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Mohist Canons

First published Tue Sep 13, 2005; substantive revision Tue Jan 10, 2006

The Mohist Canons are a set of brief statements on a variety of philosophical and other topics by anonymous members of the Mohist school, an influential philosophical, social, and religious movement of China's Warring States period (479-221 B.C.).[1] Written and compiled most likely between the late 4th and mid 3rd century B.C., the Canons are often referred to as the “later Mohist” or “Neo-Mohist” canons, since they seem chronologically later than the bulk of the Mohist writings, most of which are probably from the mid-5th to the late 4th century. The Canons present philosophical ideas distinct from the older texts, though clearly closely related to or evolved from them. The later Mohists are also associated with the “School of Names,” a general label for ancient Chinese thinkers who were interested in language and argumentation. Early sources link the Mohists with the School of Names through a shared interest in disputation over the “hard and white” and the “same and different” (Zhuangzi, Book 33).

The Canons, their accompanying Explanations, and other later Mohist writings are among the most important texts in the history of Chinese philosophy of language, epistemology, logic, and science. They present elements of a sophisticated semantic theory, epistemology, consequentialist ethics, and theory of analogical argumentation, along with intriguing discussions of causality, space and time, and mereological ontology. Also recorded are inquiries in such diverse fields as geometry, mechanics, optics, and economics. The writers put forward terse, rigorous arguments that develop and defend Mohist ideas and rebut opponents' views. The texts yield a rich taste of an approach to language, mind, and knowledge distinct from those dominant in the Western philosophical tradition. At the same time, by shedding light on technical notions employed in other ancient writings, they confirm that a grasp of early theories of language, knowledge, and argumentation is essential to a full understanding of classical Chinese thought. Indeed, the later Mohists decisively refute the once widespread view that ancient Chinese thinkers were concerned exclusively with ethics, moral psychology, and nature mysticism and uninterested in language, epistemology, and logic.

Given the breadth and richness of later Mohist thought, this article can present only a narrow sample. We will focus on a handful of core ideas and issues in ethics, philosophy of language, epistemology, ontology, and disputation. (For a rough guide to the pronunciation of some of the Chinese terms used in this article, see the supplementary document Pronunciation Guide.)

1. Background and Overview

The early Mohists hoped to develop objective moral standards by which to unify society and achieve social order. Part of their solution was to develop a theory of fa (models, standards) that explained how to judge distinctions (bian) between shi (this, right) and fei (not-this, wrong). The core idea was to identify clear, objective fa (models) to serve as paradigms for pattern recognition or analogical extension. Things relevantly similar to, or “matching” (zhong), the fa would be shi (right, this); otherwise, they would be fei (wrong, not-this). In philosophy of language, the theory of fa could be applied to explain why a word denotes the things it does: the extensions of terms are determined by social practices in which we associate fa with terms and distinguish what things do or do not match the fa. In epistemology, the theory explains what it is to know something: it is knowing-how to correctly distinguish what does or does not match the fa for that sort of thing. To determine whether some claim ‘A is B’ should be accepted, we compare A to the fa for B to see whether they are similar. In logic, the theory yields a model of analogical argumentation. An assertion is the application of a term to something. To support an assertion, we cite a fa for the term we're asserting and then show that the thing we're asserting the term of is relevantly similar to the fa.

The key concepts in the theory are fa (models), zhong (matching), shi/fei (this/not-this), and bian (distinguishing). The correctness of shi/fei judgments seems to be explained by social norms for drawing distinctions between things. This view is suggested by how the Mohists describe the process by which we learn to judge shi and fei: through conformity to the model set by social superiors. According to the theory of the “three models,” these norms for drawing distinctions rest in turn on three fundamental standards: the precedent set by wise leaders of the past, perceptual experience, and utility to society. The early Mohists seem to have thought they could ground at least some of these norms—specifically, ethical norms—in the patterns of action exemplified by tian (heaven, nature) itself.

The later Mohist texts present a more detailed and sophisticated version of this basic theory. They continue the search for objective shi/fei standards for action and judgment and explore numerous philosophical issues arising along the way. Every shi/fei distinction divides the world into what is and is not a certain kind of thing. Why divide things up one way rather than another? What is it about particular things that makes them fall on one side of a distinction rather than the other? In practice, how do we perform the analogical extension needed to determine which side a particular thing belongs on? How do shi/fei distinctions underpin language, and thus explain communication? How do they explain knowledge?

One important difference from earlier Mohism is that the later texts seem to abandon the idea of grounding ethics or social norms in “Heaven's intention” (tian zhi). Intuitively, this move would seem to push Mohist ethics toward a form of pragmatic consequentialism: the proper standards for shi/fei distinctions would be whatever tends to promote human welfare in practice. Extending this idea to language and epistemology, we might expect the Mohists to adopt some form of pragmatism or conventionalism, on which kind distinctions are determined at least partly by human interests, practices, or conventions. (Arguably, the earlier Mohists already held such a position concerning shi/fei distinctions other than the fundamental ethical shi/fei identified by Heaven's intention.) The later Mohists' notion of what counts as a kind is quite loose and highly compatible with such a view. Yet, as Hansen (1992) has contended, in a few passages, their position seems to lean toward a form of realism, here understood as the view that the world itself fixes the patterns of similarity and difference by which things should be divided into kinds. It is unclear just how strong these realist tendencies are, however. For the texts may also be compatible with a view that allows some latitude in our standards for judging shi/fei, provided they rest on at least some objective basis for distinguishing similarities and differences.

2. The Texts

Our knowledge of later Mohist thought comes from six texts, which form Books 40 through 45 of the Mozi: two books of terse “canons” (jing), generally just a sentence or two in length; two of slightly longer “explanations” (jing shuo), keyed to the canons, which provide explanations of or arguments for the statements in them; and the “Big Selection” (Da Qu) and “Small Selection” (Xiao Qu), two collections of fragments on ethics, semantics, and logic, apparently the remnants of two or more extended essays. (The origin of the titles “Big Selection” and “Small Selection” is unknown. Possibly these were two selections, one longer and one shorter, from the remnants of damaged bamboo scrolls.) The six books as a whole are conventionally known as the Mo Bian, or “Mohist Dialectics.”[2] The Canons begin with 87 explications of or equivalence formulae for important philosophical, scientific, and mathematical terms. Some of these are in effect nominal definitions; others present substantive views. After a short, textually corrupt section, these are followed by 86 theses on a variety of subjects.

The content of the texts is highly coherent: the concepts and theories presented generally fit together well as a system, with perhaps a few variations in terminology in different parts of the corpus. By contrast, the organization of the texts is unsystematic. There is no statement of their overall purpose, no clear organizational scheme, nor any headings indicating the themes of different parts.[3] The canons do tend to fall into thematic groups, such as series on knowledge, the virtues, geometry, or disputation, but the sequence of topics displays no clear pattern. Concepts are introduced only to never be mentioned again, and central terms sometimes go unexplained. Like early Chinese mathematicians, the Mohists had no conception of an axiomatic system, and the canons do not clearly identify anything corresponding to axioms, definitions, or theorems. Nor are they arranged as if to explore some prespecified set of themes or prove some distinct set of conclusions. As a result, interpretation of later Mohist doctrines can be testing. Their views must be reconstructed from terse, incomplete statements scattered about different parts of the corpus, and on some issues there is insufficient textual evidence to reach any firm conclusions.[4]

For a brief overview of the fascinating history of the texts and the philological problems associated with them, see the following supplementary documenty:

Textual History and Philological Issues

3. Ethics

The ethical theory of the Dialectics is probably a form of indirect consequentialism, although the fragmentary, unsystematic nature of the texts does not allow us to rule out the possibility that it was a mixed theory, incorporating both consequentialist and deontological elements. The texts present basic principles of obligation but no fundamental justification for them, leaving some uncertainty as to the nature of the theory's foundation.[5] Moreover, we should emphasize that the “Big Selection,” in which much of the material on ethics is collected, has suffered severe textual damage, hindering our efforts to understand details of the theory and rendering much of the following summary tentative.

As in early Mohist thought, the core of the later Mohist ethical theory is a cluster of four interrelated concepts: “Morality” (yi, also “duty”), “benefit” (li, perhaps also “welfare” ), “kindness” (ren, also “benevolence” or “humaneness” ), and “concern” (ai, also love or care). These notions are explicated more precisely than in earlier texts, and, as we will see below, they are fleshed out in ways that seem intended to rectify obvious weaknesses in early Mohist ethics.

The texts remain committed to the Mohist doctrine of “inclusive concern” (jian ai), or impartial moral concern for everyone. No arguments are given to justify the doctrine, nor to justify the basic consequentialist theory. Instead, the theory is assumed, and arguments are given concerning technical objections, such as whether all-inclusive moral concern is logically problematic. For an example of such a technical objection and the Mohists' reply, see this supplement:

Canon B73

The Dialectics introduce four major innovations in Mohist ethics. First, they no longer appeal to tian (Heaven) as a criterion and justification of ethical norms. Second, they explicate benefit (li) and harm (hai) in terms of the happiness or dislike incurred upon obtaining something, instead of in terms of a collection of material and social goods. Third, they introduce a code under which individuals' duties to one another vary with the nature of their social relationship. Fourth, they begin to consider detailed problems of practical reasoning that arise in the application of Mohist consequentialism.

It is unclear why or to what extent the dialectical texts abandon the doctrine of “Heaven's intention” (tian zhi) as a justification and epistemic criterion of the right or moral. All we can say is that the texts present the ethical theory with no appeal to the concept of Heaven. One possibility is that the Mohists noticed the epistemic problems involved in contending that Heaven's intention supports one set of ethical norms rather than another. One isolated passage seems to recognize that the moral appeal to Heaven's intention as a standard of morality is in effect empty, since it could be twisted by a criminal to claim that since Heaven (tian, also “nature”) has given him a criminal disposition, it is right for him to engage in selfish behavior (EC1). However, the passage in question is so obscure and corrupt that it cannot be interpreted with assurance. It is also possible that the writers of the Dialectics did not actively reject the theory of Heaven's intention, since their texts treat the content of the ethical theory but not its foundations. Another, similarly late book of the Mozi, “Models and Standards” (Book 4), continues to appeal to Heaven as an ethical model, though that text is likely the work of a different branch of Mohists.

