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Nishida Kitarô

First published Fri 25 Feb, 2005

Nishida Kitarô was the most significant and influential Japanese philosopher of the twentieth-century. His work is pathbreaking in several respects: it established in Japan the creative discipline of philosophy as practiced in Europe and North America; it enriched that discipline by infusing Anglo-European philosophy with Asian sources of thought; it provided a new basis for philosophical treatments of East Asian Buddhist thought; and it produced novel theories of self and world with rich implications for contemporary philosophizing. Nishida's work is also frustrating for its repetitive and often obscure style, exceedingly abstract formulations, and detailed but frequently dead-end investigations. Nishida once said of his work, “I have always been a miner of ore; I have never managed to refine it” (Nishida 1958, Preface). A concise presentation of his achievements therefore will require extensive selection, interpretation and clarification.

This article presents his work in a roughly chronological order. We may understand his philosophical project overall as an attempt to restore to experience and consciousness the rigor, necessity and universality accorded to logic. This project developed in a direction quite opposite to that of psychologism, which would reduce logic to the contingencies of the individual mind or brain. It also differed from efforts to establish pure logic as a self-explanatory realm in that Nishida insisted on the starting point of experience, a priority he shared with Husserl's phenomenology and William James' radical empiricism. We might characterize his philosophy in general as a phenomenological metaphysics or an ontology of logical forms, but with one qualification: although he proposed a unitary source of such forms, that source is neither exclusionary nor positive; in other words the source itself cannot be described monistically as a single, more basic form or thing. Nishida eventually called this source MU (nothingness), a notion he found particularly prominent in the traditions of the East. His interests led him to develop a philosophy of culture, and his status as Japan's premier philosopher led government officials to call upon him for justification of Japanese expansionism in the late 1930s and early 40s. His last work recapitulated his non-dualistic account of world and self, but also reinterpreted the meaning of death.

1. Biography

Nishida was born on May 19, 1870 in the village of Mori on the Sea of Japan just north of the city of Kanazawa, the site today of archives and a museum dedicated to him. Nishida grew up in the early years of the Meiji era (1868-1912), when Japan had reopened to the world after two and a half centuries of isolation and was undergoing a revolutionary Europeanization of its political, educational and cultural institutions. As it touched Nishida's early years, this “modernization” came in the form of both a rigid, often oppressive school atmosphere that demanded obeisance to the emperor, and a liberating exposure to the progressive ideas of the Japanese “Enlightenment” that had introduced western philosophy to Japan. In secondary school in Kanazawa he studied Chinese Confucian, Neo-Confucian and Daoist classics, learned to read English and German, excelled in mathematics, and attempted briefly to penetrate works of Hegel and Kant. He formed a life-long friendship with fellow student D.T. Suzuki, and with him dropped out of high school in 1890. Admitted into Tokyo Imperial University as a “limited status” student the following year, Nishida studied Kant, Hegel and Schopenhauer under the first philosophy professors in Japan. After graduating in 1884 with a thesis on Hume's theory of causation, he married and held teaching positions at several provincial high schools and universities. During the next decade, despite the demands of family life and teaching German among other subjects, he published a few philosophical essays but was more intent on formal meditation practice under Zen masters in Kyoto. He began composing An Inquiry into the Good in 1905 and on the basis of that work secured a position at Kyoto Imperial University in 1910, becoming Professor of the Philosophy there in 1914.

Nishida concentrated on the philosophical books that made their way into Japan and for the next dozen years wrote numerous essays that reworked ideas from the Neo-Kantians, Royce, Bergson, Hermann Lotze and, to a lesser extent, Husserl. These essays were collected into books that investigated a wide range of topics, including art and morality, from the perspective of a theory of consciousness and the will. Nishida's fame began to spread in the 1920s. He was instrumental in securing positions at Kyoto University for Tanabe Hajime Watsuji Tetsurô, and Kuki Shuzô and attracted students such as Nishitani Keiji, Miki Kiyoshi and Tosaka Jun, who all became significant Japanese philosophers. He developed his signature theory of place (basho) in the mid 1920s, and continued to elaborate it after he became professor emeritus and moved to Kamakura in 1929. In the early 1930s his interests turned to the nature of human actions and interactions in the historical and social world, and eventually to the meaning of culture and nationhood.

Because of his prestige as Japan's premier philosopher, government officials—among them his former student and then Prime Minister Konoe Fumimaro—appealed to him to justify Japanese nationalism. Nishida complied by addressing the issues, if not legitimizing Japan's expansionism, but he considered much of this work a distraction. He lectured on “The Problem of Japanese Culture” in 1938; when published two years later the book sold some 40,000 copies. He delivered an invited address to the emperor in 1941 that advocated academic freedom and a place for each nation in the global world, with each developing its own global perspective.[1] Addresses on the “Principles for the New World Order” and on “The National Polity” (kokutai) followed. During this time Nishida's critics on the right considered his political writings either too abstract or insufficiently supportive of the government; after the Second World War his leftist critics found them profusely nationalistic. Despite his failing heath and the bombing of cities all around him, Nishida persisted in his philosophical investigations, using Descartes' Cogito and Leibniz's Preestablished Harmony as points of departure for example. He completed the seminal essay, “The Logic of Place and the Religious Worldview” just two months before his death on June 7, 1945. Publication of his collected works in 19 volumes began two years later. An extant photograph shows dozens of people camped out all night long awaiting the issue of the first volume on July 20, 1947.

Nishida's private life, reflected only faintly in his philosophical work, nevertheless left its stamp on its tenor. His perseverance through turmoil explains perhaps some of the intensity of his writing. Comprehending reality for him was an emotive as well as intellectual achievement; his calligraphy and poetry, renowned in their own right, evince an acute awareness of transience and transcendence. Nishida experienced the death of his first wife and four of his eight children; upon the passing of his first son he wrote this waka poem:

Having lived
till twenty-three
how could he disappear
like a dream

(Yusa 2002, 314–18).

Three years later he was able to write

The bottom of my soul has such depth;
Neither joy nor the waves of sorrow can reach it

(Nishida 1958, frontispiece).

