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Mental Imagery

First published Tue Nov 18, 1997; substantive revision Thu Aug 4, 2005

Mental imagery (varieties of which are sometimes colloquially referred to as "visualizing," "seeing in the mind's eye," "hearing in the head," "imagining the feel of," etc.) is quasi-perceptual experience; it resembles perceptual experience, but occurs in the absence of the appropriate external stimuli. It is also generally understood to bear intentionality (i.e., mental images are always images of something or other), and thereby to function as a form of mental representation. Traditionally, visual mental imagery, the most discussed variety, was thought to be caused by the presence of picture-like representations (mental images) in the mind, soul, or brain, but this is no longer universally accepted.

Very often, imagery experiences are understood by their subjects as echoes, copies, or reconstructions of actual perceptual experiences from their past; at other times they may seem to anticipate possible, often desired or feared, future experiences. Thus imagery has often been believed to play a very large, even pivotal, role in both memory (Yates, 1966; Paivio, 1986) and motivation (McMahon, 1973). It is also commonly believed to be centrally involved in visuo-spatial reasoning and inventive or creative thought. Indeed, according to a long dominant philosophical tradition, it plays a crucial role in all thought processes, and provides the semantic grounding for language. However, in the 20th century vigorous objections were raised against this tradition, and it is now widely repudiated.

1. Meanings and Connotations of ‘Mental Imagery’

Mental imagery is a familiar aspect of most people's everyday experience (Galton, 1880; Betts, 1909; Doob, 1972; Marks, 1972, 1999). There are a few people (perhaps found in disproportionate numbers amongst scientists and other intellectuals (Galton, 1880; Betts, 1909)) who say that they rarely, or even never, experience imagery, but, for the vast majority of us, it is a familiar and commonplace feature of our conscious mental lives. The English language supplies quite a range of idiomatic ways of referring to visual mental imagery: ‘visualizing,’ ‘seeing in the mind's eye,’ ‘having a picture in one's head,’ ‘picturing,’ ‘having/seeing a mental image/picture,’ and so on. There seem to be fewer ways to talk about imagery in other sensory modes, but there is little doubt that it occurs, and the experiencing of imagery in any sensory mode is often referred to as ‘imagining’ (the appearance, feel, smell, sound, or flavor of something). Alternatively, the quasi-perceptual nature of an experience may be indicated merely by putting the relevant sensory verb (‘see,’ ‘hear,’ ‘taste,’ etc.) in actual or implied "scare quotes."

Despite the familiarity of the experience, the precise meaning of the expression ‘mental imagery’ is remarkably hard to pin down, and differing understandings of it have often added considerably to the confusion of the already complex and fractious debates, amongst philosophers, psychologists, and cognitive scientists, concerning imagery's nature, its psychological functions (if any), and even its very existence. In the philosophical and scientific literature (and a fortiori in everyday discourse), the expression ‘mental imagery’ (or ‘mental images’) may be used in any or all of at least three different senses, which are only occasionally explicitly distinguished, and all too often conflated:

[1] quasi-perceptual conscious experience per se;
[2] hypothetical picture-like representations in the mind and/or brain that give rise to [1];
[3] inner representations of any sort (picture-like or otherwise) that directly give rise to [1].

Far too many discussions of visual mental imagery fail to draw a clear distinction between the contention that people have quasi-visual experiences and the contention that such experiences are to be explained by the presence of representations, in the mind or brain, that are in some sense picture-like. This picture theory (or pictorial theory) of imagery experience is deeply entrenched in our language and our folk psychology. The very word ‘image,’ after all, suggests a picture. However, although the majority of both laymen and experts probably continue to accept some form of picture theory, many 20th century philosophers and psychologists, from a variety of theoretical traditions, have argued strongly against it, and, in several cases they have developed quite detailed alternative, non-pictorial accounts of the nature and causes of imagery experiences (e.g., Dunlap, 1914; Washburn, 1916; Sartre, 1940; Ryle, 1949; Shorter, 1952; Skinner, 1953, 1974; Dennett, 1969; Sarbin & Juhasz, 1970; Sarbin, 1972; Pylyshyn, 1973, 1978, 1981, 2002a, 2003a, 2005; Neisser, 1976; Hinton, 1979; Slezak, 1991, 1995; Thomas, 1999b). Others, it should be said, have developed and defended picture theory in sophisticated ways in the attempt to meet these critiques (e.g., Hannay, 1971; Kosslyn, 1980, 1983,1994; von Eckardt, 1988, 1993; Tye, 1988, 1991; Cohen, 1996). However, despite these developments, much philosophical and scientific discussion about imagery and the cognitive functions it may or may not serve contines to be based on the often unspoken (and even unexamined) assumption that, if there is mental imagery at all, it must consist in inner pictures.