3.1 Benefit and Happiness

As in early Mohism, “benefit” (li) is the fundamental standard of what is moral or right (yi), which underlies moral duties and virtues: “Morality is benefit” (A8, B76). Kindness (ren, also benevolence) is “concern for an individual” (A7). “Concern ” (ai, also love or care) is one of the central terms left unexplained, though the texts do provide clues as to how it was understood. A7 indicates that the morally good concern constitutive of kindness (ren) involves treating people as intrinsically worthy of concern for their welfare. We are to be concerned for them as we are for ourselves, and not merely as a means to an end: “Concern for oneself is not in order to use oneself.” On the basis of A7 and EC7, we can follow Graham (1989: 145) in speculating that “concern” (ai) might have been understood roughly as desiring benefit and disliking harm to a person, for that person's own sake, and not as a means.

Earlier Mohist texts give no general, unified definition of benefit (li), instead characterizing it loosely as comprising a plurality of material and social goods, specifically wealth, population, and social order. By contrast, the Canons appear to take satisfaction or happiness (xi) as a criterion of benefit (li) and thus what is morally right (yi). Benefit and its converse, harm (hai), are explicated in terms of happiness and dislike: “Benefit is what one obtains and thereby is happy” (A26); “harm is what one obtains and dislikes” (A27). Happiness or pleasure is not taken as a fundamental good, but as a criterion by which to identify goods that constitute benefit. Interestingly, then, the Mohist theory avoids Butler's well-known criticism of hedonistic theories of value, that they mistakenly treat happiness as a basic good to be pursued, when in fact it is merely a byproduct of our attainment of other, more fundamental goods. On the other hand, the theory makes the questionable psychological assumptions that what genuinely promotes our welfare will inevitably make us happy, and that whatever makes us happy will genuinely be beneficial and morally right.

Whose benefit counts in determining what morality (yi) is, and what are the scope of our moral duties? The Mohists hold that everyone's benefit counts impartially, though as individuals we may not each have a duty to benefit everyone equally. In our fundamental motivations or intentions (zhi), we are to take “all under Heaven” —the entire human world—as our “portion” (fen), whose benefit we aim to promote (A8). But provided we have this commitment to the benefit of all, and the capability to act on it as circumstances require, we need not actually benefit the entire world to qualify as acting permissibly. An individual's moral worth is determined not by how much he actually benefits the world, which may be beyond his control (he may die young, for instance (EC3)), but by his intentions and abilities, which are largely within his control. (The Mohists may recognize an exception to this rule in the case of moral heroes, such as the ancient sage king Yu, whose moral worth surpasses other people's.) Unless we hold high political office or play a key role in an emergency, most of us will not have the chance to benefit the whole world directly and need not try to do so. Instead, how we should act toward others will normally depend on our relationship to them.

Duties associated with various social relations are determined by a code of obligations that works to promote the overall welfare of society. (This is presumably the justification for the code, but the texts are not explicit on this point.) This code of obligations is the Mohist response to the criticism that their doctrine of impartial concern for all undermines the special personal relationships, such as kinship, that form part of a good life. The Mohists often expressed their doctrine of all-inclusive concern as “being concerned for others' as one is concerned for one's own,” a formulation open to the construal that, for instance, one should treat everyone else's father as having a status identical to one's own. As the Mohists' critics were quick to point out, the result would be that we fail to treat our father as our father, rather than simply as one male elder among others. On these grounds, Mencius, one of the Mohists' Confucian opponents, claimed the Mohist doctrine was tantamount to denying one's father. The Mohists themselves clearly did not consider this a consequence of their position, which they repeatedly claimed was compatible with filial love and respect (xiao). But to settle the issue, an explicit account was needed of the role of special personal relations in their ethics.

3.2 Equal Concern, Unequal Treatment

Probably to answer such critics, the later Mohists developed a doctrine they called “relation ordering” (lun lie). This is a code according to which we are to provide more or less benefit to others depending on how close to us or important they are. Our moral concern covers everyone, but in practice we treat people unequally, as determined by their relation to us. “Doing more for those whom morality (yi) permits doing more for and less for those whom morality permits doing less for is called ‘relation ordering.’…If the kinship is close, do more; if the kinship is distant, do less” (EC9). Those for whom we are to do more include the sovereign, government officers, elders, relatives, and ourselves (EC9-10). (Consistent with the Chinese emphasis on a hierarchical social structure, the category of “friend” is noticeably absent from the list.) The Mohists were not committed to selfless altruism: “Concern for humanity [ai ren, also “concern for others”] does not exclude oneself; oneself is among those one is concerned for…. Concern for oneself according to relation ordering is ‘concern for humanity.’” So long as we do not exceed the degree stipulated by morality (yi), doing more for ourselves than for others does not count as selfishness, but as conformity with the moral standard of “concern for all humanity.” By contrast, to benefit some people more and others less without conforming to “relation ordering” is acting “for the sake of oneself” (EC10) rather than on behalf of all humanity, as morality requires.

“Relation ordering” is among the topics on which the texts do not provide enough detail for us to characterize the Mohist theory precisely. Possibly the code was formed by combining a consequentialist theory with deontological principles of justice or desert based on social relations. But given the overall tenor of Mohist thought, it is more likely the code was justified on the grounds that its general practice would best promote the welfare of all, making the Mohist theory a form of indirect consequentialism. The Mohists’ reasoning would have run roughly like this. All-inclusive moral concern motivates us to promote the welfare of everyone. But in practice the welfare of all is best secured by a system in which everyone treats others in a manner appropriate to their social relation, doing more for closer relations and less for distant. For instance, the Mohists probably believed that the elderly are generally most effectively cared for by their family, who best understand their needs and are closest to them emotionally. Hence Mohist moral concern for everyone’s welfare would justify a social code in which individuals care primarily for their own elderly parents, not others’. This practice could be expected to meet the needs of most elderly, so it would be unnecessary for us all to provide an equal degree of care to others’ parents. Each individual would then contribute some lesser degree of care to supporting the childless elderly, splitting the burden across society.

“Relation ordering” would thus have generated a system of practices and duties based on social relations that was largely consistent with the role-based duties recognized by the (Ru) (“scholars,” or Confucians), the Mohists’ main opponents. The major difference would have been in how the two schools grounded their theories. Confucian ethics starts with a conception of the conduct appropriate to persons standing in various types of social relations and works outward, proposing an ideal by which persons extend concern for their in-group to embrace outsiders. Mohist ethics starts from the conviction that the only objectively or impartially justified fa (model or standard) of conduct is to promote the welfare of everyone. It then works downward, proposing a code of practices associated with particular social relations that, if generally followed, would best promote the welfare of all. The general fa (model) of promoting the welfare of all and the practices it grounds function as reasons for action analogous to moral principles. In the structure of the Mohist theory, however, they are conceptualized not as universal principles, applied by deductive reasoning, but as models or exemplars, applied by analogical reasoning, against which we compare social practices or individual conduct to determine what is shi (right) and fei (wrong).

So far, the later Mohist ethical theory appears to be a plausible form of indirect consequentialism, though its formal structure is distinct from familiar forms of rule consequentialism in focusing on models and practices rather than rules or principles. However, one of the major problems with early Mohist ethics reappears in the later, more sophisticated theory. According to “relation ordering,” we are to do more to benefit those closest to us. But, consistent with earlier statements of the doctrine of inclusive concern, the later Mohists hold that we should have an equal degree of moral concern for all humanity. Our treatment of others is to vary with their relation to us, but our degree of concern for them is not. For example, though we are to devote more resources to ourselves than to distant strangers, there is to be no difference in the strength of our concern (ai) for ourselves and for them (EC10). We are to be as concerned for others' parents as for our own (EC12). Inclusive concern is equal for all, and concern for each should be equal (EC13); the degree of “concern for others” that we direct toward one individual is to be the same as that we direct toward any other (EC2). Indeed, were the whole world to be harmed by the death of one individual, we would expend vastly more effort looking after him, but our degree of moral concern for him would not increase (EC4).[6] On the other hand, concern for an individual cannot be abandoned, even if the world were to benefit (EC2).

As in early Mohism, this doctrine seems counterintuitive, since the cost in time, effort, and resources of training everyone in society to maintain an equal degree of moral concern for everyone else would likely be enormous. We can also question whether it would even be psychologically feasible for us to devote more time, attention, and assistance to those closest to us without also being more concerned about them. The Mohists seem to advocate a counterintuitive split between the level of treatment we provide to others and the degree of our moral concern for them. It would be more natural to allow the degree of concern to vary with the closeness of the relationship, with the proviso that even distant strangers be the object of at least a minimal degree of concern. Doing so would probably allow individuals to perform the social roles of government official, subject, parent, child, and so forth more effectively, thus promoting the welfare of all. The doctrine of “relation ordering” could be modified to allow different degrees of concern on the same consequentialist grounds that presumably justify different degrees of benefit: doing so would best promote the welfare of all. Alternatively, the Mohists could recast their doctrine of equal moral concern as a doctrine about moral justification: Institutions and practices are to be justified on the grounds that they reflect an equal concern for the welfare of all. Training members of society to think of justification in this way would probably be feasible, and indeed may correspond largely to what we think of as normal moral education.