2. Theory of Experience and Consciousness

2.1 Pure Experience

Starting with An Inquiry Into the Good, Nishida's early work calls into question two basic presuppositions of most modern epistemology: the assumptions that experience is individual and subjective, and that it leads to knowledge only via a corrective process with input from the mind or other individuals. For Nishida, experience in its original form is not the exercise of individuals equipped with sensory and mental abilities who contact an exterior world; rather it precedes the differentiation into subject experiencing and object experienced, and the individual is formed out of it. “The moment of seeing a color or hearing a sound” is prior not only to the thought that the color or sound is the activity of an external object or that one is sensing it, but also to the judgment of what the color or sound might be” (Nishida 1990, 3). “Pure experience” names not only the basic form of every sensuous and every intellectual experience but also the fundamental form of reality, indeed the “one and only reality” from which all differentiated phenomena are to be understood. Cognitive activities such as thinking or judging, willing, and intellectual intuition are all derivative forms of pure experience but identical to it insofar as they are in act—when thinking, willing, etc. are going on. The experience of a running horse, for example, underlies the judgment that the horse is running, and the activity of judging is an exercise of pure experience prior to a subsequent judgment that “I am now judging.” Objective phenomena likewise derive from pure experience; when unified they are called “nature,” while “spirit” names the activity of unifying. Pure experience launches the dynamic process of reality that differentiates into subjective and objective phenomena on their way to a higher unity, and the recapture of our unitary foundation is what Nishida means by the Good.

Nishida would deny that his position is a kind of idealism, either subjective or transcendental, because no subjective mind, human or divine, is the origin of what is taken as reality, and no personified or ego-aware spirit is its beginning or end. His notion of pure experience clearly shows the influence of William James, Ernst Mach, and others, but it differs from their notions as well as from twentieth-century expositions of pre-reflective experience by its emphasis on the non-individuated character and the seamless development of such experience. It is the pre-individual basis of a systematic and all-comprehensive process. If we call his view a “theory” of experience, we should be aware that from his standpoint the theory is a natural outgrowth of unitary experience and not a reflection on it proceeding from a different source. The question of how pure experience grounds reflective knowledge would occupy Nishida in works composed after An Inquiry Into the Good.

The directness, relative simplicity, and systematic approach of this book made it perhaps the most accessible and popular of his works; and many commentators have tended to emphasize it more than later writings, despite Nishida's own misgivings about its latent psychologism. Indeed Nishida's initial position anticipates several developments in his later thought. For example, the early statements of experience prior to a subject experiencing and an object experienced are re-formulated in the late 1920s as “seeing without a seer, hearing without a hearer.” The nullification of the self in pure experience is later expressed as seeing the self from the perspective of the world, understood phenomenologically as a determining horizon of experience. The notion of the individual as determined by the universal concealed within (Nishida 1990, 18) pre-figures Nishida's later adaptation of Hegel's concrete universal; the later works speak of the individual as the self-determination of the universal. Finally, the ways in which pure experience can be said to be most concrete, to enfold all reality and indicate its undifferentiated ground, reflect methods that characterize Nishida's philosophy as a whole.

2.2 Self-Awareness

The question of how reflective thought is grounded in pure experience finds a tentative answer in Nishida's next essays. How can pure experience develop into reflective thought that would seem to interrupt and interpret it from an external vantage point? The self-reflection known as self-consciousness or self-awareness (jikaku) provides an answer. There is a form of consciousness that inherently reflects or mirrors itself within itself, so that there is no difference between that which reflects and what is reflected. In self-awareness, immediate experiencing and reflection are unified. In epistemological terms, knower and known are the same, and this instance of unity serves as the prototype of all knowledge. Two points may prevent a misunderstanding of Nishida's position here. First, his talk of self-awareness and self-reflection does not imply the pre-given existence of some personal self that at times may be self-conscious. Secondly, if consciousness is not placed in a pre-given self, it also is not placed in the objective world as a complex of brain cells or as the effect of material objects on the mind or brain. As in modern phenomenology, consciousness for Nishida means simply that which makes manifest or, to use a visual metaphor, that which illuminates. To emphasize its non-objectifiable character, Nishida later will place consciousness “in” nothingness, that is, consider it a “form” of nothingness. In the meantime, he formulated it as the activity that precedes but ultimately unifies self and world. Knowledge of things in the world begins with the differentiation of unitary consciousness into knower and known and ends with self and things becoming one again. Such unification takes form not only in knowing but in the valuing (of truth) that directs knowing, the willing that directs action, and the feeling or emotive reach that directs sensing. In this stage of his work Nishida, influenced by Schopenhauer, considered “absolute will” as the preeminent form of self-awareness and saw it as the source of acts of moral decision and of the creation and appreciation of art. Since the activity of the will eludes reflection, however, Nishida eventually abandoned this formulation of a unitary source.

3. Theory of Universals and the Logic of Place

Nishida's epistemological motivation gradually gave way to an examination of common ontological assumptions that underlie epistemology in the Western philosophical tradition. Not content merely to expose such assumptions, however, Nishida formulated a novel ontology of experience and self-awareness that would give them logical necessity.

Considering what is taken as the ordinary consciousness of objects, Nishida's analysis questions both the notion of consciousness and that of objects. We can explicate Nishida's first concern, with the ontology of consciousness, in the following way: If the basic form of consciousness did not have the reflexivity of self-awareness then the “consciousness” of objects would be blind, as it were, like a mechanical or neurological reaction to stimuli with no awareness whatsoever, and no way to account for awareness. The problem appears in attempts to define consciousness in a non-circular way. A definition of consciousness as a state of awareness or sentience, for example, or a state in which there is something it feels like to be in that state, merely replaces consciousness with its synonyms. In a sense awareness is irreducible, but it has a logical structure that accounts for its connection to a world of objects. Structurally, awareness mirrors itself in itself, in a manner analogous to the way an infinite set mirrors itself in its equivalent subsets, or to the way an ideal map mirrors itself in all accurate representations of that map.[2] (Note that the English awareness can be used without the word self but the Japanese word that translates as self-awareness is an inseparable compound, ji-kaku.) If such self-awareness is to have logical necessity, it cannot be explained as a contingent property of a particular mind or consciousness that sometimes reflects on itself, that is, as a second order consciousness of being conscious of something.

