theory. It arises most dramatically, perhaps, in the context of the projection postulate, which asserts that upon measurement of a physical system, its state will ‘collapse’ (or be ‘projected’) to one of the possible values of the measured quantity. This postulate is difficult to accept in any case (what effects this discontinuous change in the physical state of a system? what exactly is a ‘measurement’?), but it is especially worrying when applied to entangled compound systems whose components are well-separated in space. The classic example is the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen-type experiment, in which two particles initially interacting are separated. Their quantum-mechanical state is ‘entangled’, which means, for our purposes, that the collapse resulting from a measurement on one of them simultaneously (and instantaneously) affects the other.

A possible way clear of this problem was noticed by van Fraassen (1972, 1974), who proposed to eliminate the projection postulate from the theory. Of course, others had made this proposal before. Bohm's (1952) theory (itself preceded by de Broglie's proposals from the 1920s) eliminates the projection postulate, as do the various many-worlds (and relative-state) interpretations. Van Fraassen's proposal was, however, apparently quite different from these other approaches. It relied, in particular, on a distinction between the ‘value state’ of a system, and the ‘dynamical state’ of a system. The value state describes the system's properties, while the dynamical state determines which properties the system might have at a later time. (More specifically, the dynamical state determines how the system ‘reacts to perturbations’, as van Fraassen sometimes says, such information being what we need to make predictions about its future value states.)

The dynamical state is just the quantum state, and it never collapses. The value state is (typically) something other than the quantum state. Indeed, it is something other than the dynamical state exactly when the dynamical state is not a pure state. In these cases (i.e., when the dynamical, or quantum, state of a system is mixed), the dynamical state constrains the possible value states (and empirical adequacy requires that it also generate the correct frequencies for those value states that are observable).

Van Fraassen's proposal thus violates the so-called ‘eigenstate-eigenvalue link’, which asserts that a system has the value state corresponding to a given eigenvalue (of a given observable) if and only if its quantum state is an eigenstate of the observable corresponding to that eigenvalue. Van Fraassen accepts the ‘if’ part, but denies the ‘only if’ part.

What are the possible ‘value states’ for a given system at a given time? For van Fraassen, the form of the value states is restricted in an important, and somewhat conservative, way: propositions about a physical system cannot be jointly true unless they can be jointly certain. In other words, the uncertainty principle imposes a limit not only on our knowledge of the properties of a system, but also on the properties themselves. It must be possible for a dynamical state to assign a value state probability 1. This restriction motivates van Fraassen to term his interpretation the ‘Copenhagen Variant’ of the modal interpretation. Other variants (for example, van Fraassen identifies an ‘Anti-Copenhagen’ variant, which he attributes to Arthur Fine) would impose less restrictive conditions on the form of the value states.

Finally, ‘value states’ are maximal with respect to the restriction just noted. It follows immediately that value states are representable as pure states. But which pure states are the possible value states at a given moment? Van Fraassen formulates a very permissive criterion, which other authors have found too permissive, the reason stemming from his ‘constructive empiricist’ philosophy of science. He is more concerned with the possibility of giving an interpretation of the theory in which the theory is empirically adequate, i.e. compatible with all observable phenomena (in the sense used by van Fraassen), in particular the observable phenomenon that (what we normally call) measurements do have results, rather than the specification of a theory that will predict that such measurements have results. Indeed, if we apply the eigenstate-eigenvalue link to the theory (which, recall, is quantum mechanics without the projection postulate), it turns out that measurements do not have results. But an ‘interpretation' that predicts that measurements will have results, especially if it predicts also what the probabilities will be for these results (Born rule), and how the future evolution of the system will be affected by these results (projection postulate), is presumably not a mere interpretation of the given theory, but a new theory altogether (a hidden variables theory). The account given by van Fraassen is much more modest, prescribing as an interpretational rule only that the potential value states are the states that appear in the various decompositions of the (generally mixed) dynamical state.

Of course, empirical adequacy does require that, in cases of measurement, the actual value state of the apparatus be one describing a definite measurement result; and thus the observed value states, in these cases, are only a very restricted subset of the possible value states according to van Fraassen. Observation tells us also that, in these cases, the dynamical state generates a probability measure over this more restricted set, thus enabling us to make predictions about the result. In the end, van Fraassen is forced to give an account of measurements, and the account is considered by many to be problematic.