Despite their equal concern for all, it is unclear whether the Mohists have any particular respect for the life or dignity of individuals. One fragment reads, “Being concerned for them equally, select and execute one person among them” (EC6). Another has, “If the benefit to the world is equal, then there's no choosing between them. If the benefit of death and life are as one, then there's no choosing between them” (EC6). Given their lack of context, any interpretation of these fragments must be tentative. But they seem to suggest that the only fundamental consideration in Mohist ethics is benefit to the world, not respect for individual dignity or the intrinsic value of life. (Hence they tend to weigh against the possibility, raised in passing above, that later Mohist ethics might be a mixed deontological-consequentialist view.) These remarks might seem to permit sacrificing life to increase welfare, or even just as long as there is no net decrease in welfare. On the other hand, the same fragment continues, “Killing a person to save the world, it’s not that we kill a person to benefit the world; killing oneself to save the world, it’s that one kills oneself to benefit the world.” This seems to indicate that even in the extreme case in which we can save the world by sacrificing another’s life, we do so not merely on the grounds of the net benefit to the world, since adopting such grounds might suggest that we could routinely sacrifice others for the benefit of society in less extreme cases as well. Rather, we do so because of the massive discrepancy between the damage we inflict and that we prevent—the loss of a single life versus loss of the whole world. If the life to be given up is our own, on the other hand, the fragment seems to imply that we should make the sacrifice on the grounds of benefiting the world, though only if the consequences are suitably weighty.

3.3 Practical Reasoning: Weighing

The fourth area of novelty in the ethics of the Dialectics is exploration of an aspect of practical reasoning that the Mohists call “weighing” (quan).[7] “Weighing” is judging which of several alternative ends or courses of action is “weightier,” or of greater value, and thus should determine how one acts. The Mohists identify two forms of “weighing.” The first appears to be weighing of ends or things for which we act (the phrase in the text is “things treated as units”). This sort of judgment is weighing proper (quan). The second appears to be weighing of means (the phrase is “affairs and action” ). The text deems this process “seeking” (qiu), a term used elsewhere to explicate deliberation (see the section on epistemology below). It seems to refer to deliberation or planning about the course of action that would best achieve some end.

In principle, most action requires practical judgment, since general ethical standards alone are typically insufficient to guide action in concrete situations. But the cases that draw the attention of the Mohists—and other ancient Chinese writers—are those in which different values or ethical standards conflict, pulling the agent in different directions, along with those in which one is forced to act when none of the available alternatives would normally motivate action. The writers were particularly concerned to explain how their fundamental standard of benefit (li) could guide action even when none of the choices available are beneficial.

According to the Mohists, desires and aversions can form in two ways (A84): We may desire or dislike something directly, or we may desire or dislike it after weighing the benefits and harms of the available alternatives. This twofold conception of desire and aversion yields an interesting non-Humean theory of motivation, on which some desires can issue from a process of practical reasoning, presumably including reasoning from ethical considerations. An example of such a desire is a desire for the lesser of two harms, which forms after “weighing benefit.” The Mohists consider the case of a traveler captured by robbers who, to save his life, is forced to choose between cutting off his finger or his arm (EC8). Clearly, the traveler will desire to sacrifice the finger, not the arm. In absolute terms, he is choosing something harmful to him. But as the Mohists see it, consistent with their basic consequentialist standard, selecting the lesser among harms counts as selecting benefit, not harm. They point out that the agent's choices are not completely within his control. Forced to choose among harms, he selects the least harmful option, sacrificing a finger rather than an arm or his life. When forced against our will to give up something we possess, we choose the least harmful alternative. When free to select something we do not yet possess, we choose the most beneficial alternative. Either way, we still count as selecting benefit, not harm.

The decision-making procedure depicted in the discussion of “weighing” is tantamount to act consequentialism. However, the overall later Mohist theory seems to be a version of indirect consequentialism, in which actions are guided and justified by practices that are in turn justified by appeal to their beneficial consequences. The basic standard for “weighing” —“among benefits, select the greatest; among harms, select the least”—appears to be a rule for resolving conflicts between standards or goods or for guiding action in exigent cases not covered by the existing moral code.

4. Philosophy of Language

The later Mohists develop a sophisticated referential semantics that explains reference, and thus communication, by appeal to our ability to learn to distinguish similar and different sorts of things. As in the Analects, the other parts of the Mozi, and the Xunzi, theoretical attention focuses on the issue of applying “names” (ming, words or terms) to things correctly, and not on the structure or truth of sentences. (The “Small Selection” moves on to consider “expressions” (ci) formed of strings of words, but these too are treated as terms.) A fascinating aspect of the theory, in contrast with traditional Western theories of language, such as Locke's conceptualism, is that it does not appeal to a notion of mental ideas or meanings that words stand for. Instead, speakers communicate by mastering practices for distinguishing (bian) the referents of names for various kinds of things. By virtue of these practices, members of the same language community know that each general term (lei ming) stands for all similar things of a certain kind (lei).

4.1 Names and Stuff

All words are regarded as various types of “names” (ming). The Mohists draw no distinction between different parts of speech, probably because classical Chinese words have no obvious morphological features indicating their different grammatical functions. They identify three types of names, according to the scope of their denotation (A78): “reaching” names, such as wu (“thing”), which “reach to” or denote anything; “kind” names, such as ‘horse’, which denote all things similar to each other in some respect; and “personal” or “individual” names, such as the proper noun ‘Jack’, which “stop” in one thing only, the individual that bears the name. Kind names are in effect general terms. They are established by dubbing things of a certain kind by that name. Having named something “horse,” for example, we are committed to applying the same name to all similar things (A78).

Names are used to talk about various shí (stuff, things, reality). ‘Shí’ means roughly “stuff” or “solid” and has the connotation of “real” and “full.” (In Chinese, shí (stuff) is written with a different graph from the word shi (this, right) discussed earlier. Here we will distinguish the two by romanizing the former as shí, indicating that it is pronounced with a rising tone.) Shí has a semantic range similar to, but broader than, the English ‘thing’ or ‘stuff’. It may refer to physical objects, conduct, events, or situations. It is also used to refer to “the facts,” the reality or genuine character of something, and the actual conduct or ability that matches or warrants a reputation.[8] According to ancient Chinese beliefs about nature, everything in the cosmos consists of a kind of active, flowing elemental stuff called qi (breath or vapor). When used to refer to objects, shí in effect refers to regions or loci where qi has condensed and thickened to fill out space and form a solid thing. The use to refer to “reality” or “the facts” seems to be an extension of this use: In both cases, shí refers to what is “really, solidly there.” (Indeed, events or facts may implicitly be conceived of as patterns in the elemental qi.) Shí contrasts not with “subject” or “subjective,” but with xu (empty, hollow) or with ming (name), the linguistic label for the thing referred to. Nor is shí “substance,” as contrasted with a set of properties that are in, possessed by, or realized by it. What we think of as the properties of a shí are all just inherent parts of it. Instead of positing an essence or a set of essential properities instantiated by all things of a kind, the Mohists and other early Chinese thinkers take it as a brute fact that shí may be similar or different in various respects, and they simply seek criteria by which to divide the shí into kinds based on their similarities and differences. (In doing so, they are in effect dividing up the cosmos as a whole, since shí are fundamentally just concentrations and patterns of the qi that permeates the cosmos.) As we will discuss when we consider the notions of “same” and “different,” features they cite as such criteria include “shape and visual appearance” (xing mao), “residence and migration” (ju yun), and “amount and number” (liang shu) (NO2).

The Mohists identify three kinds of “calling” (wei) (A79), or the speech act of uttering names. The first, “designating,” refers to “linking” (li) two or more names together, as when we say “Dogs are hounds.” The text leaves it unclear whether it is referring to predication in general, or merely to introducing a new name for something, since other passages indicate that ‘dog’ and ‘hound’ were considered coextensive. Probably the writers do not distinguish clearly between the two sorts of cases, and it is likely they are referring generally to all instances of noun predication. A second kind of “calling,” “attaching” (jia), is illustrated by scolding a dog. Other passages in the Mozi suggest that “attaching” refers to applying a term of approval or disapproval to someone in order to praise or reproach him. A possibility, though speculative, is that “attaching” refers to adjectival predication. The third type of speech act is “bringing up” (ju, also “raising”), which is using a name to talk about something. For instance, uttering the word ‘dog’ or ‘hound’ is “bringing up.”

4.2 “Bringing Up” and Communication

Language or “saying”(yan) in general consists of a series of “bringings up” (A32). “Bringing up” something is explained as a form of “modeling” or “presenting a model for” that thing (A31). The idea seems to be that names function as models, which the speaker uses to represent objects, in effect “showing” others what she is talking about (B53). Using a name of something is “describing” or “characterizing” (mao) it, just as if we drew a picture of it (A32). (Presumably this idea is motivated by the pictographic roots of Chinese writing.) If we “bring up” our friend as an example of a rich merchant, then we are using our friend's name to show what a rich merchant is (B53).

“Bringing up” (ju) is related to but distinct from the contemporary concept of reference or denotation. We sometimes say that a word refers to an object, but names cannot “bring up” shí (things, reality). Rather, speakers use names to “bring up” shí. The English concept most similar to “bringing up” (ju) is probably mention, as used in the sentence “Mary mentioned a candidate for the job.” (This is the everyday sense of ‘mention’, not the technical sense as in the use/mention distinction.) In contexts where we might speak of a word or a speaker referring to an object, early Chinese texts typically use the expressions zhi (point, indicate) or wei (call) instead of ju (bring up).

The Mohists' theory that “bringing up” things is “modeling” them can be seen as an expression of the commonsense idea that words represent or signify things. But the Mohist concept of “presenting a model” (ni) goes beyond this basic idea. It is part of a broader theory that language enables us to communicate by appeal to shared practices for distinguishing similar and different kinds of things. The Mohist view is that names (ming) can be signs and represent things because they show us what the thing the speaker “brings up” is “the same as” (tong). They show us this because we have previously learned to distinguish the kind (lei) of thing denoted by that name. Given this background, language tells us what something is “like” (ruo) and thus enables us to know (zhi) the thing (B70). When someone uses a word to “bring up” something, we know that thing is “the same” as other things denoted by that word. Hence using words is a process of “using what the person understands to rectify what he doesn't know” (B70). The Mohists compare this process to using a measuring tool. We can use a ruler to measure length because we know the length of the marks on the ruler and we see that the thing measured is the same length as one of the marks. Analogously, through language, we can use what listeners are familiar with to inform them about what they don't know. By using a name of something, we indicate that the thing is relevantly similar to the other things conventionally referred to by that name. When we say something is “white,” we're indicating that it's the same color as the other things we call “white.”