Similarly, if self-awareness is to be an awareness of more than merely oneself, it cannot be interior to the self alone. Modern epistemology's solution was to split the world in two, mind and nature, and then to see the mind as a mirror of nature, and ideas as representations of real objects. Nishida's solution was to see the world as mirroring itself in all the things “in the world.” Whatever is “in the world” is a mirroring of the world. In this sense it is the world that is “self-aware” or self-reflexive; and there is no outside to it. An individual's “self-awareness” is a partial mirroring of the world; Nishida later described the individual self as a focal point of the world. While he was still thinking in terms of consciousness, however, Nishida avoided pinpointing awareness and spoke of the world as a field of consciousness to indicate the extension of the term beyond the individual self. This field is similar to Kant's Bewußtsein überhaupt, in that it functions as the condition for the possibility of particular acts of consciousness, but unlike Kant's notion that turns everything into an object of consciousness, its reflexive structure allows it to take itself into account without making it another object.

We may use Nishida's own terms to explain his second concern, the way that objects ordinarily function in judgments. In what Nishida alternatively called the logic of objects or subjective logic, objects of consciousness are made the subject of propositions or judgments, and are specified by predicating properties of the (grammatical) subject. Eventually a subject is reached that cannot itself be predicated of anything else, recalling Aristotle's hypokeimenon or individual substance that can be subject but never predicate. Even when modern epistemology eschewed or at least modified Aristotle's notion of substance as a substrate for contingent properties, it appealed to substances in the sense that they define the primary subject of a judgment. Similar to phenomenologists, Nishida wanted to account for the consciousness that posits such substances and underlies the subject of a judgment. Essays in From That Which Acts to That Which Sees (1927) and subsequent works invert Aristotle's notion of the hypokeimenon and propose that consciousness is the “transcendental predicate” that can never be a subject; in other words consciousness in act can never be made an object of consciousness. Nishida is aware of the paradox of such formulations that would make consciousness the subject of sentences that describe it, and he sometimes resorts to explicitly paradoxical descriptions such as “seeing without a seer” and “seeing the form of the formless, hearing the voice of the voiceless.” But he again also uses the straightforward metaphor, the “field of consciousness,” to indicate its non-subjective and non-objectifiable character. Consciousness cannot be grasped as the property of an individual substance nor as anything like a substance or underlying substrate itself. It functions as the field that is the opening of world and self.

If judgments describe things and states of affairs and thus would give us access to reality by setting themselves over-against that reality, we must step back as it were and consider a wider reality that includes judgments. In other words, we must place judgments that predicate universals of things in a wider field of predication, in the “transcendental predicate” of consciousness. Here Nishida might have further developed a phenomenology of the agency of predication, but instead he moves to a more logical account of its scope and developed what he called a predicate logic. He thinks of universals as fields of possibility that becomes specified or determined (more accurately, that determine themselves) in their particular instantiations. There is a necessary hierarchy of concreteness among universals that Nishida expresses as the order of topoi or places (basho). Most abstract are the universals that serve as predicates in particular judgments. Judging or predication in turn takes place in the topos of consciousness, which is further concretized as the universal or topos of reflexive self-awareness wherein acts of seeing, knowing, desiring and willing take place. And just as the world of self-awareness enfolds the world of nature described in judgments, it in turn is enfolded in the topos (Nishida calls it “the intelligible world”) within which the creative self pursues ideal values like truth, beauty and goodness. Here Nishida echoes the medieval, seemingly all-inclusive transcendentalia that transcend all categories. In his terms, all predication would be a mirroring of the transcendentals of being and of the one (unum), the true (verum), and the good (bonum). But those transcendentals, insofar as they themselves all elude predication, actually point to a more inclusive and undifferentiated topos, absolute nothingness.

In summary, Nishida initially formulated his logic of place or topos to counter Neo-Kantian epistemology that took knowledge to be the subject's form-ruled construction of an objective world. He sought not only to undermine the distinctions between subjective and objective but also to place both sides within a more comprehensive and concrete conception. That is, while he first construed knowledge on the model of self-awareness in which self reflects itself within itself, he also felt compelled to find a locus of non-differentiation behind the distinction between such awareness and things seen from its vantage point. As non-differentiated and inclusive, that locus is field-like, a metaphor that Nishida at first replaced with the notion of topos or “place” (basho). Then he placed the topos of self-awareness in the even more inclusive and concrete value-forming world. That world of creative activity anticipates what Nishida eventually considered the ultimate topos that defies description, predication, or determination by something beyond or different from it. His logic of place offered an alternative to the logic of substances presupposed in much traditional metaphysics.

The logical schema of topoi is paralleled by an ontological account. Nishida articulated the topoi also in terms of what we may call a me-ontology, from the Greek meon or non-being. The topos of being describes the world of nature. The topos of relative nothingness comprises the field of consciousness that is no-thing with respect to the things of which it is conscious. This nothingness however is still opposed to being, and so differs from the absolute nothingness that underlies both sides of the opposition. Here and elsewhere Nishida plays on the word for absolute in Japanese, zettai, which literally means breaking through or overcoming opposition. His premise is that the meaning of “to be” is “to be within”; the ultimate within is the topos of absolute nothingness.

3.1 Absolute Nothingness

The topos of absolute nothingness is the ultimate “within which” all reality takes place. It can be understood as an alternative to a transcendent determiner of the world as conceptualized, for example, in medieval philosophy's notion of God, Fichte's transcendental ego, or Husserl's transcendental subjectivity. Nishida did use the language of transcendence to explain absolute nothingness, saying it transcended the opposition between being and non-being for example; but such language did not indicate any thing, power, or consciousness beyond the world. Absolute nothingness is infinitely determinable and its determinates form the actual world, but this “self-determination” occurs “without anything that does the determining,” like an agency without an agent. Equally paradoxical are the positive descriptions Nishida gives it, in spite of the implicit claim that it defies description. Rather than a mere absence of being, meaning, or function, absolute nothingness is active and creative in forming the actual world; and it manifests or awakens to itself through self-awareness. It is the foundation of the world and of the self which is a focal point of the world; but it is an uncommon kind of foundation in that it functions through self-negation. It cannot be called “absolute” unless it negates any particular determination of it and simultaneously enfolds them all. It is the universal of universals. Nishida was not able to combine these various descriptions into one coherent notion, but they partially converge in the sense of an undifferentiated whole that includes all its differentiations.