Van Fraassen's account is ‘modal’ because it leads, in a relatively straightforward way, to a modal logic of quantum propositions. For van Fraassen, perhaps the most important point is that one should not presume this modal logic to arise from ignorance about the actual state of affairs, which is the aim of science to uncover. In other words, we do not say that a system with dynamical state W possibly has some value state V1, V2,…, and we need to find out which one, or which one with which probability. What is important is that there are possible value states for all physical systems (i.e. possible stories about the world) that are compatible with all the observable data. On the other hand, it is quite easy to see how van Fraassen's account gave rise to a program that is largely concerned with providing a ‘realistic’ interpretation of quantum theory, a program to which we now turn.

2. Kochen-Dieks-Healey Interpretations

The basic outlines of that program are already apparent in van Fraassen's work (or in what may be considered its limitations). The main idea is to define a set of possible properties for a physical system, then to assert that the ‘dynamical’ (i.e., quantum-mechanical) state generates an ignorance-interpretable probability measure over this set. More precisely, one defines an ignorance-interpretable probability measure over value states, which themselves assign ‘possessed’ or ‘not possessed’ to each property in the set. The fact that one uses the quantum-mechanical probability measure guarantees a kind of minimal empirical adequacy with respect to the properties in the set of possible properties. If, in addition, one finds a world described in terms of these properties (and only them) to be plausibly our world, then one might rest satisfied with this interpretation. (The exception might be a desire for an explicit dynamical picture of the possessed properties. See below.)

In the late 1980s, various other philosophers -- typically, as noted above, with a more realistic bent than van Fraassen -- realized that the central features of this approach can be used in the service of interpretations of quantum theory with other philosophical interests. Here we shall consider three cases, albeit briefly and largely without reference to their ‘background’ philosophical motivations (which are all realist, though in very different ways): Kochen, Dieks, and Healey.

Kochen's (1985) modal interpretation sparked a series of proposals that lasted through the 1980s and 1990s. His proposal is based on the polar decomposition theorem (see Reed and Simon (1979, pp. 197-198) for a statement and proof), but is somewhat easier to understand in terms of the so-called ‘biorthogonal decomposition theorem’:

Biorthogonal Decomposition Theorem:
Given a vector, |v>, in a tensor-product Hilbert space, H1 H2, there exist bases {|ei>} and {|fj>} for H1 and H2 respectively such that |v> can be written as a linear combination of terms of the form |ei> |fi>. If the absolute value (modulus) of the coefficients in this linear combination are all unequal then the bases are unique.

In other words, the state of a two-particle system picks out (in most cases, uniquely) a basis (and therefore an observable) for each of the component systems. (See, for example, Schrödinger (1935) for a proof of this theorem.)

Recall from the previous section that van Fraassen was not (for philosophical reasons) compelled to provide a very restrictive prescription for deciding what the possible value states for a given system might be. We see in the biorthogonal decomposition theorem a way to choose the possible value states from one single decomposition of the (mixed) dynamical state of a system: let them be (for each component system) the elements of the basis picked out by the theorem. It is manifest that the dynamical state generates a probability measure over this set of possible value states, namely the standard quantum mechanical measure.

Taking this view, our interpretation is essentially connected with the existence of two-component compound systems. In one sense, this feature is not really a noticeable departure from van Fraassen's view, because recall that for van Fraassen, only systems that are in mixed (indeed, improperly mixed) dynamical states have value states that differ from their dynamical states. This situation will typically occur for systems that are components of a compound system. (There is this difference: the biorthogonal decomposition theorem holds only for two-component compound systems, while subsystems of arbitrary compound systems will typically have for their dynamical state an improper mixture.) This formal similarity between Kochen and van Fraassen masks a rather significant philosophical difference, however. Kochen's account is meant to be perspectival or relational, meaning that a system has a property only in relation to other systems (see below).

Indeed, in a typical measurement situation, Kochen's prescription is the same as van Fraassen's. For consider a typical measurement in which a ‘pointer’ becomes correlated with the value that some ‘measured’ system has for a given observable. Letting the |ei> represent the possible ‘indicator states’ of the pointer, and |fj> represent the possible values that the system might have for the measured observable, the final state of the compound system should indeed take the form of a linear combination of terms of the form |ei> |fi>, so that by Kochen's (and van Fraassen's) prescription, the pointer indeed does have its indicator states as possible value states. (More precisely, for van Fraassen the pointer's indicator states are among the potential value states; as discussed above, van Fraassen is concerned only to establish this fact, and not the fact that they are the value states even when they are unobservable.)