Another aspect of language is that it is used to express the speaker's yi (thought, intention, point) (A92). “Thought” or “intention” (yi) plays a role in ancient Chinese theories of language different from that of ideas, meanings, or intensions in Western theories. In Western folk theory—what we might call the Idea Theory or a “dog-legged”[9] theory of language—a word's meaning is the mental idea it stands for, which in turn represents some object in the world. The content of the idea explains why the word is used as it is, such as why it refers to certain things and not others. A familiar difficulty with this view is that it merely moves the explanandum back one step, since the content and function of ideas, a set of inner, private symbols, is just as much in need of explication as the content and function of language, a set of outer, public ones. The Mohist theory makes no detour through ideas or other mental entities to explain semantic content. Instead, the reference of words is explained by similarity relations and by practices for distinguishing the kind of thing designated by each word. The thought (yi) expressed by language does not explain why words are used as they are; rather, the way words are used explains how it is that they can express thoughts. “Expressing thoughts (shu yi)” (XQ) or “connecting thoughts (tong yi)” (B41) is communication, the aim or result of using language, not an explanation of why terms refer to the things they do. One canon (B41) depicts a scenario in which we come to understand the thought (yi) of a speaker who uses an unfamiliar word by asking to what the word refers. The point is that if we can determine reference, we can communicate. There is no need to consider meanings or “ideas” corresponding to words, and indeed intensional concepts play no role at all in the Mohist theory.

Accordingly, yi (thought, intention) is typically associated not with words (ming), as one would expect if Chinese thinkers held an Idea Theory of meaning, but with “sayings” (yan) and “expressions” (ci). (An “expression” is any string of two or more words used to express one thought.) Understanding the yi (thought) expressed by an assertion or command can be thought of as “getting the point.” For this reason, in some contexts yi (thought) may appear similar to the notion of “speaker's meaning.” [10] But other passages suggest that yi is not a semantic notion at all, but more akin to “what one is thinking” or one's intentions. One canon tells us that “trustworthiness is saying agreeing with yi (thought)” (A14), a remark that is difficult to understand if yi is interpreted as a semantic concept. For if yi (thought) were speaker's meaning, then what a speaker says could not fail to agree with his yi, and if it were literal meaning, then failing to conform to it would show only that the speaker uses words incorrectly, not that he is untrustworthy. A person is trustworthy when what she says genuinely reflects her thoughts, particularly what she intends to do. The best interpretation of yi in contexts concerning language, then, seems to be as a general notion of “thought” or more specifically as “intention,” and not as semantic meaning.[11]

To sum up, the Dialectics presents a naturalistic semantic theory on which referential relations between general terms and objects are explained by speakers' associating names (ming) with kinds (lei) of similar objects, events, or situations (shí). Communication is explained by language users' familiarity with the kinds of similar things referred to by names. The relation between language and the world is not explained by appeal to meanings, to ideas or concepts in the mind, or to abstract essences of things, but by practices for distinguishing different kinds of objects. This naturalistic theory seems highly plausible, as far as it goes. But it raises several crucial questions: How should things be divided up into kinds, and what justifies distinguishing the kinds one way rather than another? What makes a particular thing belong to one kind rather than another? In practice, how do we judge similarity, so as to distinguish whether a particular thing belongs to a kind? As we will see, a major difficulty facing the Mohists is that they fail to give adequate answers to the first two of these questions. Their texts make it clear that they recognize the issues. Yet they fail to give a clear, principled explanation of what similarities and differences should count in distinguishing kinds of things and why.

These questions pertain not only to the Mohists' philosophy of language, but to their epistemology. So before addressing them, we will survey later Mohist epistemology and its relation to semantic theory.

5. Epistemology

Later Mohist epistemology and philosophy of language are intertwined, because the core form of knowledge for the Mohists is knowing how to apply terms to things correctly. As in earlier Mohist epistemology, the focus is not on the justification or truth of beliefs or propositional attitudes, but on knowing how to distinguish which things or situations are shi (this) for some term and which are fei (not-this). However, the Dialectics introduces new aspects of knowledge to explain cases such as when someone is able to make a correct assertion about something but not to identify it perceptually or when someone can recognize a thing under one name but not another.

The core of later Mohist epistemology is presented in two places, a group of canons describing basic cognitive functions (A3-6) and another canon listing sources and types of knowledge (A80). It is not clear how, or whether, the doctrines presented in the two places fit together as a system, but they do give us a reasonably informative picture of the Mohists' approach to knowledge.

5.1 Awareness, Knowing, and Understanding

Humans who are alive and awake have a capacity or resource (cai) called “the knowing” (zhi) (A3, A22), roughly akin to the capacity or disposition to have conscious states and perform cognitive functions. “The knowing” is inactive in dreamless sleep (A23), and it is what experiences desires and aversions (A25). It is the capacity by which we are aware and have knowledge of things, and, provided we are awake, it cannot fail to be aware of something. The text compares it to eyesight: a sighted person who opens her eyes always has some visual experience, even if only the experience of seeing pitch black and even if her experience is unreliable. The functions the Mohists ascribe to “the knowing” overlap with those other early texts ascribe to the heart-mind (xin), a concept that plays no role in later Mohist thought.

One function of “the knowing” is deliberation or forethought (lu), which is described as a process of mentally “seeking” something. This may involve visualizing various courses of action and identifying their benefits and harms, which can then be “weighed” to reach a decision on how to act. An interesting difference from prominent views in the Western tradition is that deliberation is understood as seeking various features by which to draw a distinction between shi and fei or benefit and harm. It is not conceived of as, for instance, running through the steps of a practical syllogism in one's head. Rather, extending the vision analogy, the texts suggest that whereas “the knowing” is comparable to eyesight, deliberation is analogous to looking sideways, trying to spot something.

Another function of “the knowing” is perceptual knowledge, which is explained as “contacting” things (A5). Here the analogy is to the eyesight actually seeing something. The text explains perceptual knowledge as “to know is, by means of ‘the knowing’, passing by something and being able to describe it.” Interestingly, perceptual knowledge is here characterized as the practical ability (neng) to “describe” (mao) something encountered, probably by applying a term to it, and not as an inner mental state that represents the world accurately, nor as an attitude toward a sentence or proposition. Technically, the ability to correctly apply a term to something (e.g., by saying, “This is a dog” ) can be understood as an expression of propositional knowledge. But the text explains this knowledge in terms of an ability or know-how, thus underscoring the centrality of practical know-how in early Chinese thought.

This passage seems to characterize knowing (zhi) quite narrowly, as the ability to recognize something encountered in perceptual experience. Elsewhere the Canons and Explanations use the word ‘know’ (zhi) with a broader scope, so that it includes cases other than perceptual knowledge, or at least other than knowledge of things the knower has himself experienced. One passage emphasizes that though the senses are the source of perceptual knowledge, once we know something, we need not rely on the senses in order to continue to know it (B46). Our knowledge of something—that is, our ability to describe it—can remain even after we no longer perceive it.

The third function of “the knowing” relevant to epistemology is discursive knowledge, or understanding (A6). This is explained as “by means of ‘the knowing,’ sorting things [into kinds] in such a way that one's knowing [correctly recognizing] them is obvious.” Whereas knowing is analogous to seeing something, understanding is analogous to being clear-sighted. The relation between the two concepts is not obvious, but a reasonable interpretation is that knowing is mainly being able to recognize things—especially particulars experienced in perception—under some name, while understanding is probably knowing how various kinds of things relate to each other, and thus knowing how to sort (lun) or classify them. But knowing various things seems to be a necessary component of understanding, since the text says that understanding lies in being able to sort things in a way that demonstrates that one knows them. Another passage tells us that knowing is the means by which one sorts things (B34).

Understanding seems to be the Mohist analogue to what we might call theoretical knowledge, systematic knowledge of various facts and how they fit together. But there are interesting differences between the Mohist conception of such knowledge and conceptions prevalent in the Western tradition. The Mohists regard the structure of such knowledge as a system of classifications—of relations and distinctions among various kinds (lei)—and not, for example, as a deductive system. They do not see knowledge as having a sentential structure. Knowing is not a matter of the subject's standing in a certain relation to a true proposition; indeed, their account makes no mention of beliefs, propositions, or truth. Rather, knowledge is explained as a kind of ability or know-how: the ability to use ‘the knowing’ to “sort” things, which is to distinguish them into kinds and apply the appropriate names to them. This know-how corresponds functionally to propositional knowledge, in that it will typically be expressed in statements of the form A is B—such as ‘oxen are animals’—which by our lights express true propositions. But in the Mohists' eyes, uttering such a statement is a manifestation of a form of skill or know-how: the speaker knows to “sort” or “distinguish” oxen as falling within the kind animal.

5.2 Sources and Objects of Knowledge

Canon A80 gives a categorization of three sources and four objects of knowledge. The sources of knowledge are hearsay (wen), or “receiving it as passed along” ; explanation (shuo), illustrated by the example “squares do not rotate”; and “in person” (qin), which is “observing it there oneself.” Elsewhere, “explanation” is glossed as “that by which one understands” (A72) and as a process of citing reasons or causes (NO11).

The four objects of knowledge are names (ming, words), stuff (shí, including objects, events, and situations), “matching” (he), and acting (wei). The first two are explained by their role in language. Names are “that by which we call” (what we use to talk). Stuff (shí) is “what we call” (what we talk about). The next two concern the correctness of assertion and action. “Matching” is when name and thing fit together properly. “Acting” is intentional conduct.

The first two kinds of knowledge concern acquaintance or familiarity—what we might call “knowing-of.” Knowledge of names probably refers to knowing words, without necessarily knowing how to correctly distinguish what shí (stuff, objects) they refer to. An example would probably be the blind man who can use the words ‘black’ and ‘white’ in statements such as “Bright things are white and dark things are black” but cannot identify black or white objects when presented with them. Presumably the criterion for knowing a name is knowing how to use it in at least some contexts.