3.2 Analogies to the Logic of Place

Nishida intended his theory of place or topos to provide a logical foundation for his previous philosophy of experience and self-awareness. Several overlapping models help make sense of this logic. Nishida drew upon some models explicitly, for example, Plato's notion of the receptacle (chora) of ideas in the Timeus and Aristotle's adaptation in his notion of topos in On the Soul. Another model Nishida used early on was the notion of fields in modern physics and relativity theory, in which space-time is a field inseparable from the physical objects within it and determining how (when and where) they exist. Analogously, for Nishida, all perceived and conceptualized objects are “in” the “field of consciousness” (Nishida borrowed the term from William James). Another early model was the logic of universals that serve as predicates. Particulars or individuals are placed within universals to specify their difference from other particulars or individuals, and less extensive universals are placed within more extensive ones, until one reaches the ultimate, boundless universal called nothingness. This “transcendental predicate” cannot become the subject matter of any description or proposition in positive terms, but it is ultimately entailed by every specification.

Other anaolgies, although not explicitly mentioned by Nishida, neverthreless serve to clarify his logic at least in part. A model of interpretation is relevant: every text has its context, which in turn may be made a text or thematized by appealing to a further context. There is no final context that can be specified without referring to yet another context. This ultimately unspecifiable context in Nishida's terms is called absolute nothingness. The analysis of successful physical theories provides yet another model. Each of Nishida's successive topoi serves as a level of analysis that resolves contradictions on less comprehensive levels, as Einstein's relativity theory encompasses Newtonian theory and resolves contradictions in it. But for Nishida the final level that holds differences or contradictions together is ultimately unanalyzable absolute nothingness. Despite Nishida's relative ignorance of modern logic and his identification of predicates with universals, we may also find parallels to his logic of place in mathematical logic: an axiomatic system is a topos that, according to Gödel's theorem, is not self-explanatory or self-generating since it contains undecidable propositions, and there is no final system with a self-explanatory foundation. Nishida's absolute nothingness is the place beyond discursive determination. Discourse analysis also suggests parallels: it analyzes how a discourse is framed or directed to an audience with certain interests, but the analysis too has its own frame that does not terminate in any definitive or final frame. Foundationalist theories of knowledge and reality might seem to provide a model of Nishida's logic of place, but in Nishida the metaphor of grounding gives way to that of placing or locating, and in any case the ultimate place is more an Abgrund or void than a positive ground.

4. Theory of the Historical World

It is clear that Nishida proposed his various topoi not as static contexts terminating in an ultimate genus, but rather as a dynamic process of contextualization or world-formation. This always implied the temporality of the “self-aware” world, and not merely time as a dimension of the physical world. Nevertheless, Nishida did not explicitly take account of the historical nature of the world until the early 1930s, after his critics, in particular his younger colleague Tanabe Hajime and his former student Tosaka Jun, turned his attention to the historical dimension of reality and human action. The critics suggested that Nishida ignored the world determined by individual human action by replacing individual human subjectivity with trans-individual experience or consciousness and eventually shifting human agency to the world as a universal. In response, Nishida began to articulate the world as a dialectical universal. The basic idea is that the world is a place of mediation between acting individuals. It is not a transcendent topos that one-sidedly determines individuals but a topos that arises with them through their creative interactions. There are two sides of this idea to consider: the world and the interacting individuals.

We conceptualize the formation of the world as history, but must think of history in terms of the logic of place and not simply as a temporal process. At any moment the world in process mirrors the indeterminacy of absolute nothingness and contains the conditions for novelty and future possibilities; however it also encompasses everything that has already been determined. In Nishida's words, the historical world proceeds “from the created to the creating.” And it so proceeds not in a linear fashion, as if viewed from some point outside the world, but rather “in” every moment or, conversely, out of an “eternal now” or “absolute present” that describes the topos of its continual creation. This present in its absolute presence is the place where history can happen precisely because it enfolds the past though is not entirely determined by the past and it holds the future as infinite possibility. It is eternal or absolute in the sense that it contains infinite time by negating (fixed) time (NKZ VIII, 76ff.). Viewed in terms of the absolute present—the ever-present juncture between a determined past and an open future—the world appears as a “continuity of discontinuities.”

Similarly, we conceptualize the historical world sometimes as produced out of nature by human work and activity, sometimes as producing the individuals who interact in it, but we should think of it primarily as the mediating place of interactive creation. Individuals create their identities through their interactions in the world, and that world is continually created with them. (Nishida's idea of a mediating place finds a distant analogue in Einstein's theory of gravitational space, where space is not independent of the physical objects in it but rather is shaped by them). The historical world forms itself through the actions of embodied individuals who mutually form each other.

Gradually Nishida came to recognize the importance of embodiment for human interaction and communication, and introduced the notion of the expressive or historical body. The body is not primarily a physical object and product of the natural world, but a historical subject and co-creator of the world. Insofar as the many historical bodies of the one world differ from each another, they too form a “discontinuous continuity.” Nishida was fond of calling this type of unity, which holds together differences without sublating them, a “self-identity of absolute contradictories.”

Two parts of Nishida's theory deserve further explication: his novel conception of action-intuition and his explanation of the relations between self & other and one & many.

4.1 Action-Intuition

In attempting to explain the formation and working of the historical world, Nishida coined the term “action-oriented intuition” (kôi-teki chokkan). His texts suggest a reciprocity between action and intution, so that we could also speak of “intuition-oriented action” or simply of “action-intution,” another case of an ”identity of contraditories.” Here again Nishida sought to discover the topos or common space that underlies a distinction, this time between intuition or seeing as a more or less passive reception of the world and its objects, and action as the human-engendered production of the world. The common space is the action-intuition or performative intuition exemplified by artistic creation. We might conceive of the artist as a pre-given entity who views, is inspired by, and utilizes pre-given things in the world around her as she then goes about making her work. The production of the work would then be a causative process contributing in turn to the production of the historical world. We might also understand the work as an objectification of the artist, an expression of her inner spirit that externalizes and actualizes it. Nishida envisioned an alternative: the artist takes in or intuits the world and transforms or enacts it, both of which are but two moments in a single unfolding—not only of the world but of the artist as well. Both artist and work are formed mutually and are reflected in one another. While this mutual formation can be described in terms of a causative process taking time, with the person first intuiting or internalizing and then acting or externalizing, Nishida described it in terms of the place or topos wherein intuiting entails acting and acting intuiting, and wherein the difference between internal and external collapses. Granted, the work can take on a life of its own as an object of appreciation or criticism, but it always carries its reference to the artist, as the identity of the artist likewise cannot be separated from her work. Artistic creation is only one example of such poiesis, as Nishida called it. Performative intuition is also operative in praxis or political-social action, even in scientific knowing, insofar as it grasps the world as including the self. Nishida emphasized that action-intuition is a bodily achievement, the performance of an embodied individual who in turn is formed by the world; again, both body and world must be conceived as historical. While “action-intuition” pertains to the dialectical way the individual historical body forms and is formed by the world, the way the world forms is described by the phrase “from the created to the creating.”