For Kochen, the fact that the application of the interpretation is restricted to subsystems of a two-component compound system is not a problem. Indeed, he appears to adopt a metaphysics of properties in which systems do not have intrinsic properties: all properties are relational. Kochen calls the relation ‘witnessing’. Consider again the measurement described above. In this case, the pointer (at the end of the measurement) may be said to ‘indicate’ (or, as Kochen prefers, ‘witness’) the result, i.e., the value that the measured system has for the measured observable. Now, because Kochen intends his interpretation to apply in all circumstances (not only in measurements), we must abstract the idea of ‘indication’ or ‘witnessing’ away from the context of measurements, and whatever notion we end up with is supposed to apply to all cases of possession of properties. Kochen's interpretation is therefore highly ‘perspectival’: systems do not possess properties intrinsically, but relative to the ‘perspective’ of another system that ‘witnesses’ it to posses the property in question.

Other authors, notably Dieks, prefer (or at least did originally prefer) a metaphysics of intrinsically possessed properties. They are therefore faced with two questions.

  1. What can one say (if anything) about the properties of subsystems that are not components of a two-component system in a pure state?

To raise the second question, note that a three-component compound system may be divided into pairs of subsystems in several ways. Consider, for example, the compound system A&B&C. We could arrive at properties for A by applying the biorthogonal decomposition theorem to the two-component system A&(B&C). We could also apply the theorem to (for example) B&(C&A) or C&(A&B).

  1. How are the properties of A and B related to those of A&B?

Suppose, for example, that A has the property P and B has the property Q. Should one ascribe the property P&Q to A&B, or should A&B have some property that it gets from applying the biorthogonal decomposition to C&(A&B), or both?

Although in his early proposals Dieks (1988, 1989) did not answer these questions, his later work, together with (Vermaas and Dieks, 1995) addresses them. (The fullest account is in Vermaas (1999). See also Bacciagaluppi (forthcoming).) Dieks' answer to the first question relies on the fact that the density operator (reduced state) of a single component of a two-component system has for its spectral resolution exactly the projections spanned by the basis elements picked out by the biorthogonal decomposition theorem, in the case when the decomposition is unique. One may then generalize the original proposal by supposing that the possible value states for every system are just the elements in its (typically, improper and reduced) density operator's spectral decomposition, whose existence and uniqueness is guaranteed by the spectral theorem (stated and proved in just about any textbook of functional analysis). This new proposal matches the old one in cases where the old one applies, i.e., in cases where the biorthogonal decomposition applies, and guarantees a unique biorthogonal decomposition.

The answer to the second question is somewhat more involved. In fact, we can make the issue even more complicated by noting that a given tensor-product Hilbert space can be factored in many ways. In essence, the factorization of a given Hilbert space, H, into two factors, H1 and H2, can be ‘rotated’ to produce additional factorizations into H1 and H2. There is a continuous infinity of such possibilities. Are we to apply the proposal to each such factorization? How are the results related, if at all?

A theorem due to Bacciagaluppi (1995) shows, in essence, that if one applies Dieks' proposal to the ‘subsystems’ obtained in every factorization and insists that the results be comparable (i.e., that the subsystems thus obtained do not have their properties ‘relative to a factorization’ but instead have them absolutely), then one will be led to a mathematical contradiction of the Kochen-Specker variety. While one could adopt the view that subsystems have their properties ‘relative to a factorization’, most advocates of modal interpretations have instead adopted the view that there is a ‘preferred factorization’ of the universal Hilbert space into subsystems. This assumption amounts to the adoption of the existence of fixed ‘atomic’ degrees of freedom of the universe.

One is still faced, however, with the question how degrees of freedom for a compound system are related to those of its components. The answer to this question depends, finally, on another issue. Is Dieks' proposal to be applied to the ‘atoms’ only, or to any subsystem whatever? For example, do we apply the proposal (from our schematic example above) to A&B&C as well as to A&B? Vermaas (1997) has shown that doing so makes question 2 unanswerable in general: one cannot define generally valid correlations between a composite system and its components in this case. (If one is willing to adopt perspectivalism -- as Kochen is, for example -- then one can perhaps justify the lack of such correlations.) Unless one is willing to adopt some form of perspectivalism, then, one is apparently led to the atomic modal interpretation (see, for example, Bacciagaluppi and Dickson, 1999), according to which the basic proposal is applied only to the ‘atomic’ subsystems of the universe. The properties of all other (compound) systems are inherited from their subsystems. There are connections here with discussions in metaphysics about the possibility of the existence of ‘non-supervenient’ properties. (Clifton (1995c) also offers an important theorem concerning this issue.)