In the introduction to this entry, in order to avoid making a premature commitment to the picture theory, and in accordance with definitions given by psychologists such as McKellar (1957), Richardson (1969), and Finke (1989), mental imagery was characterized as a form of experience (i.e., as [1]). However, this itself is far from unproblematic. Evidence for the occurrence of any experience is necessarily subjective and introspective, and, because of this, those who have doubts about the validity of introspection as a scientific method, may well be led to question whether there is any place for a concept such as imagery within a truly scientific world view. J.B. Watson, the influential instigator of the Behaviorist movement that dominated scientific psychology (especially in the United States) for much of the 20th century, questioned the very existence of imagery for just these sorts of reasons (Watson, 1913a, 1913b, 1928; and see section 3.6, below, and Thomas, 1989). Although few later Behaviorist psychologists (or their philosophical allies) expressed themselves on the matter in quite the strong and explicit terms sometimes used by Watson, the era of Behaviorist psychology is characterized by a marked skepticism about imagery (if not its existence, at least its psychological importance) amongst both psychologists and philosophers. Imagery did not become widely discussed again among scientific psychologists (or philosophers of psychology) until aroound the end of the 1960s, when Behaviorism began to be displaced by Cognitivism as the dominant psychological paradigm. Most informed contemporary discussions of imagery, amongst both philosophers and psychologists, are still very much shaped by this recent history of skepticism about imagery (or iconophobia, as it is sometimes called), and the subsequent reaction against it.

By contrast with their Behaviorist predecessors, most cognitive psychologists today hold that imagery has an essential role to play in our mental economy. Many may share some of the reservations of their Behaviorist predecessors about the place of introspection and subjectivity in science, but they take the view that imagery must be real (and scientifically interesting) because it is explanatorily necessary: The results of many experiments on cognitive functioning, they hold, cannot be satisfactorily explained without making appeal to the storage and processing of imaginal mental representations. The belief that such mental representations are real is justified in the same sort of way that belief in the reality of electrons, or natural selection, or gravitational fields (or other scientifically sanctioned "unobservables") is justified: Imagery is known to exist inasmuch as the explanations that rely upon imaginal representations are known to be true. From this perspective, some recent authors have recommended that the term ‘imagery’ should not be understood as referring to a form of subjective experience, but, rather, to a certain type of "underlying representation" (Block, 1981a, Introduction; Block, 1983a; Kosslyn, 1983; Wraga & Kosslyn, 2003; and see also, Dennett, 1978). Such representations are "mental" in the sense now commonplace in cognitive science: i.e., they are conceived of as being embodied as brain states, but as individuated by their functional (and computational) role in cognition. As Block (1981a, 1983a) points out, an advantage of defining mental imagery in this way (i.e., as an unspecified form of representation, as [3] rather than [2]) is that it does not beg the controversial question of whether the relevant representations are, in any interesting sense, picture-like.

However, if it is not because they are picture-like, what is it that makes these mental representations mental images? Presumably the idea is that a mental representation deserves to be called an image if it is of such a type that its presence to mind (i.e. its playing a role in some currently occurring cognitive process) can give rise to a quasi-perceptual experience of what is represented. But this move relies upon our already having a grasp of the experiential conception of imagery which thus must be more fundamental than the representational conception just outlined. Furthermore, to define imagery in the way that Block, Kosslyn etc. suggest, as first and foremost a form of representation (as explanans rather than explanandum), is to beg more basic and equally controversial questions about the nature of the mind and the causes of quasi-perceptual experiences. There are, in fact, a number of scientists and philosophers, from quite a range of disciplinary and theoretical perspectives, who hold that imagery experiences are not to be explained in terms of the presence to mind of computational or neural representations (e.g., Sartre, 1940; Ryle, 1949; Skinner, 1953, 1974; Sarbin, 1972; Thomas, 1999b; O'Regan J.K. Noë, 2001; Bartolomeo, 2002; Bennett & Hacker, 2003).