4.2 Theory of Relations: Self and Other, One and Many

Self and Other

We can shift the focus from the action of the individual historical body to the interaction between distinct individuals, once again with the world as the mediating space of mutual formation. In fact, Nishida maintains, the individual precisely as distinct entails a plurality of interrelated individuals. The relation between “I and Thou” was the first part that Nishida considered, although he continued to intertwine that relation with an internal relation in self-awareness. Where his previous analysis of individual self-awareness described it as a self-reflection of the universal of self-awareness, his description now incorporated the dimension of recognition. My recognition of you as not me makes me who I am, and your recognition of me as not-you makes you who you are. Each is a relative other to the self. This Hegelian analysis is incomplete, however, without the recognition of the absolute other in the self's interior. This other, recalling Nishida's notion of absolute, does not exclude the self; rather it constitutes self-identity as continually negating what it has been. My personal self-awareness arises not when I recognize my identity through memory, for example, nor simply when I encounter an other I; rather it arises in experiencing the groundlessness of my own existence, in recognizing what is absolutely other to a substantial self-same self. Recognizing the absolute other within constitutes not simply a reflexive self-awareness but a self-awakening, a realizing of the “true self.” (Nishida's term jikaku translates as self-awakening, a Buddhist reading he undoubtedly intends, as well as self-awareness.) Nishida allows for the Buddhist view that there is actually no self to awaken by referring to the self-awakening of absolute nothingness; its awakening is the awakening of the “true self.” Absolute nothingness in action, as it were, entails a negation (of a substantial, self-same self) and an affirmation (of the true self). In the manner of self-negation, I am one with you while not being the same as you. Not only between us does a “continuity of absolute discontinuities” obtain, but also within each of us, insofar as our identity is in continual formation. In the end, then, Nishida denies the substantiality of the self and rejects both the radical alterity of other persons and the transcendence of an absolute other, in the guise of God for example.

One and Many

Eventually Nishida saw that the “I-Thou” relation does not exhaust the discontinuous continuity of our being. We must also take into account the third party, the “He” or relative other who forms at least an implicit reference to every “I-you” interaction. Nishida seems intent not so much on explaining alterity, however, as preserving interdependent individuality, which of course still requires difference. He has in mind the individuation of all phenomena but begins with the prototype of individuality, the self-aware human person, who is more concretely an individual than other single living beings, not to speak of individuated atoms or particles at the most abstract level. What determines individuality at the most concrete level is the one historical world that functions dialectically as the place or medium of interaction among innumerable individuals. The world is one yet many; individuals are many yet one in their mutual determination. (Nishida uses the Buddhist connective soku to indicate the relation between one and many and to emphasize their inherent reversibility: one soku many, many soku one. Otherwise, however, his terminology in this part of his philosophy is often more Hegelian than Buddhist.) Although he preferred spatial to temporal conceptions, referring to the world as a topos, it is not too far a stretch of Nishida's language to think of world in a verbal sense as the activity of individuals interacting and mutually determining one another. His own formulations once again make use of the pattern of an undifferentiated whole differentiating or determining itself, in this case as distinct individuals. He tries to reconcile the non-temporal notion of topos or place with the dialectical activity of the world once again in a 1941 essay “On Self-Awareness,” by recalling his previous structure of self-reflecting or self-mirroring: the world as topos is a kind of contradictory self-identity wherein individuals coexist as different and yet equivalent, just as a self-reflecting system mirrors itself within itself in its equivalent but different images. The notion of self-awakening, the other possible reading of jikaku (self-awareness) that is such an important part of the I-You relation, is relatively neglected in the discussions of the one and the many.

5. Nishida's Theology: the Finite Self meets the Absolute

Toward the end of his life, perhaps thinking of the significance of death for understanding individuality, perhaps re-considering the theme of self-awakening as a kind of death and re-birth, Nishida delved deeper into the relation between the individual finite human self and the absolute or God. In his view, this relation logically defines the place of religion. Experientially it comes to the fore in death. We will consider the meaning of death first, then the nature of God or the absolute in relation to the finite self.

The theme of personal death is absent in Nishida's early work on pure experience and self-awareness, and mentioned only abstractly in essays on the historical world and the self, for example: “In absolute dialectics, mediation as absolute negation is mediation as absolute death, living by dying absolutely” (NKZ VII, 314). In the last completed essay, “The Logic of Place and the Religious Worldview” (1945), Nishida is more experiential. Death is not an event at the end of one's life but penetrates life at each and every moment. It is the ever-present opening, so to speak, where one's utter finitude can come to light. Insofar as this is the finitude of the individual self, it also implies a logic of individuation where the role of other relative selves is dimished. “I am myself by knowing my own death” (NKZ XI, 420) is both a declaration of existential self-awareness and a statement of what makes me uniquely me. What makes me an individual is not merely my differences from others nor my sameness with some essential core; it is precisely what most makes me not me, what negates me, in any moment of action. In this context, death signifies the self-negation of the finite self.