Knowing stuff probably refers to recognizing objects, events, or situations under some name—at the very least, under the “reaching” or “universal” name ‘thing’, which applies to everything—without necessarily knowing the correct name for them. For example, sometimes the same kind of object may have two names, such as ‘dog’ and ‘hound’ (B39). Someone might know of this kind of object and know to call it “dog,” without also knowing to call it “hound.” Then the person would know the object but not the name ‘hound’.

Knowledge of “matching” is knowing how to correctly distinguish, or identify, the kind of thing to which a name refers. This is the sort of practical know-how that the blind man lacks. Early Mohist epistemology seems to have focused on this form of knowledge to the exclusion of the preceding two. The later Mohists also seem to have taken this as their primary focus, since as we saw above they explain both perceptual knowledge and understanding as an ability to match names with things by describing them (A5) or sorting them into kinds (A6). (Clearly, though, a person could learn a good deal about sorting into kinds merely on the basis of knowing names.) The fourth type of knowledge, knowledge of acting, is knowing how to act correctly—probably, given the context, knowing how to respond appropriately to the sort of thing denoted by a particular term (ming). That this is included in a categorization of the objects of zhi (knowledge) underscores the theoretical unity of knowledge and action for the Mohists. Cognition and practical wisdom, or knowing what to do and when to do it, are both considered aspects or forms of zhi (knowledge).

Another canon (B10) lists four sources of doubt, or potential causes of erroneous judgment. These are unexpected circumstances, inconclusive evidence, causal overdetermination, and the possibility of change over time. Interestingly, by comparison with the Western tradition, the fallibility of perceptual or cognitive processes is not identified as grounds for doubt. Nor is reality considered inherently unknowable, because of incessant phenomenal change, for example. Doubt is due to contingent features of particular circumstances, and in most cases it can be resolved by further investigation. (Accordingly, ancient Chinese skepticism—as expressed in the Zhuangzi, for example—is not concerned with the unreliability of sense perception or a gap between appearance and reality, but with the problem of grounding the standards by which we distinguish shi/fei.)

An interesting consequence of the Mohists' account of knowledge as grounded in know-how, or practical ability, is that they do not emphasize a contrast between belief and knowledge, nor do they treat justification as a component that must be added to belief to produce knowledge. (Reasons (gu) have a role in their theory of argumentation, but not in the canons on knowledge.) The text recognizes a contrast between knowing and “taking to be so” (A24), an attitude corresponding to belief, but this attitude is not treated as a constituent of knowledge, to which something must be added to yield knowledge. Instead, perceptual knowledge and understanding seem to lie primarily in the ability to recognize and respond to things appropriately, mainly by naming and sorting them correctly. Probably no role is assigned to justification because the Mohist conception of knowledge is just a type of reliable capacity. The role of justification in the account of knowledge as justified true belief is mainly to exclude accidentally true beliefs, such as lucky guesses, from counting as knowledge. The Mohists handle the same problem by considering only correct naming and sorting that issues from a reliable skill or ability to be knowledge. This reliability component is obvious in the case of understanding, since understanding requires comprehensive, systematic sorting of kinds. But it may also be true in the case of perceptual knowledge, a prerequisite for which is probably the reliable ability to recognize and name things correctly. The Mohists’ account of knowledge bears some similarity to themes in contemporary virtue epistemology, in particular to a position that we might call “ability reliabilism.” The relationship between the Mohist view of mind and knowledge and contemporary epistemology is an area that deserves further research.

The Mohists’ conception of knowledge and understanding as grounded in the ability to name and sort things correctly leads us back to the questions we raised in response to their theory of language. What determines the correct scheme of kind distinctions? What makes it correct to distinguish a particular thing as part of one kind or another? In practice, how do we determine to which kinds things belong? These questions must be answered before we can determine whether we actually have knowledge in particular cases. For the later Mohists’ answers to these questions, we need to look to their account of the notions of “sameness” and “difference” and their theory of disputation.

6. “Same” and “Different”

The notions of “same” or “similar” (tong) and “different” (yi) lie at the heart of later Mohist thought. As we have seen, they are a core part of the explanation of how words refer to things and how we use language to communicate. They determine what counts as correct “describing,” “sorting,” and “matching” of names and things and thus what knowledge is. The issues of how to distinguish the “same” from “different” kinds of things and how to identify particular individuals as belonging to one kind or another are the central issues for Mohist semantics and epistemology, and through them, for the Mohist theory of disputation as well.

The Dialectics explore aspects of “sameness” (tong) and “difference” (yi) in several places. Fragments collected in the “Big Selection” indicate that the writers were developing a detailed classification of types of “sameness,” and one canon (A88) appears to explore a contrast between relative and absolute sameness or difference. Textual problems make it impractical to discuss these passages here, but one pair of canons presents a clear, intelligible taxonomy of four types of sameness and difference (A86-87):

  1. Sameness in being identical or coextensive, as when two names refer to the same shí (object, event, situation). This sort of sameness contrasts with difference in the sense of being two different shí.
  2. Sameness in being parts of the same unit (ti), as when things are included within a single whole (jian). This contrasts with difference in the sense of not being connected or attached. The concept of a “whole” here corresponds roughly to a mereological whole or fusion and includes functional wholes, such as the body. It may cover sets as well, although the textual evidence suggests that the Mohists probably assimilated set-member relations to part-whole relations.
  3. Sameness in being together or united, as when things share the same location. This contrasts with difference in the sense of not being in the same place. As Graham proposes (2003: 335), this sense of sameness might refer to the relation between the hard and the white features of a hard, white stone (B37), the body and “the knowing” of a living thing (A22), or the length and breadth of an object (B4). Different aspects or features of a single thing are considered to be “the same” in this sense.
  4. Sameness in being “of a kind” (lei), explained here as “having a respect in which they are the same.” This contrasts with difference in being “not of a kind,” which is “not the same in some respect.” Unlike the first three types, being “of a kind” entails that things are antecedently similar (ruo) in some respect other than that defined by these notions of “sameness.” Being “of a kind” explains why things are referred to by the same general term or “name.” As we saw in the section on language, the names of kinds apply to all of the similar things that make up the kind (A78).

This list invites an intriguing observation. The writers take the general notion of “sameness” (tong) to express four different types of relations: identity or coextension; part-whole relations; being components or constituent features of something; and sharing some similarity, and thereby being “of a kind” and part of the extension of a general term. These relations correspond roughly to those of identity, part versus whole, constitution, and predication, which in European languages are usually expressed using the verb to be, or the copula:

  • Cicero is (identical to) Tully.
  • Cicero's finger is (part of) Cicero.
  • Cicero is (constituted by) his body.
  • Cicero is (describable as) human.

This parallel strongly suggests that the concept of “sameness” (tong) plays a theoretical role for classical Chinese thinkers comparable to that of to be or the copula. When evaluating the truth of an assertion that we would translate into the form ‘A is B’, early Chinese thinkers probably understand themselves to be evaluating whether A and B are “the same.” Generalizing from this point, we can suggest that for them, assertion, judgment, and reasoning are probably all regarded as processes of distinguishing whether things are “the same” or not. For instance, they probably interpret the assertion “White horses are horses” as in effect claiming that white horses and horses are “the same,” and “Oxen are not horses” as claiming that oxen and horses are “different.” To them, stating a fact about the world is a matter of identifying a sameness or difference, in one of (at least) four senses of “sameness.”[12] If this interpretive hypothesis is correct, then it is no exaggeration to say that distinguishing same and different—in effect, pattern recognition or analogical extension—is the core explanatory notion in classical Chinese philosophy of language, epistemology, and logic.

6.1 The Problem of Distinguishing Kinds

The explanation of sameness in being “of a kind” raises an important problem, however, bearing on the questions we have identified about the justification for a scheme of kind distinctions and the basis for assigning particular things to one kind or another. The Mohists' explanation of being “of a kind” —“having a respect in which they're the same” —makes it seem that nearly any group of things with anything in common could be considered a kind. The collection of things in your desk drawer could constitute a kind by virtue of their similarity in all being inside the drawer. This seems to make identification of kinds utterly arbitrary, threatening to leave us with an extreme relativist or conventionalist view of kinds. Since there are indefinitely many respects in which things can be “the same,” it looks like things can be divided up into any scheme of kinds we happen to find convenient, on the basis of whatever features of things we choose to single out for attention.

The Mohists do specify three sorts of general criteria for distinguishing kinds, as we mentioned briefly in the section on language. (There may originally have been further criteria, as the text that treats these issues is in fragments.) Some kinds are distinguished on the basis of “shape and visual appearance” (xing mao); explicit examples include ‘mountain’, ‘hill’, ‘house’, ‘shrine’, ‘sword’, ‘human’, and parts of the body (NO1-2, 7). Others can be distinguished on the basis of “residence and migration” (ju yun). These include anything named after a place, such as a Qin horse. A third set of criteria are “amount and number” (liang shu) (NO2). The only explicit example given is ‘large’, as in a large stone. Perhaps ‘four-footed’ would be another example. Also, some things are so different they cannot intelligibly be compared at all, and so they probably have no respects in which they could be considered “of a kind.” For instance, wood and night are different kinds; we can't measure them by a common standard, asking “Which is longer, a piece of wood or a night?” (B6).

But these general criteria are hardly enough to resolve all of our questions about the basis for kind distinctions. Kinds are discriminated by “bringing up” (ju), or citing, specific distinguishing features by which to differentiate their instances. These features must be selected carefully. If we choose features that are not genuinely relevant or comparable, then the distinctions we draw will be specious (B76). If we cite features shared by individuals of more than one kind, then we'll fail to distinguish the kinds correctly and reliably. The Mohists call the use of such specious or unreliable criteria “crazy bringing up,” as explained in Canon B66:

Canon. By crazy bringing up, one cannot know differences [between things]. Explained by: Having [similar features].
Explanation. Although oxen and horses are different, it is inadmissible to use oxen having incisors and horses having tails to explain (shuo, also “show” or “make a case”) that oxen are not horses. These are things they both have, not things one has and the other lacks. To say, “Oxen and horses are not of a kind,” and appeal to oxen having horns and horses lacking horns, in this the kinds are different. [But] if you bring up oxen having horns and horses lacking horns, and take this to be the difference between the kinds, this is “crazy bringing up,” like oxen having incisors and horses having tails.
(Some oxen lack horns, and perhaps in rare cases horses grow them. The text does not specify the correct features for distinguishing oxen from horses, perhaps taking them to be common knowledge. On the basis of a passage from the Huainanzi, Graham (2003: 438) speculates that they were the conjunction of cloven hooves with horns, though it is unclear how this would serve to distinguish hornless oxen properly. Perhaps they were simply the overall “shape and visual appearance” that the Mohists mention elsewhere.)