It should be admitted, however, that focusing too narrowly on the experiential conception of imagery has its own potential dangers. In particular, it may obscure the very real possibility, foregrounded by the representational conception, that importantly similar underlying representations or mechanisms may sometimes be operative both when we consciously experience imagery and sometimes when we do not. Some evidence, such as Paivio's (1971, 1983a, 1991) work on the differential memorability of words with different "imagery values" (see section 4.2, below), suggests that this is indeed the case.

In practice, both the experiential and the representational conceptions of imagery are frequently encountered in the literature of the subject. Unfortunately, it is often hard to tell which is intended in any particular case. Even where they are not actually conflated, confusion can arise when one conception is favored over the other without this ever being made sufficiently clear or explicit. Although it would be pedantic and potentially confusing to insist on explicitly drawing the distinction everywhere, where it seems important or helpful to do so this entry will refer to imagery experiences (or quasi-perceptual experiences) on the one hand, and imagery representations (or imagery processes) on the other.

There are further potential problems, however, with the brief characterization of imagery given in our introduction. Not only does what is said there duck the difficult (and rarely considered) task of specifying what dimensions and degrees of similarity to perception are necessary for an experience to count as imagery; it also elides the controversial question of whether, despite the surface resemblance, imagery is a sui generis phenomenon, conceptually quite distinct from true perceptual experience, or whether imagery and perception differ only in degree rather than in kind.

Some, such as Hume (1740), hold that percepts (impressions in his terminology) and images (ideas) do not differ in kind, but only in their causal history and their degree of "vivacity". A related view, implicit in many discussions (and explicitly defended by Thomas (1997a, 1999b)), is that imagery lies at one end of a spectrum stretching from veridical, stimulus-driven and stimulus-constrained perception at one end, to "pure" imagery (where the content of the experience is quite independent of any current stimulus input) at the other. Several varieties of imaginative preceptual experience may be taken to fill in the continuum between these extremes: mistaken or illusive perceptions (imagining, for instance, that the bush seen indistinctly in the darkness is a bear), and various types of non-deceptive seeing as or seeing in (such as imagining a cloud to have the shape of a camel, weasel, or whale; seeing someone's sadness in their eyes; or "seeing" the notorious duck-rabbit figure as a duck [or rabbit]).

Others, however, most notably Sartre (1936; cf. Wittgenstein, 1961 §621 ff.), argue that there is a sharp conceptual and phenomenological distinction to be drawn between imagery and perception proper. After all, it is argued, our imagination, unlike our perception, is under the control of our will (and experienced as such). Provided I know what an elephant looks like, I can choose to imagine one wherever and whenever I want to, but I cannot choose to see an elephant unless one actually happens to be present. By contrast, if an elephant is present before my open eyes, I cannot help but see it, whether I will or no.[1] Furthermore, it is claimed that (in sharp contrast to perception) we can derive no new information about the world from our imagery: No image can contain anything except what the imager put there, which must already have been in his or her mind (Sartre, 1940; Wittgenstein, 1961 §627). (However, this negative view of the epistemological value of imagery is rejected by Kosslyn (1980, 1983), and the arguments of Sartre and Wittgenstein on this point have been rebutted in some detail by Taylor (1981).)[2]

Another way in which the expresion ‘mental imagery’ (together with many of its colloquial near-equivalents) may be misleading is that it may tend to suggest that we are thinking only of quasi-visual phenomena. Despite the fact that most scholarly discussion of imagery, in the past and today, does indeed focus mainly or exclusively upon its visual aspect, in fact, other modes of quasi-perceptual experience are just as real, and, very likely, are just as common and just as psychologically important (Newton, 1982). Contemporary cognitive scientists generally recognize this, and interesting studies of auditory imagery, kinaesthetic (or motor) imagery, olfactory imagery, haptic (touch) imagery, and so forth, can be found in the recent scientific literature (e.g., Segal & Fusella, 1971; Reisberg, 1992; Klatzky, Lederman, & Matula, 1991; Jeannerod, 1994; Bensafi et al., 2003). (Although such studies still remain vastly outnumbered by studies of visual imagery.) ‘Imagery’ has become the generally accepted term, amongst cognitive scientists, for quasi-perceptual experience in any sense mode (or any combination of sense modes).