Richard Healey (1989) was also among the first to make use of the biorthogonal decomposition theorem, taking Kochen's ideas in a somewhat different direction. Healey's main concern was indeed the apparent nonlocality of quantum theory. Healey's intuition about the way a 'modal' interpretation based on the biorthogonal decomposition theorem would be applied to, say, an EPR experiment, was as follows. The theorem is applied first to the composite of apparatus on one side and EPR pair (while the EPR pair has not yet interacted with the apparatus on the other side). Thus the EPR pair acquires a 'holistic' property, which can then explain why the apparatus on the other side acquires a property that is correlated to the result on the other side.

Irrespective of whether this picture is general enough for its intended purpose, it shows that Healey does not subscribe to an 'atomic' modal interpretation, since it is crucial for him that the EPR pair as a whole be assigned a (non-product) property. Healey's proposal begins with the atomic interpretation, making use of the biorthogonal decomposition theorem, but the set of possible properties is then expanded (and subsequently restricted) by a number of conditions. Healey's aim is apparently to walk a thin line amongst a variety of desiderata. The first is consistency. As shown by (for example) the theorems of Bacciagaluppi and Vermaas, mentioned above -- not to mention the Kochen-Specker theorem itself -- given certain conditions on the set of possibly-possessed properties, one cannot add properties to this set willy-nilly. A second is to maintain a plausible theory of the relationship between composite systems and their subsystems. A third is to maintain a plausible account of the relations among possessed properties at a given time. A fourth is to maintain a plausible account of the relations among possessed properties at different times.

The structure of possibly-possessed properties that emerges from Healey's conditions is (for this author at least) extremely difficult to grasp. Some progress has been made since Healey's book was published (see for example Reeder and Clifton, 1995), but in general, it remains difficult to see what the set of possibly-possessed properties is, for Healey.

3. Motivating Early Modal Interpretations

On the other hand, the clear advantage that Healey's approach had over others of roughly the same period was motivation. The necessity (or indeed plausibility) of Healey's conditions might be debatable, but it is clear what they assert, and why one might want to make such an assertion -- Healey himself gives reasons. Still, there remains the fundamental question: why begin with the biorthogonal decomposition (or more generally, the spectral decomposition) in the first place? For those interpretations that say little beyond the application of these decompositions to determine the set of possibly-possessed properties, the question is all the more pressing, and the interpretations are all the more lacking in direct physical motivation.

A series of theorems from the mid-1990s proposes to answer (or to begin to answer) this question. The first of these theorems was due to Clifton (1995a), the title of the paper indicating the project: “Independently motivating the Kochen-Dieks Modal Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics”. A series of related results followed, including those by Clifton (1995b), Dickson (1995a, 1995b) and Bub and Clifton (1996). Here I shall discuss Clifton's original paper, and Bub and Clifton's theorem, the former to indicate the general thrust of these earlier arguments, and the latter as a way to introduce Bub's own modal interpretation.

The theorem discussed here is not quite Clifton's, which is slightly stronger (because its assumptions are slightly weaker), but the reader should be able to grasp the general idea of these theorems from the following discussion. They take the general form, for some mathematically-stated (but hopefully physically motivated) conditions A, B, C, etc.: If one wants a set of possibly-possessed properties to obey conditions A, B, C, etc., then the set must take the form asserted by the spectral-decomposition form of the modal interpretation. That form, more precisely, is the following. Consider a system in the (in general reduced and improper) mixed state, W. Let {Pi} be the set of W's spectral projections, and let B<Pi> be the Boolean algebra generated by the Pi, which is in this case just the set of all sums of elements of {Pi}. Finally, let Q be the null space of W, that is, orthogonal to each Pi. Then the set of all possibly-valued projections, P, for our system is the set

{P | P = Pj + Q, where Pi is in B<Pi> and Q is contained in Q}.

So theorems of the sort proven by Clifton and others take the form: sets of the form given above are the only sets that fulfill conditions A, B, C, etc.

In one such theorem, roughly the one proven originally by Clifton, the conditions are:

  1. Closure: the set of all possibly-possessed properties is closed under conjunction, disjunction, and negation (suitably understood in quantum-logical terms).
  2. Classicality: the quantum-mechanical probability measure (generated by the reduced state W) over the set of all possibly-possessed properties obeys all of the laws of classical probability, and -- crucially -- it is ‘ignorance-interpretable’.
  3. Certainty: for any property R, if the reduced state W assigns probability 1 or probability 0 to R, then R is in the set of all possibly-possessed properties.
  4. Ignorance: each member of the spectral resolution of W is in the set of all possibly-possessed properties.