The specific issue framed in B66 is how, assuming we know that oxen and horses are different kinds, we can specify distinguishing features to differentiate them reliably. But the Mohists' appeal to “crazy bringing up” invokes a more general issue (cf. B76). What makes citing some features “crazy” (kuang) and others not? Why not abandon the oxen/horse distinction and instead group hornless oxen together with horses as a kind? The Mohists' implicit view seems to be—though we should emphasize that the textual evidence is sparse and equivocal—that the difference between kinds such as oxen and horses is fixed independently of our cognitive activity, and our task is to identify the features of these kinds that will allow us to recognize the differences reliably.[13] The problem with “crazy bringings up” is that if we pick the wrong features we will fail to carve the world up into kinds in the right way.

So we have a tension between Canon A86, which suggests that any group of things similar in some respect can form a kind, and the view implied in B66, that not just anything can form a kind. There is at least one—though nothing in the texts explicitly rules out there being more than one—predetermined, correct scheme of kind distinctions, which we will recognize properly only if we discover and apply the right criteria. This “realist” view is also reflected in canons such as B72, which contends that whether or not something is the kind of thing designated by a term isn't determined arbitrarily by our deeming it so, but by whether that is in fact its name (ming). I can refer to a dog as a “crane,” but the dog is nevertheless a dog, and not of a kind with birds. It is inadmissible to collapse the distinction between “other” (bi) and “this” (shi) by referring to both as “this” (shi), for doing so leaves the speaker referring to no specific kind of thing at all. Canon B72 is in effect attacking the claim in the Zhuangzi that anything can be treated as “this” or “other,” and thus as part of the same kind or not: “Things, none are not ‘other’, none are not ‘this’…. ‘This’ is also ‘other’, ‘other’ is also ‘this’.” [14]

As this quotation from the Zhuangzi shows, the issues at stake matter not only for the Mohists. They are among the central questions in classical Chinese philosophy, addressed in different ways by Mohists, Daoists, Confucians, and others, for what scheme of kind distinctions we adopt was seen as determining values, norms of action, and even the organization of society. In the Western tradition, views on similar issues have tended to fall into one of three general categories: realism, conceptualism, or nominalism.[15] This taxonomy is unhelpful in understanding classical Chinese thought, however, for the various positions in the Chinese discourse all tend to fall roughly under the label of nominalism, appealing neither to universals nor to concepts to explain the relation between a thing and its kind. The range of Chinese positions can more usefully be plotted along a spectrum from a form of realism to various forms of relativism,[16] representing the extent to which they treat distinctions between kinds as fixed and independent of human cognition, on the one hand, or as relative to our (potentially plural and variable) practices, context, or point of view, on the other. On one end of this spectrum would be monistic realism, the view that kind distinctions are determined by a uniquely correct pattern of similarity relations fixed by the world itself. Next might come a more moderate form of realism, on which similarity relations fixed by the world support two or more distinct but compatible schemes of kind distinctions. Further in the relativist direction would be Xunzi's pragmatic conventionalism, which holds that kind distinctions are determined by social conventions based on our natural biological disposition to classify things similarly, our cultural traditions, political decisions, and pragmatic efficacy in securing socioeconomic order. Still further in the relativist direction would be the positions of the Zhuangzi “Discourse on Equalizing Things” and Hui Shi, both of which hold that, though grounded in genuine similarities between things, the schemes of kind distinctions we employ are pluralistic and may vary with our practices, context, or point of view. At the extreme relativist end of the spectrum would be the view that kind classifications are entirely arbitrary, fixed only by the contingent opinions of the person doing the classifying. (It is unclear whether any early Chinese thinker actually held this view.)

The later Mohists most likely fall somewhere on the realist side of this spectrum, though they say so little about the fundamental grounds for kind distinctions that any interpretation of their views is partly guesswork. They are confident that in disputation there is always a unique, determinate right answer (B35), and they hold that through disputation all types of ethical, political, and scientific issues can be resolved (NO 6). They insist that kind distinctions cannot be shifted or modified (B68, B72), that only certain criteria for drawing distinctions are “non-crazy,” and that such criteria serve to “explain” (shuo) predetermined differences between kinds. Yet all of these points are potentially compatible with a more pragmatic stance, such as Xunzi's. Indeed, a remarkable weakness of later Mohist thought is how little the texts say about this crucial issue, which after all is central to their semantic theory, epistemology, and theory of argumentation. The argument for attributing a realist position to them is to a large extent an argument from silence: They make no pragmatic or relativistic claims, and they seem to assume that things come prepackaged into kinds. Yet they offer no systematic, principled explanation of how similarities between things are fixed or why certain things should count as of a kind and others not.

7. Disputation and Logic

As we have seen, Mohist semantics and epistemology are grounded in the notion of distinguishing things as “the same” (tong) or “different” (yi). To predicate a general term of something is to distinguish it as similar to, or of a kind (lei) with, other things denoted by that term. Knowledge and understanding are explained in terms of the ability to distinguish and name things correctly. In this theoretical framework, judgment amounts to the act of either grouping things together as “similar” or “the same” or distinguishing them as “different.” An assertion is in effect a claim that something is or is not “the same” or “of a kind” with something else. Thus argumentation—the process of supporting an assertion by citing other, established claims—is typically seen as a process of distinguishing whether something is or is not “the same” or of a certain kind.

As might be expected, given this background, the Mohists focus on analogical reasoning and tend to view all argumentation as fundamentally analogical in nature. They do not investigate formal logic or deductive inference, nor do they formulate an explicit notion of logical consequence. They do apply versions of the laws of excluded middle and non-contradiction, along with concepts of logical “admissibility” (ke) and “perversity” (bei) that incorporate a rough notion of logical consistency.[17] They also employ a rigorous system of quantifiers and conjunctions of implication. Still, none of these notions is addressed as an explicit topic of investigation, nor are these conceptual tools organized and presented in a systematic way. Rather, discussion focuses on semantics and analogical argumentation.

The Mohists refer to the study of how to support, evaluate, and argue over assertions as bian, a word that means “distinction drawing,” “discriminating,” or “disputation.” (For convenience, we will translate it as “disputation,” though, as we will see, Chinese thinkers understand it very literally as a process of “discriminating” or drawing distinctions.) Early Chinese texts describe disputation at several levels of generality. In its broadest sense, disputation is extensive in scope, covering aspects of semantics, argumentation, logic, and rhetoric. In this general sense, it is comparable to the Greek ‘dialectics’, considered loosely as debate or reasoning aimed at knowledge. The Mohists' “Small Selection” (Xiao Qu) depicts it as a general process of reasoning and judgment that covers virtually all cognitive activity, including topics corresponding to politics, semantics, natural science, and ethics.

Disputation (bian), by it we clarify divisions between this (shi) and not-this (fei) to examine the guidelines of order and disorder; clarify points of sameness and difference to discern the patterns of names (ming) and stuff (shí); and settle benefit and harm to resolve uncertainty and doubt. Only then can we lay out what is so of the myriad things and sort out parallels in groups of sayings. (NO6)

Other texts portray disputation as a competitive, argumentative activity, a kind of public debate or dispute. The narrowest, most specific descriptions depict it as a process of disputing whether, with respect to some term (ming), something is shi (this) or fei (not-this), part of the extension of the term or not. Any two or more things that are shi (this) are thereby “the same” in some way. So disputation is in effect a process of distinguishing what is or is not “the same.” At each level of generality, it is said to involve distinguishing shi/fei (this/not-this) and tong/yi (same/different). Disputation in the narrow sense of arguing over whether a term can properly be predicated of a thing is probably the basic component activity of disputation in the wider senses. Disputation in the broadest sense of “debate” or “dialectics” is in effect an extended process of disputation in the narrow sense.[18]

Canons A73-74 give a precise explication of disputation in its most concrete sense. Disputation is contending over which of two complementary terms, such as ‘ox’ and ‘non-ox’, “fits” (dang) a thing (shí) (A74). Such pairs of terms divide everything in the world into two mutually exclusive categories: any one thing is either ox or non-ox. In disputation, one side calls a thing “ox,” the other “non-ox”; the side whose claim fits the thing wins. The text cites a version of the law of excluded middle (A73) to show that at least one of the pair of terms must fit, and it cites a version of the law of non-contradiction (A74) to show that one must not fit. The speech act of calling the thing “ox” or “non-ox” has the pragmatic significance of an assertion, and so disputation can be understood by our lights as a debate over which of two contradictory assertions is true. But the Mohists do not view it that way. They see it as contending over whether the shí (stuff, thing) at hand is of the kind ox or not—or, equivalently, whether, with respect to the term ‘ox’, it is “this” (shi) or “not-this” (fei).

How do we determine whether the thing at hand is “this” or not? We cite a model or paradigm (fa) of the kind in question and try to show that the thing is or is not relevantly similar to it. A thing is “so” (ran) when its visual appearance (mao) is similar (ruo) to the model (fa) (A70-71). Models may include mental images of the thing, measuring tools or other devices for identifying it, or concrete examples. Things can “match” (he) the model “exactly,” as when a circle is exactly the same shape as the model, or by what is “appropriate,” as when we deem a man “swarthy” by the color of his skin, not his hair or eyes (A83, A96). The overall process of citing a model, explaining the reasons for distinguishing something as “this” or “not-this,” and thus achieving understanding is called “explanation” or “persuasion” (shuo) (A72, NO11). “Explanation” (shuo) is the analogue, in the Chinese context, of giving an argument for a claim. However, an “explanation” has no particular formal structure, nor is it regarded as “proving” a conclusion. Rather, it is simply the process of explaining the grounds (gu) for distinguishing something as “this” or “not-this.”