If death is an ever-present opening, the other side of that opening so to speak is the absolute. To die is to stand vis-à-vis the absolute. In the discussion of the “I-Thou” relation, this term appeared as the absolute other in one's interior; here it shifts to the absolute in contradistinction to finite beings. Nishida calls it God as well, but makes clear that he is not referring to a personal, transcendent being. If transcendence is involved, it is a going beyond by going within. He also implies that it is not synonymous with absolute nothingness. If nothingness as opposed to being is implied, it is in the verbal sense of self-negating. The absolute arises through its own self-negation and inclusion of the relative self. It does not die in the sense that relative beings do, for it embraces all others whereas they by being individual exclude others. God cannot be not wholly transcendent to or exclusive of the self or the world. Even Nishida's early work, An Inquiry Into the Good , had spoken of God in a way that undermined the notion of a transcendent being outside the world; it conceived of God as the infinite activity of unification at work behind the articulations of spirit and nature out of pure experience. In the final essay, Nishida admits that his notion of an absolute totally embracing the relative, even in its diabolical forms, is more in tune with a Mahayana Buddhist tradition than with the Christian sources that inspired him. To express the relation between a God and the relative finite self, Nishida introduces a new term, “inverse correspondence” or, we might say, contrary respondence (gyaku-taiô). This relaition is another instance of opposites held together in a unity, a kind of “self-identity of contradictories,” but this time not a symmetrical one. The more one faces one's death, the negation of one's life as an individual, the more acutely one is self-aware as an individual. The closer the finite self approaches God the stronger the difference between them becomes. This peculiar kind of relation implies that God and the relative self are inseparable but never dissolve into one another. If their distinction entails an undifferentiated source of their difference, an absolute nothingness, then the more that source is emphasized the stronger the distinction holds.

6. Political Theory: Religion, Culture, and Nations

Nishida's discussion of the absolute and the finite self does not neglect the notion of religion and its relation to culture and the nation- state. These themes already formed an integral part of his theory of the historical world but became all the more pressing in a time of world war. The concern with death was perhaps as much a political as a personal matter for Nishida, whose health was quickly failing. In one respect, he distanced himself from his milieu where everyday life was dominated by an authoritarian state. He focuses on the individual in relation to an absolute that in no way is subject to an absolutist state. His notion of the essentiality of religion is remarkably individualistic, removed from all social contingencies. He locates the core of religion in the heart of the individual: religious awareness arises in one's knowing one's own death.

On the other hand, Nishida recognizes that religion is a social and cultural phenomenon, and that the contemporary individual is a subject of a state. He seems however to reverse any implied priority of culture over religion and state over individual: it is because culture is religious in its core that we find religion in every culture; and obedience to the nation must be based on true religious awareness. To be sure, writing under a totalitarian government in 1945, Nishida couches his statements carefully in language that would deter his imprisonment on grounds of lèse majesté. He also says, for example, that insofar as the individual self is historically formed it must be understood as a nationally identified self; and further that it is selfish merely to seek one's own peace of mind. In the end, Nishida remains ambiguous about the extent to which individuals are, or should be, formed by the will of the state, and whether religion can or should criticize the state or society.

To say that culture is essentially religious means that it too is an “affirmation of the self-negating absolute” (NKZ XI, 458). Religion and culture are each framed in the singular here, as something essential to all religions and cultures in the plural. At this level culture and religion function almost as regulative ideas. They are not the result but the telos of the one world forming its self-identity. Nishida's formulations recapitulate much of his theory of the historical world. As the various ethnic peoples in the world become aware of themselves as constituents of a global world, that is, as they become “world-historical” nations, they mirror the formation of the historical world. The world become self-aware or realized as a globally historical world will be mirrored variously in each nation.

If we hear Hegelian echoes in these formulations, we should equally note Nishida's difference from Hegel: the formation of the “world-historical” world does not imply a hierarchy of cultures evolving greater and greater rationality; and it is exemplified in the everyday, as Nishida says, not the exceptional. Nishida's global world seems more open to a genuine pluralism of cultures, world religions and national identities. Each can retain its uniqueness but to do so each must become self-aware by becoming aware of the plurality, by relativizing or negating itself. This self-negation creates the space in which true intercultural encounter can take place. Nishida implies that the proper relation between cultures is parallel to that between “I and Thou.” In simpler language: “A true world culture will be formed only by various cultures preserving their own respective viewpoints, but simultaneously developing themselves through global mediation” (VII, pp. 452-3).

Nevertheless a special place is accorded the nation of Japan. The Japanese nation is in a position to foster not only an awareness of the East but also a global awareness on the part of every nation. For Japan is the nation in Asia that has best retained Asian traditions while adapting Western technology and values. In the new world order Japan can stand for Asia, and stand against the domination of the West. Nishida's language, perhaps deliberately ambiguous to avoid incarceration, ostensibly wavers as to whether this special mission describes Japan's calling, what it can be for the world, or refers to its current practice in its war-time struggle with other nations. A charitable reading of Nishida's statements on the special place of Japan interprets them as advocating that his country overcome its outdated vision of itself as a colonizing nation, and embrace a global conception of itself as a nation interacting with other nations in a world of mutually defining equals.[3] A more critical reading interprets these statements as falsely absolutizing the particular nation of Japan in that in the name of Japan they embrace other nations of the East and then abstractly oppose the East to the West. Similar challenges face us in the twenty-first century not only in a world of contesting nations with different religious and cultural traditions but also in single nations of multicultural composition.

7. Methods in Nishida's Thought

Nishida composed essays on interrelated themes rather than sequential and tightly edited books. Major essays were subsequently collected and published as books, but often do not form chapters of a single coherent work. Instead of investigating a problem in a series of straightforward linear arguments, he tended to write in spirals that kept circling back on previous formulations and reworking them in new contexts. His style is akin to the manner in which one repeatedly practices a traditional Japanese art like calligraphy, poetry or even Zen mediation: working at a particular activity or expression, getting better and better at it without erasing one's previous attempts. It is possible, however, to discern four methods that pervade his philosophy and make it easier for the reader to follow the train of his thought.

First is Nishida's way of taking the more inclusive as the more concrete, and the more restricted as the more abstract. This makes sense insofar as abstraction involves removal of parts, but Nishida also uses this method to reverse the usual order of things in explanatory schemas or hierarchies. The historical world lived by human beings, for example, is more concrete than the material world studied by physics since the historical, human world comprehends (in both senses of the word) the merely physical and can never be reduced to it. Inbetween these two worlds is the biological realm of life forms, less concrete than the human world but more concrete than the physcial world.