On a more consensual note, with only rare exceptions (e.g. Wright, 1983) nearly all serious discussions of imagery take it for granted that it bears intentionality in the sense of being of, about, or directed at something (Harman, 1998): A mental image is always an image of something or other (whether real or unreal), in the same sense that perception (whether veridical or not) is always perception of something (see Anscombe, 1965). It is in virtue of this intentionality that mental imagery may be (and usually is) regarded as a species of mental representation that can, and often does, play an important role in our thought processes.

It is also generally accepted that imagery is, for the most part, subject to voluntary control. Although it is true that images often come into the mind unbidden, and sometimes it is hard to shake off unwanted imagery (for instance, a memory of some horrible sight that one cannot get out of one's mind), most of us, most of the time can quite freely and voluntarily conjure-up and manipulate imagery of whatever we may please (provided, of course, that we know what it looks like).

It is largely because of these features of intentionality and voluntary control that imagery may be seen as a quintessentially mental phenomenon, in contrast to other sorts of quasi-perceptual phenomena, such as afterimages (Richardson, 1969 ch.2; Grüsser & Landis, 1991 ch. 23) and phosphenes (Oster, 1970; Grüsser & Landis, 1991 ch. 10), both of which are generally thought to be explicable in purely (and fairly straightforward) physiological terms. Afterimages and phosphenes are phenomenologically different from the mental imagery of memory and imagination, and they seem not to bear intentionality (and so, unlike mental images, they do not function as mental representations), and they are not subject to direct voluntary control. Also, mental imagery should not be (and rarely is) confused with the hypothetical very short-term visual memory store known as "iconic memory" or "the icon" (Neisser, 1967; Long, 1980; Haber, 1983). Although this, at least arguably, is cognitive and representational rather than a purely physiological function, unlike imagery it functions automatically and unconsciously, and is quite outside our voluntary control.

On the other hand, the rare, poorly understood, and controversial phenomenon known as eidetic imagery apparently resembles ordinary mental imagery in intentionality, but is said to be phenomenologically distinct in point of its great vividness, detail, and stability, and because it is "externally projected," experienced as "out there" rather than "in the head". Thus the experience of eidetic imagery is supposedly much more akin to seeing a real, external object or scene, than is ordinary imagery experience. (However, eidetikers, as they are sometimes called, are generally reported as having a fair degree of voluntary control over their eidetic images, and rarely if ever seem to mistake them for objective realities.) According to Haber (1979), eidetic ability is found almost exclusively amongst young children, and is fairly rare even amongst them, occurring only in about 2% to 15% of American under-twelves. Other investigators, however, have reported evidence of adult eidetic ability (Jaensch, 1930; Doob, 1964, 1965; Stromeyer & Psotka, 1970), and Ahsen (1965, 1977) holds that most or all of us have at least a potential eidetic capacity.

Unfortunately, however, there is no scientific consensus regarding the nature, the proper definition, or even the very existence of eidetic imagery (see the commentaries published with Haber, 1979). Some investigators, most notably Haber (1979), hold that it is a real (albeit elusive), distinct, and sui generis psychological phenomenon, whose mechanisms and psychological functions (if any) may well turn out to be quite different from those of ordinary memory or imagination imagery. Others, however, such as Gray & Gummerman (1975) and Bugelski (1979), argue that reports of eidetic imagery are best understood as rather hyperbolic descriptions of ordinary visual memory imagery.

It may also be worth pointing out that mental imagery should not be confused with imagery as the term has come to be used in literary criticism, where it usually seems to mean something like metaphor or figurative language, and, in particular, highly concrete, perceptually specific language that is used primarily for its suggestive or emotional effect. Furbank (1970) has traced the history of this usage (of which he is sharply critical). It seems likely that the usage originally arose because it was assumed that the distinctive effects of these linguistic tropes arise from their power to arouse actual mental imagery in a reader, and some literary theorists have recently attempted to revive this way of thinking about literary imagery (Esrock, 1994; Scarry, 1999). However, it is certainly not safe to assume that someone who mentions imagery in a literary context necessarily intends to allude to quasi-perceptual experience.