A series of canons following those just discussed describe detailed procedures for disputation, but textual and interpretive problems place them outside the scope of this article. Several other canons—equally obscure, but worth summarizing briefly—identify potential problems in disputation. These have two main sources: the inherently fallible nature of analogical extension, and the Mohists' discovery that similar grammatical structure need not reliably reflect similar semantics.

7.1 “The Difficulty of Extending Kinds”

In a typical disputation (bian), we compare something to a model or exemplar of the kind (lei) of thing denoted by some term and judge whether or not they are “the same.” In the narrowest sort of case, we might dispute whether a particular individual is of a certain kind, such as oxen. At a higher level of generality, we might dispute whether or not one kind of thing, A, is also of another kind, B. For instance, we might dispute whether or not oxen are of the kind four-footed. In either sort of case, we are considering whether to “extend” our judgment about what is of a kind to include something new. In classical Chinese thought, judging that some new thing indeed falls within a recognized kind is called “analogical extension” or “extending kinds” (tui lei).

Because any such judgment proceeds by comparison with selected features of a finite set of exemplars, problems may arise. Which features of individual exemplars are representative of the kind as a whole? Things of the same kind may be similar in some respects but dissimilar in others. So our judgment about, say, whether birds are of the kind flying creatures might turn out unreliable. (Perhaps we were unaware of flightless birds.) The Mohists call this the “difficulty of extending kinds” (B2). The canon that expounds the problem is obscure, but the gist of the issue is not difficult to guess. The particular quadruped before us may be a deer, but besides having four feet, it may share few features with other quadrupeds. We cannot assume, on the basis of this one exemplar, that quadrupeds are inevitably similar to this one, and thus of the kind deer. By the same token, we may deem this particular creature an “animal,” but we cannot assume all animals will share all the features of this one, and thus be of the kind quadruped or deer. In disputation, we will often need to identify features of individual exemplars that are representative of their kind. The Mohists call this “fixing the kind” (B1). But because of the “difficulty of extending kinds,” this process will always be a fallible one.

Other problems concern compound terms. The simplest early Chinese model of language—probably the default starting point for the Mohists' and other ancient Chinese thinkers' reflections—is what we might call the one-name-one-thing model (cf. Hansen 1983). On this view, names or words (ming) are taken to stand in a one-to-one correspondence with kinds of shí (things, events, situations). When the Mohists moved on to consider compounds or expressions formed by combining two or more words, they discovered that the language-world relation is more complex than this naive model suggests. As a result, linguistic structure doesn't always reflect reality directly. When two names are strung together, the reference of the resulting compound may change in unpredictable ways. Combining ‘oxen’ and ‘horses’ gives ‘oxen-and-horses’ (niu ma), denoting the sum of all oxen and horses (B12). But combining ‘hard’ and ‘white’ doesn't produce a compound term denoting the sum of all hard things and white things. It forms one denoting things that are both hard and white in the same place at the same time (A66, B37). Everything hard-and-white is white. But not everything falling within the extension of the term ‘oxen-and-horses’ is oxen. In fact, a dispute over whether oxen-and-horses are oxen or not is undecidable, since if we say they are, on the grounds that part of the sum is oxen, our opponent can say they are not, on exactly parallel grounds (B67). ‘White horse’ and ‘blind horse’ have the same grammatical structure. But whereas most of a white horse is white, most of a blind horse is not blind; only the eyes are (B3). Deeming someone “fu” (husband) but combining the word with yong (yong fu, “brave man”) isn't deeming him a husband. But deeming some things “shoes” while combining the word with ‘buying clothes’ (“buying clothes and shoes”) is still deeming them shoes.

Observations such as these gave the Mohists grounds for skepticism about the extent to which complex linguistic structures have a reliable or fixed relation to the patterns of similarity and difference that underlie their correct use. In classical Chinese, ‘oxen-and-horses’ (niu ma) and ‘white horse’ (bai ma) appear to have a similar grammatical structure, but the first is the sum of two kinds of things, the second a portion of one kind of thing. Formal similarities in linguistic structure thus are not a reliable guide to distinguishing kinds. To discriminate kinds properly, we need to examine the semantic criteria (yin) or grounds (gu) determining the proper use of the terms or phrases that denote them, and not rely only on structural parallels with other terms or phrases. In some cases, we may need to point out that structurally similar expressions in fact have very different semantics. This is a key theme of the “Small Selection” (Xiao Qu), a brief summary and illustration of Mohist disputation that is probably the most important text in the history of Chinese logic.

7.2 Methods of Disputation in the “Small Selection”

We quoted the opening paragraph of the “Small Selection” above: The text depicts disputation as the general method of achieving understanding in virtually all areas of inquiry. It continues by introducing basic concepts and principles of disputation:

By names (ming), bring up stuff (shí); by expressions (ci), put across thoughts (yi); by explanations (shuo), bring out reasons (gu). Accept and propose on the basis of kinds (lei). Having it in our case, we do not reject it in the other's; lacking it in our case, we do not demand it in the other's.

In its context, this statement is unremarkable, but from our perspective its theoretical significance is far-reaching. Here, in an explicit, systematic presentation of their theory of dialectics, the most logically inclined thinkers in the Chinese tradition directly state that claims are put forth and accepted or rejected on the basis of analogical extension, by deeming things of a kind or not. They add a principle of fairness, stipulating that the same grounds or demands be applied whether evaluating our own claims or the opponent's. The Mohists thus indicate that their dialectics is not primarily the study of formally valid inference, but of “fair” or “unbiased” analogical persuasion. Insofar as the explicit study of logic in a culture tends to reflect its reasoning practices in other fields, we can view this statement as mirroring the character of Chinese mathematics and science, which tend to be based on analogical reasoning and taxonomy, and not, by contrast, on the model of the deductive system.

The text next introduces several further notions, including that of “exemplars,” or models for distinguishing shi/fei, before explaining four standard rhetorical techniques used in disputation. These are:

  • Analogy (pi): “Bringing up other things and using them to clarify it.”
  • Drawing parallels (mou): “Placing expressions side by side and proceeding with them all.”
  • Citing the opponent's precedent (yuan): “Saying, ‘You are so, how is it that I alone cannot be so?’”
  • Analogical extension (tui): “On the grounds that what they don't accept is the same as what they do accept, propose it.”

Scholars have debated the relationship between these four moves, some suggesting that they represent a sequence of steps employed in the process of establishing a claim, others that they represent inference procedures. It is unlikely they form a fixed sequence of steps, since rhetorically in many cases giving an analogy will make drawing parallels unnecessary, or appealing to a precedent will be sufficient to establish one's point, without any of the other methods. Analogical extension is clearly a form of analogical inference. But analogy and drawing parallels appear to be ways of setting up the basis for an analogical inference, not inference procedures themselves.[19] Citing a precedent amounts to challenging the opponent to block an implicit analogical inference by distinguishing the case at stake from the precedent. Failure to do so establishes one's claim by default. Probably there is no fixed relation between the four techniques, and disputers may apply one or more of them as needed to make their case.

The key point to emphasize about the four methods, relating back to the principle that we “accept and propose on the basis of kinds,” is that all are specifically procedures for analogical argumentation, aimed at distinguishing similarities and differences among kinds of objects and situations. This point is underscored by the next line of the text, which describes the two standard responses to the four moves: “‘This is like what's been said’ is ‘the same.’ ‘How can I call it that?’ is ‘different.’” A further important observation is that these techniques, along with the practice of citing models or exemplars, are not the proprietary methods of the Mohist school, but standard rhetorical moves employed habitually by classical thinkers and rhetoricians of all stripes. A survey of the ancient literature quickly confirms this point. The Mozi is full of arguments matching these descriptions. But so are the scores of essays and anecdotes collected in the The Annals of Lü Buwei (Lüshi Chunqiu). Mencius, not a thinker one normally associates with the study of logic, is depicted as using them regularly (though not always correctly or intelligibly; see Mencius 6A:3). The four moves are thus probably representative of the art of disputation as generally practiced in the 3rd century B.C.

7.3 Limitations of the Methods

Despite the Mohists' general optimism about the power of disputation to resolve scientific, ethical, and political problems, the main aim of the “Small Selection” is to warn against blindly relying on its formal methods. Unlike a valid deductive argument, analogical disputation is not invariably reliable. A typical disputation might consist of first “drawing parallels” (mou) between one or more structurally similar statements and then contending that since we accept these, we should accept a further parallel statement. The problem the Mohists emphasize is that formal linguistic parallels are a reliable guide to distinguishing kinds only up to a point, because things similar in some respects may not be similar in others (NO12). Whether a term is “so” (ran)—that is, correctly predicable of something—depends on “that which makes it so” (suo yi ran), in effect its satisfaction conditions. Expressions (ci) similar in structure may have dissimilar satisfaction conditions. So the parallelism between two chains of statements originating from formally similar expressions may fail as disputers “proceed” (xing) to develop the chains by adding new expressions to them. Hence “one mustn't be careless” in using the four disputation techniques (NO12). Any prima facie guidance provided by linguistic parallels must always be checked against our know-how concerning the “reasons” (gu, here probably functionally similar to satisfaction conditions) for distinguishing various kinds (lei).

We can illustrate the Mohists' worries by a pair of examples, one an analogical extension they would accept, the other one they would reject.[20] Consider the “expressions” (ci) ‘white horses are horses’ and ‘black horses are horses’. Suppose we “draw a parallel” between these and “proceed” (xing) to make further, parallel assertions, as follows:

White horses are horses, riding white horses is riding horses.
Black horses are horses, riding black horses is riding horses.

Now suppose we want to persuade someone that, like riding white or black horses, the activity of riding brown horses is of the kind riding horses. We draw a further parallel, and, assuming the other person has accepted our pair of exemplars, “extend” (tui) to our claim about riding brown horses:

Brown horses are horses, riding brown horses is riding horses.