Second is Nishida's recourse to the explanatory schema of wholes that reflect themselves in their parts. Here Nishida adapts the idea of self-representative systems presented in Josiah Royce and Richard Dedekind's idea of an infinite system reflected in its parts. For Nishida, if there are no parts outside a whole, its evident differentiation must be explained. After his first major book, An Inquiry into the Good, Nishida came to explain this differentiating development not in terms of a temporal process but as the self-reflective or self-mirroring structure of a whole. Knowledge, for example, is not a matter of two disparate realities, a knowing mind and a known object, conforming to one another, but a single concrete reality that “reflects itself in itself” on differing levels that give rise to the more abstract notions of knowing subject and known objects. And after Nishida described self-awareness (jikaku) as the activity of self reflecting itself within itself, he came to speak of other structural wholes, including place or topos and even the world itself, as “self-aware” (jikaku-teki) insofar as they reflected themselves within themselves.

Third is Nishida's way of elaborating this “within” in terms of enfolding or enwrapping, as a whole enfolds or contains parts that partially reflect it , or as the universal of color encompasses that of red, for example. Nishida also referred to more limited realms as particularizations or “self-determinations” of more inclusive realms, but he often used the metaphor of wrapping to describe the manner of determination. The ultimate universal or enfolding whole has no determinate features; it is “nothingness” (mu).

The fourth method is Nishida's way of treating oppositions and distinctions, emphasizing alternatively their undifferentiated ground or their irreducible relation. He often sought to return oppositions and distinctions to the non-differentiated condition that underlies them, ultimately to the nothingness that gives rise to (or determines itself as) various distinctions. Although terms translating as “ground” or “foundation” are found throughout his works, this emphasis undermines any recourse to a founding principle or entity wholly transcendent to, and thus ultimately different from, the world or reality. “Absolute nothingness” may be understood as the lack of any positively definable transcendent ground. When for example Nishida writes “absolute nothingness transcends all that is, but at the same time all that is arises through it” (NKZ IX, 6), we may interpret him as pointing to an undifferentiated source beyond the distinctions it gives rise to, a source that is necessarily entailed by their being brought together precisely as distinct from one another.

The emphasis on relation similarly undermines any attempt to reduce opposed or distinguished terms to some element common to both. In mid career Nishida used the language of dialectics to describe relations, while insisting that the opposed terms were not sublated into a higher unity. Later he used expressions like “the self-identity of absolute contradictories” to describe the way in which opposed terms are held together, the many and the one for example. His notion of an “inverse correspondence” also reflects this method. Nishida's emphasis on relation modifies his notion of self-reflective structures to make it clear that they maintain difference within a whole and are not simply self-replicating or recursive. This is noticeable in his last essay, for example, when he describes individual selves as focal points where world reflects itself in itself (NKZ XI, 378). His rejection of a positive foundation or substratum, and his insistence on irreducible but inseparable terms in relation, explain why the holistic tendency evident in his methodology does not devolve into a simple monism, and why many commentators refer to his philosophy as non-dualist instead.

8. The Unity and Development of Nishida's Philosophy

8.1 The Attempt to Unify the Varying Themes

A grasp of both the unity and the development of Nishida's thought is also crucial to understanding it. As should be obvious, Nishida's thought underwent extensive changes over the course of four decades. Less evident is that the varying themes are united by a deepening of the same basic insights. The Preface to the third volume of his Philosophical Essays published in 1939 gives us his own view of the unity of his progression: “It is said that that I repeatedly discuss the same problems, and [indeed] from An Inquiry into the Good on my objective has been to see things and think things from the most direct and fundamental standpoint - to grasp all things from the standpoint of whence they come and whither they go.” (NKZ IX, 3). A Preface written three years earlier to the reprint of An Inquiry into the Good identifies some of the crucial connections in the changing thematic: the standpoint of pure experience articulated in that maiden work developed into that of absolute will, and later into the notion of place or topos, concretized further as a dialectical universal, which in turn gets expressed as action-intuition. “That which I called” the world of pure experience I have now come to think of as the world of historical reality. The world of action-intuition—the world of poiesis—is none other than the world of pure experience” (Nishida 1990, xxxiii).

Since Nishida composed his essays in a language and for a culture that had known philosophy as a distinct discipline for little more than half a century, his view of that discipline is equally crucial for understanding the unity and progression of his thought. Although his view likewise evolved over the course of his life, it reveals one abiding feature: philosophy should be not only the articulation but also the awareness of the most fundamental unities of experience, knowledge, action, and ultimately self and world. Relatively early in his career, when he was still under the sway of Fichte, the Neo-Kantians, and Bergson he defined philosophy as science [gakumon], i.e. unified conceptual knowledge, more specifically the first and universal science that “reflects on the basic concepts of the particular sciences in general and constructs of them one system of knowledge.” Yet “its object of study is not simply the fundamental concepts of reality. Basic normative notions such as truth, goodness and beauty must of course enter into philosophical study. Philosophy not only clarifies basic notions of reality, but must also elucidate the ideals of human life, the ”ought” itself. Philosophy is not simply a worldview; it is a view of human life.” Within his extended definition Nishida, commenting on Bergson, clarifies the role of intuition so crucial to his own thought: “intuition” as such cannot be called philosophy. Even if its contents can derive from intuition, philosophy has its raison d'être when intuition takes the form of conceptual knowledge.” (Nishida 1923, 668) Then later in his career Nishida paradoxically formed concepts of the limits of such knowledge and formulated his philosophy of absolute nothingness that is ultimately mirrored in self-awareness. Such awareness became a task for philosophy or, more specifically, for the philosopher. Throughout his life Nishida's own practice of philosophy attempted to realize an abiding intuition expressed in the various terms he recounts in the Preface cited above. In that sense his thought is systematic, while not forming a closed system. It is a consistent attempt to re-conceptualize philosophy, to reframe the terms in which many philosophers think about self and world. This is what is meant by saying that Nishida would have us think from the perspective of the world rather than the “I.”