3. Imagery in the Age of Experimental Psychology

For the late 19th century researchers who established psychology as an empirical scientific discipline, mental images (often, following the established usage of the Empiricist philosophical tradition, referred to as ideas) held just the same central place in the explanation of cognition that they had held for philosophical psychologists of earlier times. However, developments within psychology at the beginning of the 20th century began to cast doubt on this long established consensus. A group of psychologists working in Würzburg, Germany claimed to have found empirical evidence for conscious thought contents that are not imaginal or perceptual in character. Their results were challenged on several grounds, and were certainly never definitively established. Nevertheless, the bitter dispute that ensued, the so called imageless thought controversy, had a profound effect on the development of scientific psychology (and, very arguably, of philosophy too). Most psychologists became, in effect, profoundly disillusioned with the whole notion of mental imagery, and either avoided seriously considering the topic, treated it dismissively, or, in some extreme cases, denied the existence of the phenomenon outright. These attitudes noticeably influenced other disciplines, including philosophy. Although the psychological study of imagery revived with the rise of cognitivism in the 1960s and 70s, when new experimental techniques were developed that enabled a truly experimental study of the phenomenon, current views about, and attitudes towards, mental imagery cannot be properly understood without an awareness of this history, versions of which, of varying degrees of accuracy, have passed into the folklore of psychology.

3.1 Founders of Experimental Psychology: Wilhelm Wundt and William James

When psychology first began to emerge as an experimental science, in the philosophy departments of the German universities in the late 19th century, the central role of imagery in mental life was not in question. Wilhelm Wundt, acclaimed "the father of experimental psychology", established the first psychological research and teaching laboratory within the Leipzig Philosophy Department in around 1876 (Fancher, 1996). He regarded his psychology as a branch of philosophy, an attempt to apply the experimental methods of natural science (particularly, the physiology of Helmholtz) to essentially philosophical problems concerning the nature of mind and its metaphysical status. This view of the subject persisted, in Germany, at least until the Nazi era. Wundt's research program aimed to investigate the "elements of consciousness," and the laws governing the combination of these elements (Wundt, 1912). Although his theoretical system made a place for emotional feelings as one class of element, in practice the main focus of Wundt's experimentally based research program was on the elements of sensation and their compounding into ideas. As has been the case in the Empiricist philosophical tradition, these ideas were conceived of as, to all intents and purposes, mental images. Indeed, Wundt insists, much in the spirit of Hume, that there is no fundamental difference in kind between the ideas arising directly from perception and "memory images" (Wundt, 1912). Thus, Wundtian experimental psychology was largely a study of cognitive processes, and, for him (and most of his numerous students and imitators), the mental image (under the rubric idea) played essentially the same crucial, representational role in cognition that it had played for most of his philosophical predecessors.

Wundt's American counterpart, and contemporary, William James, took a not dissimilar view, although he was careful to acknowledge that in some people the "thought stuff," as he called it, might consist not so much of visual imagery as of imagery of other modes, especially the "verbal images" of inner speech (James, 1890 ch. 18). In his textbook The Principles of Psychology (1890) James has much that is insightful to say about psychological processes in general, and about the role of imagery in them in particular, but, although he presented experimental demonstrations in the course of his psychology teaching at Harvard, James had little interest in the actual pursuit of experimental research, and established no graduate teaching program in experimental psychology (Fancher, 1996). Thus, despite the lucidity of his justly famous text, and the wide readership it has continued to find, his direct influence on the disciplinary development of scientific psychology, even in his native America, probably never equaled that of Wundt (or even lesser German pioneers, such as G.E. Müller), who trained many Americans (as well as many Germans, and students of other nationalities) in the techniques of experimental research. Just around this time, when psychology was the latest intellectual fashion, the American Universities were undergoing a tremendous expansion. Thus many of these students were able to return from Germany to the United States to found experimental psychology teaching programs of their own. It was because of this, much more than the intellectual influence of James, that the U.S.A., well before it grew into a dominant world power and achieved its current leadership in the sciences generally, quickly grew to rival, and eventually surpass, Germany's initial preeminence in scientific psychology.