White, black, and brown horses are all of the kind horse, and whenever any of them is ridden, the satisfaction conditions for the kind riding horses obtain. So in this example, the formal parallel between the three chains of statements reflects a genuine semantic parallel as we “proceed” (xing) from the “expressions” about colored horses being horses to those about riding colored horses being riding horses. This family of cases the Mohists call “this and so,” because with respect to the kind horse, white, black, and brown horses are all “this” (shi), and with respect to the kind riding horses, riding any of these is “so” (ran).

Now consider the “expressions” ‘Jack is a person’ and ‘Jill is a person’. Again we “draw a parallel” between them and “proceed” to further, parallel assertions, as follows:

Jack is a person, killing Jack is killing people.
Jill is a person, killing Jill is killing people.

These chains are formally parallel to the horse-riding examples. Like them, these are cases of “this and so.” For the Mohists, ‘killing people’ is murder, the unjustified killing of innocent people. Jack and Jill are people who (we assume) are innocent of any crime. So if they are killed, then the satisfaction conditions for the kind killing people obtain. Now suppose we take the expression ‘robbers are people’ and draw a further parallel:

Robbers are people, killing robbers is killing people.

‘Robbers are people’ is parallel to ‘Jack (or Jill) is a person’, and like Jack and Jill, robbers are “this” (shi) with respect to the kind people. But despite the formal parallels between the three strings of expressions, the Mohists would reject the analogical extension from ‘Killing Jack (or Jill) is killing people’ to ‘Killing robbers is killing people’. In their eyes, killing robbers is justified execution of criminals, not murder. The satisfaction criteria for the kind killing robbers diverge from those for killing people; the two types of actions are not “of a kind.” [21] So this time, when we “proceed” along the three parallel chains of statements, the expressions (ci) “diverge” (xing er yi). Unlike the statements about the horses, Jack, and Jill, all of which the Mohists would classify as “this and so,” the statement about robbers is “this and not-so.” Analogical extension holds only between cases of the same type, so we cannot “extend” from exemplars that are “this and so” to a case that belongs in the category “this and not-so.”

The grounds for rejecting ‘Killing robbers is killing people’ reflect the fundamental orientation of the Mohists’ project. The writers are not seeking to identify formally valid inference procedures. They are investigating ways in which formally parallel strings of claims involving terms correctly distinguished as “similar” may fail to reliably produce further parallel, correct claims. Analogical extension of the parallels may lead to claims that violate the semantic norms for distinguishing the kinds denoted by the terms involved. When formally parallel claims conflict with what they see as the correct kind distinctions, the Mohists reject them on the basis of their knowledge of semantics, which they take to be more fundamental than syntactic or logical form.

The second half of the “Small Selection” presents a taxonomy of five kinds of semantic relations between “expressions,” of which “this and so” and “this and not-so” are the first two. (The others are “not-this but so,” “one universal and one not,” and “one this and one not-this.”) The aim of the text is twofold: to clarify the ways in which strings of expressions do and do not remain genuinely analogous as they “proceed,” and to defend Mohist positions, specifically the rejection of fatalism and the advocacy of capital punishment for robbers. (Opponents appear to have claimed that the latter was inconsistent with the doctrine of inclusive concern.) For at least the first three of the groups in the taxonomy, the Mohists hold that analogical extension based on formal parallels between expressions within the same group will reliably yield correct assertions. This is the technique they use to defend their position on capital punishment. From a series of (purportedly) uncontroversial claims of the type “this and not-so,” they make an analogical extension to the claims that not being concerned for robbers isn’t not being concerned for people (it isn’t failing to practice inclusive concern) and that killing robbers isn’t killing people (it isn’t murder).

Jill’s parents are people, but Jill’s serving her parents isn’t serving people [being a servant].

Her brother is a handsome man, but concern for her brother isn’t concern for a handsome man….

Robbers are people, but having many robbers isn’t having many people.

Having no robbers isn’t having no people….

Disliking having many robbers isn’t disliking having many people.

Desiring to have no robbers isn’t desiring to have no people.

The world agrees that these are right. If such is the case, then although robbers are people,

concern for robbers isn’t concern for people;

not being concerned for robbers isn’t not being concerned for people;

killing robbers isn’t killing people.

There's no difficulty in this. These and the preceding claims are of the same kind (tong lei)….

These are “this and not-so.” (NO15)

We are expected to agree that killing robbers is not killing people because we see that the semantic relation between ‘killing robbers’ and ‘killing people’ is similar to the relation between ‘concern for her brother’ and ‘concern for a handsome man’ and the other exemplars. With “expressions” of the same kind, we can “proceed” without problem through a formally similar chain of assertions. So if one chain is accepted, by analogical extension the others should be. By contrast, analogical extension across kinds will be faulty, as we can see from the supposedly fallacious parallel between ‘Riding white horses is riding horses’ and ‘Killing robbers is killing people’.

What is the basis for the five-way classification? What makes killing robbers a case of “this and not-so” rather than “this and so”? The Mohists answer neither question explicitly.[22] They simply stipulate that killing robbers is not an action of the kind killing people, and hence it belongs with the other examples under “this and not-so.” But to many readers, the whole “this and not-so” group will look suspiciously ad hoc. Why isn't Jill's concern (ai, also “care” or “love”) for her good-looking brother an instance of concern for a handsome man? Granted that sisterly concern is different from sexual attraction, it is still concern, in this case directed at a man who happens to be good-looking. Similarly, granted that executing robbers is different from murder, it is still an event in which people are killed. Surely the Mohists could have found a more compelling way to do justice to the distinctions at stake than by insisting on the paradoxical claim that killing robbers isn't killing people. One obvious alternative would be to appeal to ambiguity of scope. The Mohists could point out that ‘killing people’ refers generally to all kinds of actions in which someone causes someone to die. These include a range of more specific kinds of actions, among them intentional, morally wrong killing of the innocent (murder) and community-sanctioned, morally justified killing of criminals (execution). Thus killing robbers may be of the kind killing people without being of the kind morally wrong killing.

This is the approach that Xunzi adopts in handling a similar issue. He contends that a general term can have two or more distinct uses, grounded in different bases or “starting points” (duan). The different uses can be specified by combining (jian) names. He argues, for example, that there are two types of honor and disgrace, “moral honor and disgrace” and “status honor and disgrace.” A person could be honored with high status while in fact being morally disgraceful or vice versa.[23] The Mohists could similarly distinguish two kinds of killing, “moral killing” and “immoral killing.”

Why don't they? Part of the explanation, no doubt, is that the idea simply didn't occur to them. Writing after the Mohists and perhaps familiar with their work, Xunzi seems to have thought through the issues more carefully and developed a more sophisticated theory.[24] Unlike the Mohists, who as we saw distinguish only three sorts of names—reaching, kind, and personal—Xunzi distinguishes many possible levels of general terms (gong ming), specifically explaining that, among general terms, a “compound” name (such as ‘moral killing’) and a “single” name (such as ‘killing’) can both refer to the same thing, the single name being more general. Xunzi's approach might resolve many of the Mohists' concerns about name compounding.

But there may be another, deeper explanation as well. The Mohists seem never to have moved fully beyond the one-name-one-thing view. The idea that each unit of language should denote some discrete kind (lei), or part of reality, lingers in their treatment of the robbers example. Their study of compound terms showed that the extension of most phrases is not determined merely by summing the extensions of their component words. Unlike the case of ‘oxen-and-horses’, ‘white horse’ does not denote the sum of all white things and all horses. The semantics of phrases or “expressions” (ci) requires a separate explanation of its own, beyond our explanation of the semantics of names (ming). Yet the “killing robbers” example shows the Mohists treating phrases the same way they handle names, attempting to pin down a one-to-one referential relation between ‘killing robbers’ or ‘concern for handsome men’ and distinct kinds of shí (objects, events, situations). They still seem to think that the key to distinguishing kinds correctly and reliably lies in specifying the discrete kind of shí denoted by each expression. Specifying one-to-one reference relations in this way, so as to eliminate uncertainty or ambiguity in distinguishing the things denoted by each name, is precisely what texts such as the Analects, Xunzi, and the The Annals of Lü Buwei call “rectifying names” (zheng ming). So, as Hansen (1992) notes, in the “Small Selection” the Mohists are in effect aiming to rectify phrases, instead of only names. They stipulate, for instance, that ‘killing people’ be used to refer to only a certain kind of shí (event, situation), distinct from that denoted by ‘killing robbers’. The simple one-name-one-thing view has no room for ambiguity or terms of different scope, some of whose extensions fall within others. It holds that the extensions of different phrases must be distinct—as, on the normal interpretation, those of killing robbers and killing people are not—or confusion will result and communication will fail. But this view has counterintuitive consequences, and there are more compelling alternatives, as Xunzi shows. To develop a tenable semantic theory, the Mohists needed to break with the one-name-one-thing model more decisively.

In later Mohist philosophy, we see ancient Chinese thinkers making impressive advances in ethics, philosophy of language, epistemology, and informal logic. In each of these areas, the Mohists develop a credible theory and discover philosophical problems that they grapple with vigorously, if not fully successfully. Despite its flaws, their ethical theory is a tremendous achievement: history's first form of indirect consequentialism, grounded in a conception of benefit or welfare as what produces happiness. Their semantic theory and epistemology offer an intriguing, non-mentalistic approach to language, mind, and knowledge, one that deserves further attention today. They pioneer the study of logic and develop a basic theory of analogical argumentation, though making only limited progress in exploring cogency in analogical extension. And this is not to mention their investigations in metaphysics, mechanics, optics, and geometry. Regrettably, the Mohists' multifaceted inquiries came to an end as their movement faded away during the first century of the former Han dynasty (202 B.C.-23 A.D.). Interest in topics inspired by language arose again among a few intellectuals during the later Han (25-220 A.D.) and the Wei-Jin period (220-589 A.D.), but in ethical theory, language, logic, and epistemology, later Chinese thinkers never surpassed the achievements of their classical forebears.[25]


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