The final condition is probably the most difficult to justify, though one should note that Clifton's theorem actually relies on a considerably weaker condition. (Of course in conjunction with the other conditions, it implies the condition given here).

The theorem of Bub and Clifton (1996) (in a slightly improved version from Bub, Clifton, and Goldstein (2000)) concerns a set of possibly-possessed properties that is characterized somewhat differently. Specifically, it is characterized in terms of (in the simplest case) a pure state, |v> and an observable, R. The pure state is the quantum-mechanical state of the system, while the observable is supposed to be ‘definitely-valued’; i.e., whatever else gets a value, the spectral projections of R must.

The conditions of the Bub-Clifton theorem are the following:

  1. Closure: as above.
  2. Truth and Probability: essentially the same condition as ‘classicality’, above.
  3. R-preferred: the eigenspaces of R are among the set of possibly-possessed properties.
  4. |v>,R-definability: the set of possibly-possessed properties are definable solely in terms of the pure state |v> and the observable R.
  5. Maximality: the set of possibly-possessed properties is maximal with respect to the conditions above.

The idea, then, is to find a (maximal) set of possibly-possessed properties that admits an empirically adequate, but ignorance-interpretable, probability measure, makes R definite-valued, and is fixed by the state of the system, |v>, and R. Again, these conditions are supposed to be intuitively clear, if not compelling. The most controversial is surely ‘R-preferred’, for it is unclear why there should be some ‘preferred’ observable in this sense, and especially how it might be picked out. One would not like the observable to be picked out by fiat, for example. If we were willing to choose an observable and stipulate in a more or less ad hoc manner that it must have a value, then it is unclear why we would be concerned about the interpretation of quantum theory in the first place.

Bub and Clifton prove the rather remarkable result that the conditions above give rise to a unique set of possibly-possessed properties, defined as follows. Let {Pi} be the set of projections onto the vectors, |vi>, which are the projections of |v> onto the eigenspaces of R. Then the set is as defined above for Clifton's theorem concerning spectral-decomposition modal interpretations.

Bub is not silent on the issue raised above, of why there should be a preferred observable, and how it might get chosen. First, he notes that a number of traditional interpretations of quantum theory can be characterized in this way. Notable among them are the Dirac-von Neumann interpretation, (what Bub takes to be) Bohr's interpretation, and, perhaps, Bohm's theory. In the last case, Bub (following Vink, 1993) argues that Bohm's theory can in a sense be recovered as a kind of limit of modal interpretations in which the Rs are chosen to be discretized position observables. Second, Bub argues (especially in his 1997) that R could be picked out by the physical process of decoherence. We shall have to leave this suggestion as a tantalizing possibility.

4. Reality Sets in: The Problem of Imperfect Measurement

Earlier I suggested that the spectral-decomposition (and the biorthogonal-decomposition) modal interpretations solve the measurement problem in a particularly direct way: at the end of a typical measurement, the compound system (apparatus plus measured system) is in a state such that the possible properties as picked out by these modal interpretations include exactly the ‘pointer’ states of the apparatus. Hence these interpretations assign ‘the right’ state to apparatuses.

There are two problems with this claim, which by itself is true. First, not everything to which one might want to assign a definite property is (or is obviously) an apparatus at the end of a measurement. Second, measurements in the real world do not satisfy the ideal model that I described earlier. In particular, they do not effect a perfect correlation between the apparatus and the measured system -- measuring apparatuses are imperfect. But then it is far from clear that the biorthogonal (or spectral) decomposition picks out the right properties for the apparatus. (A related problem faces Bub: does decoherence always pick out appropriate observables as definite-valued?)

This problem was first raised by Albert and Loewer (1990, 1991), later developed by Elby (1993), and it sparked considerable discussion. Before we turn to the reply, we note that in fact the problem is unavoidable in the context of quantum theory. It is not due merely to the fact that measuring apparatuses are inaccurate. Rather, the quantum-mechanical formalism itself does not permit perfect correlations. Consider, for example, a standard Stern-Gerlach measurement of the spin of a particle. Immediately after the interaction between the particle and the magnets -- and even if that interaction were to produce, initially, a perfect separation between the spin-up particles and the spin-down particles -- the wavefunction for the particle emerging from the magnets would spread instantaneously to cover all of space. The particle will necessarily have a non-zero probability of turning up in the ‘wrong’ region. (See Dickson (1994) for a longer discussion of this point.) So the problem we are facing here is not a problem of engineering alone; it is intrinsic to quantum theory. (For this reason, we might expect to learn something by examining it, whether modal interpretations survive the problem or not.)