8.2 Stages in Nishida's Thought

Many readers of Nishida have attempted to delineate stages in the development of his philosophy (Elberfeld 1999, 71ff.); others have rejected a division into discrete stages (Heisig 2001, 104). As a heuristic approach to a summary of his thought, we may broadly distinguish three stages. The first is defined by an overwhelming conviction that concrete reality is at base unitary and can be articulated from the standpoint of consciousness. We have seen that Nishida successively names its most basic form “pure experience,” “self-awareness,” and “absolute free will.” Each of these exemplifies the fundamental reality from which all else becomes manifest through a process of differentiation. In An Inquiry Into the Good (1911), pure experience describes the primal undifferentiated form that subsequently dirempts into differentiated forms: experiencing subject and experienced objects, intellectual intuition and reflective thought, objectified nature and objectifying spirit—all on their way to a higher unity. Intuition and Reflection in Self-Awareness (1917) shifts that idealistic description to epistemological questions It explicates self-awareness as the form in which immediate experience or intuition and reflection are unified, the form that reflects itself within itself and gives rise not only to differentiating judgments but to differently experienced systems such as spirit and matter and to “worlds” such as art and religion. Eventually Nishida proposes that the most basic form of self-awareness is not a kind of knowing at all, but a willing or “absolute free will” evident in valuing and creating. He develops this proposal in Problems of Consciousness (1920) and Art and Morality (1923). Nishida later said his these first attempts, formulated from the standpoint of consciousness, invited the charges of psychologism (Nishida 1990, xxxi), and mysticism (Nishida 1987, xxiii), and he abandoned the language of pure experience and absolute will. It is clear, however, that his initial convictions persisted a good deal longer: the most concrete form of reality is undifferentiated, and consciousness as the manifestation of reality is inseparable from it.

The second stage, broadly speaking, is defined by the standpoint of place or topos (basho). This involves the attempts to articulate levels of differentiation and place them in more and more inclusive circles (to use one of Nishida's metaphors) until one reaches the most concrete and comprehensive circle, a circle without circumference whose center is everywhere. Nishida calls each such circle a place or topos, which allow things to be and to be seen as what they are. The final topos places self-awareness in the world of action and expression which contextualizes it, and ultimately in absolute nothingness Nishida refers to the ultimate topos, alluding to Buddhist doctrine, as “the form of the formless,” clearly replacing earlier attempts to describe the basic form of concrete reality in positive and subjectivistic terms such as pure experience, self-awareness and absolute free will, This stage is evident in essays in From That Which Acts to That Which Sees (1927) and The Self-aware System of Universals (1930), and extends to much of The Self-aware Determination of Nothingness (1932). A Hegelian language of dialectics gradually became more and more prominent in his formulations, as he turned his attention to the place of individuals interacting in the world. He wrote of individuals as the “self-determinations” of the universal of self-awareness; and of absolute nothingness as a dialectical universal.

The third stage sharpens the focus on the dialectical world as a place of mediation between interacting individuals as historically embodied selves. Nishida now conceptualizes the world as the historical manifestation of absolute nothingness. This stage represents what is for Nishida the most comprehensive and concrete standpoint, that of the historical world. The world unfolds “from the created to the creating,” not in a straightforward linear progression but out of an “absolute present” that in each moment holds together past determinations and decisions for the future. The historical world as such is a “self-identity of contradictories.” The self realizes itself not in knowing itself as distinct from other selves or things but through forms of self-negation. One form calls for the self to recognize the absolute other in its own core to relate truly to the Thou or other relative selves. Another form calls for one to give oneself over to things or “become one with” the things it would know—through “action-intuition,” seeing them by interacting with them and interacting by seeing them from their own perspective. In this stage relations come to the fore: the relations between I and Thou, the one and the many, the expressive self and its expressions, the Japanese nation and other nations. Each of these relations constitutes a self-identity of contradictories and resists a monistic interpretation. This stage, understood heuristically, stretches from the final essays in The Self-aware Determination of Nothingness through The World of Action and The Dialectical World (collected as The Fundamental Problems of Philosophy, 1934), seven volumes of Philosophical Essays (1935-45) and several political writings, to Nishida last essay, “The Logic of Place and the Religious Worldview”(1945). The final essay returns to the theme of religious awareness and makes more explicit the Buddhist references, as well as the Christian, influence, latent in much of Nishida's philosophy. The focus on death and finitude, while consistent with the idea of self-negation, suggests a shift of standpoint, but Nishida's final reflections are too brief to be called a new stage in his philosophy.

9. Nishida's Influence

Nishida is often called the father of the Kyoto School of philosophy because of his influence on a group of thinkers who were his students or younger colleagues. Best known outside Japan are his colleague and critic, Tanabe Hajime, frequently considered the School's co-founder, and his student Nishitani Keiji. As a “school” the group comprises a rather fuzzy set that includes Marxist-leaning former students such as Miki Kiyoshi and Tosaka Jun, more nationalistic students like Kôyama Iwao and Kôsaka Masaaki, and lesser known but close disciples like Mutai Risaku and Shimomura Toratarô. Other colleagues, students and friends outside the School proper nevertheless show the impact of Nishida's ideas: the Zen Buddhist scholar-teachers D. T. Suzuki and Hisamatsu Shin'ichi, the ethical theorist Watsuji Tetsurô, and Kuki Shûzô, the interpreter of Japanese aesthetics and culture. A third generation of the School includes Tanabe's student Takeuchi Yoshinori, Nishitani's student Ueda Shizuteru and Hisamatsu's student Abe Masao, who have been especially effective in introducing Nishida's philosophy in Europe and North America and in applying Nishida's thought to inter-religious Buddhist-Christian dialogue.

Nishida's investigations indirectly influenced some current interpretations of Mahayana Buddhism, just as his thought was inspired by Buddhist ideas. For many people, his explication of pure experience and self-awareness re-interprets Zen awakening; his intertwining of self and world develops the Buddhist teaching of co-dependent origination; and his philosophy of nothingness articulates the notion of emptiness and the experience of mu (nothing). His philosophy has also presented to his Buddhist and Christian readers serious challenges, such as a notion of a non-dual relation between God and man, and an emphasis, unusual in Buddhism, on the individual self.

Nishida's logic of place has been a resource for theoreticians working in various scientific fields, for example Shimizu Hiroshi in complexity theory and information science, Nonaka Ikujiro in management theory, and Ko Hojo in the philosophy of chemistry. Artists like the calligrapher Morita Shiryû have also drawn from Nishida's philosophy, as has the psychotherapist Kimura Bin. Ultimately, Nishida himself is best considered an independent thinker, as the growing literature in Japanese and Western languages attests.


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