The response of modal interpretations to this problem of intrinsic ‘inaccuracy’ in measurements comes in three stages. First, we may notice that the ‘error terms’ in the state of the compound (apparatus plus measured) system would typically be very small, so that the true final state would be extremely close to the ideal state (in the sense that their inner product would be very close to one). In that case, one might expect that the spectral decompositions (of the reduced states for the apparatus and measured system) would pick out states for the two systems that are extremely close to the ‘ideal’ states. Specifically, the ‘real’ possibly possessed properties of the apparatus would be very close (in Hilbert space) to the ‘ideal’ possibly possessed properties. One interesting issue that arises here is whether ‘close’ is good enough. Whatever one's answer, it is crucial to realize that modal interpretations are not here proposing a FAPP (‘for all practical purposes’) solution to the measurement problem. No, they assert that the real state of the apparatus is ‘close’ to the ideally expected state, and that there is no empirical problem with making this assertion.

However, before one can settle into debating that issue, we must face up to two more stages in the modal interpretation's response to the problem of imperfect measurements. The first arises from the realization that when the final state of the compound system is very nearly degenerate (when written in the basis given by the measured observable and the apparatus' ‘pointer’ observable -- i.e., when the probabilities for the various results are nearly equal), the spectral decomposition does not, in fact, choose a basis that is even close to the ideally expected result. This point was discussed in greatest detail by Bacciagaluppi and Hemmo (1996). Relying on the (near) ubiquity of decoherence in the macroscopic realm, they argue that when the apparatus is considered as a finite-dimensional system (more precisely, when the apparatus is modelled by a finite-dimensional Hilbert space), decoherence more or less guarantees that the spectral decomposition of the (reduced) state of any macroscopic object will be very close to the ideally expected result. For example, pointers will be well-localized in position.

The final stage of the modal interpretation's response to the problem involves consideration of the (probably more realistic) case of infinitely many distinct states for the apparatus. Bacciagaluppi (2000) has analyzed this situation, using a continuous model of the apparatus' interaction with the environment. He concludes that in this case, the spectral decomposition of the reduced state of the apparatus does not pick out states that are highly localized. This result applies more generally to other cases where a macroscopic system (not idealized as finite-dimensional) experiences decoherence due to interaction with its environment (see also Donald (1998)).

Two suspicions arise immediately from these results. The first is that the modal interpretation, as stated thus far, was never in a position to deal with quantum mechanics in infinite-dimensional Hilbert spaces. The second (related to the first) is that the spectral decomposition is in any case not the right tool to use to pick out the possibly possessed properties. These problems are serious. Even standard non-relativistic quantum theory occurs in the arena of infinite-dimensional Hilbert spaces, not to mention quantum field theory. Indeed, in the latter case, most of what we have said to this point would have to be significantly revised, or simply thrown away.

5 The Algebraic Approach

The Algebraic approach to modal interpretations addresses these concerns by, first, aiming for a formalism that is significantly more general than that developed thus far -- one that can apply to quantum theory in infinite-dimensional Hilbert space, and to quantum field theory -- and second, abstracting away from a particular choice for the possibly possessed properties. (Note that two alternative variants of modal interpretations, which also aim to address some of the above concerns, have been recently proposed by Spekkens and Sipe (2001a,b) and by Bene and Dieks (2002).)

The rudiments of an algebraic approach are already present in the work of those who, in the mid 1990s, aimed to provide a motivation for modal interpretations. We saw there that modal interpretations were described in more or less algebraic terms, namely, as a certain set closed under algebraic operations (the operations of meet, join, and orthocomplement on the lattice of projections on a Hilbert space, for example). Indeed, Bub defines his interpretation in these terms: his set of possible possessed properties is defined algebraically, in terms of an arbitrarily chosen observable (above, R).

While it was recognized by early workers (Bub, Clifton, Dickson, and others) that the set of possibly possessed properties can be characterized in interesting algebraic ways, the first serious algebraic work on modal interpretations was done by Bell and Clifton (1995), who defined the notion of a ‘quasiBoolean algebra’. These algebras are ‘almost’ distributive, in a well-defined sense. It is their ‘near’ distributivity that permits the definition of classical probability measures over them, which in many interpreters' eyes is the precondition for adopting an ignorance interpretation of probabilities.

Following on this work, Zimba and Clifton (1998) changed tack a bit, and considered not algebras (or lattices) of projection operators, but algebras of observables. The advantages of this approach are many. First, there is a well-developed theory of operator algebras upon which one can draw. Second, it allows one, in principle, to deal with observables generally, including those that do not have (proper) eigenspaces. Third, it provides a possibly more compelling justification for the kinds of ‘closure’ condition that have been mentioned above.

Zimba and Clifton focus largely on this last issue, considering a number of closure conditions on the set of definite-valued observables. For example, should the set be closed under taking real linear combinations? (In this case, one assumes that a real linear combination of observables that are definite-valued is itself definite-valued.) Arbitrary algebraic combinations? Arbitrary (‘self-adjoint’) functions? Zimba and Clifton prove a number of interesting results concerning the algebra of observables picked out by modal interpretations. (Their results are not all applicable to the infinite-dimensional case, however). Somewhat more precisely, one begins with a quasiBoolean algebra of projections -- not necessarily one picked out by any of the prescriptions we have discussed, but just any quasiBoolean algebra -- and then considers the observables that are definite-valued in virtue of this quasiBoolean algebra's constituting an algebra of possibly-possessed properties. Following Zimba and Clifton, let us call such an algebra of observables D. Zimba and Clifton then consider whether there exist valuations on D (i.e., assignments of values to all observables in D) that respect arbitrary (self-adjoint) functional relationships among the observables in D. That is, letting v[A] represent the value of A (for A in D), and letting f be any (self-adjoint) function, we require that f(v[A]) = v[f(A)]. The answer is ‘yes’. More importantly, they show that there are sufficiently many such valuations that the quantum-mechanical probabilities over D can be recovered from a classical probability measure over all such valuations. In other words, one can understand quantum-mechanical probabilities as ignorance about which values the observables in D actually have.

The latest installment of this line of reasoning is due to Halvorson and Clifton (1999). They extend results from Zimba and Clifton to the case of unbounded observables. However, there remain open questions about this case.

6. Dynamics

As we have seen, modal interpretations propose to provide, for every moment in time, a set of possibly-possessed properties (or definite-valued observables) and probabilities for possession of these properties (or for values of these observables). Some advocates of modal interpretations may be willing to leave the matter, more or less, at that. Others take it to be crucial for any modal interpretation that it also answer questions of the form: Given that a system possesses property P at time s, what is the probability that it will possess property P at time t (t > s)? In other words, they want a dynamics of possessed properties. (It is clear for instance that Healey's account requires some such dynamics.)

There are arguments on both sides. Those who consider a dynamics of possessed properties to be superfluous might ask whether quantum mechanics could not get away with just single-time probabilities. Why can we not settle for an interpretation that supplements standard quantum mechanics only by providing in a systematic way a set (the set of possibly possessed properties) over which its single-time probabilities are defined? If we require of this set that it include the everyday properties of macroscopic objects, then what more do we need? Arguably, Van Fraassen has a similar position, considering a dynamics of value states to be more than what an interpretation of quantum mechanics should provide.

Those who argue for the necessity of dynamics reply that we need an assurance that the trajectories of possessed properties are, at least for macroscopic objects, more or less as we see them to be. For example, we should require not only that the book at rest on the desk have a definite location, but also that, if undisturbed, its location relative to the desk does not change in time. Hence one cannot get away with simply specifying the definite properties at each time. We need also to be shown that this specification is at least compatible with a reasonable dynamics. Even better, we would like to see the dynamics explicitly.

The issue comes down to what one considers to be ‘the phenomena that need saving’ by an interpretation. Those who believe that the phenomena in question include dynamical phenomena will be inclined to search for a dynamics of possessed properties (or definite values). Others might not.

Of course, modal interpretations do admit -- trivially -- an unreasonable dynamics, namely, one in which there is no correlation from one time to the next. (In this case, probability of a transition from the property P at s to P at t is just the single-time probability for P at t.) In such a case, the book on the table might not remain at rest relative to the table, even if undisturbed. Such dynamics are unlikely to interest those who feel the need for a dynamics. As we just saw, their motivation is (probably) to provide an assurance that modal interpretations can describe the world more or less as we think it is.

Several researchers have contributed to the project of constructing a dynamics for modal interpretations. The most complete account is from Bacciagaluppi and Dickson (1999). That work answers most of the significant challenges facing the construction of a dynamics, though it does leave some important questions open.

The first challenge is posed by the fact that the set of possibly possessed properties -- let us call it ‘S’ -- can change over time. In other words, the ‘state space’ (S) over which we wish to define transition probabilities is itself time-dependent. The solution is to define a family of maps, each one being a 1-1 map from S at one time to (a different!) S at another time. With such a family of maps, one can effectively define conditional probabilities within a single state space, then translate them into ‘transition’ probabilities by means of this family of maps. Of course, for this technique to work, S must have the same cardinality at each time. In general (for example, in those interpretations that rely on the spectral-decomposition), it does not. One must, then, augment S at each time so that its cardinality matches the highest cardinality that S ever achieves.

Of course, one hopes to do so in a way that is not completely ad hoc. For example, in the context of the spectral decomposition version of the modal interpretation, Bacciagaluppi, Donald, and Vermaas (1995) show that the ‘trajectory’ (through Hilbert space) of the spectral components of the reduced state of a physical system will, under reasonable conditions, be continuous, or have only isolated discontinuities (so that the trajectory can be naturally extended to a continuous trajectory). This result suggests a natural family of maps as discussed above: map each spectral component at one time to its unique (continuous) evolute at later times.

The second challenge to the construction of a dynamics arises from the fact that one wants to define transition probabilities over infinitesimal units of time, then derive the finite-time transition probabilities from them. This problem is central to the theory of stochastic processes. Adapting results from the theory of stochastic processes, one can show that the procedure can, more or less, be carried out for modal interpretations of at least some varieties.

Finally, one must actually define infinitesimal transition probabilities that will give rise to the proper quantum-mechanical probabilities at a time. Following earlier work by Bell (1984) and Vink (1993) and others, Bacciagaluppi and Dickson define in fact an infinite class of such infinitesimal transition probabilities. Some of them might be considered more ‘quantum-mechanical’ than others, but all of them generate the correct single-time probabilities, which are, one might argue, strictly speaking all we can really test. On the other hand, Sudbery (2000) has argued that the form of the transition probabilities would be relevant to the precise form of spontaneous decay or the 'Dehmelt quantum jumps' (otherwise known as 'quantum telegraph' or 'intermittent fluorescence'). Indeed, he independently develops the dynamics of Bacciagaluppi and Dickson and applies it in such a way that with the 'standard' choice of transition probabilities it leads to the correct predictions for these experiments. Such somewhat more unusual experiments may well turn out to be crucial testing grounds for alternative 'interpretations' of quantum mechanics, as emphasised by Shimony (1990).

7. Open Projects

A number of open projects and problems face modal interpretations. Above we saw that the spectral decomposition version is unlikely to be adequate. The more recent algebraic work abstracts away from specific choices, but in the end one feels compelled to return to this issue. Indeed, at the very least one would like to know that some choice or other can at least capture what we believe to be true about the world. We have noted a number of theorems of the form ‘the largest set of observables that can be made simultaneously definite (subject to some conditions) is S’ for some S. Must we suppose that nature has been so kind as to make all statements simultaneously true of her describable in terms of one of these sets? Without a demonstration that the answer is (plausibly, at least) ‘yes’, one might wonder.

Other fundamental questions arise, which we have not discussed at all here. For example, is the very idea behind modal interpretations reasonable? Some have argued that quantum theory should not be viewed in terms of ‘operators’ and ‘quantum states’. They even question the fundamentality of the Hilbert space formalism, which modal interpretations take quite seriously. For example, Daumer et al. (1996) argue that one should not naïvely take operators to represent physical quantities (though it is controversial whether modal interpretations in fact do so, or in any case do so in the naïve sense that they dislike). On the other hand, Brown, Suárez, and Bacciagaluppi (1998) argue that there is more to quantum reality than what is usually described by operators and quantum states: gauges and coordinate systems are crucial to our description of physical reality, while modal interpretations have standardly not taken such things into consideration.

The recent algebraic work is itself a source of several open questions. Halvorson and Clifton (1999) themselves mention several. One may also ask more fundamental questions about the algebraic approach itself. For example, what is the motivation for the algebraic closure conditions? Do the functional operations correspond to well-defined empirical operations? If the physical meaning of the observable A is well-understood, do we thereby understand what f(A) means? (If no, then why insist on functional closure? If yes, what does it mean?)

In the realm of dynamics, Bacciagaluppi and Dickson (1999) raise a number of outstanding questions. In addition to these, the issue whether a dynamics is really needed is still a topic of discussion among researchers. Related to these questions is the question of Lorentz-invariance. Dickson and Clifton (1998) have shown that a large class of modal interpretations cannot be made Lorentz-invariant. Are all modal interpretations subject to this or similar results? If so, what do we make of that situation?

Many more open questions and problems face modal interpretations. Whatever their merits in the end, one can at least say that they have given rise to a serious and fruitful series of investigations into the nature of quantum theory.


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