Although psychologists of this era have often been portrayed (notably by Boring (1950)) as using an introspective methodology, in fact Wundt, in particular, was very sensitive to standard criticisms of introspection, such as the contention that the very attempt to observe our own mental activities will itself alter them. He thus limited its use to situations where he was satisfied that the causes of the relevant mental events, the experimental stimuli, could be strictly controlled and the results shown to be replicable, with any introspective reports being made unreflectively, as soon as the relevant content appeared in the mind (Mischel, 1970; Danziger, 1980). Wundt's research did not rely upon discursive descriptions of mental contents. An "introspective" report in his laboratory might typically have involved no more than indicating the moment when a certain sensation entered consciousness, or saying whether a musical tone seemed higher or lower than the one presented just before. Such "introspective reports" differ little from the sorts of responses that might be called for in many modern cognitive psychology experiments. Wundt's methodological discipline meant that the data collected in his laboratory were primarily such things as reaction times or discrimination thresholds, rather than introspective accounts of inner contents or processes; it also meant, in practice, that his experiments were restricted almost entirely to the study of "lower" psychological processes, principally sensation and perception. Thus, although Wundt did hold that "higher" mental process, such as thought and memory, depended largely upon mental images (including verbal imagery, silent speech), in practice his experimental work did little directly to illuminate these. "Higher" mental processes, for Wundt, were best investigated non-experimentally, via a methodology that he called völkerpsychologie, a hermeneutic study of cultural products to which he devoted much of his later career, but which never achieved anything like the influence of his experimentally based work.

3.2 Edward B. Titchener: The Complete Iconophile

An Englishman, Edward B. Titchener, became one of Wundt's most influential students. After graduate studies with Wundt, Titchener moved to the United States and became Professor of Psychology at Cornell, where, as well as being responsible for translating many of the more experimentally oriented works of Wundt into English, he established a successful graduate school and a vigorous research program (Tweney, 1987). Despite the fact that Wundt's and Titchener's philosophical and theoretical views, and their scientific methodologies, differed in important ways (Leahey, 1981), Titchener, much more than most of his American born colleagues, shared Wundt's vision of psychology as a pure science, with essentially philosophical rather than pragmatic ends, and he gained the reputation of being Wundt's leading disciple and representative in the English speaking world. However, he had no interest in his master's völkerpsychologie. Titchener had been deeply influenced by positivist optimism as to the scope of science, and he hoped to study even the "higher" thought processes experimentally (Danziger, 1979, 1980). Thus he attempted to push the method of controlled laboratory introspection far beyond the bounds that Wundt had so carefully set for it. Although he certainly knew why Wundt rejected introspection as a method for studying these processes, he believed its pitfalls could be avoided if the introspectors were suitably trained. Thus, an important part of the education of a psychologist in Titchener's laboratory was a rigorous training in how to introspect reliably (Titchener, 1901-5; Schwitzgebel, 2004).

Titchener appears to have been both a particularly vivid imager, and a firm believer in imagery's cognitive importance. He had studied British Empiricist philosophy whilst an undergraduate at Oxford, and was well aware of Berkeley's argument that "general ideas" (i.e. mental images that, in-and-of-themselves, represent kinds or categories of things, rather than particulars) are inconceivable. Berkeley argues that, for instance, the general idea of a triangle, would (per impossible) need to be an image of something that is:

neither oblique nor rectangle, neither equilateral, equicrural, nor scalenon, but all and none of these at once. In effect it is something imperfect that cannot exist, an idea wherein some parts of several different and inconsistent ideas are put together. (Berkeley, 1734).
Many philosophers today take Berkeley's argument to amount to a knock-down refutation of the traditional theory that images (ideas) are the primary vehicles of thought and that they ground linguistic meaning.[3] If mental images can only, intrinsically represent particulars, as Berkeley held, then they are surely inadequate for grounding the meanings of the general, categorical terms that are fundamental to thought and language. Titchener, however, flatly rejected Berkeley's claim, not because he found a flaw in his logic, but on introspective grounds:
But I can quite well get … the triangle that is no triangle at all and all triangles at one and the same time. It is a flashy thing, come and gone from moment to moment: it hints two or three red angles, with the red lines deepening into black, seen on a dark green ground. It is not there long enough to say whether the angles join to form the complete figure, or even whether all three of the necessary angles are given. Nevertheless, it means triangle; it is Locke's general idea of a triangle; (Titchener, 1909).

Of course, Titchener was well aware that the image described here was thoroughly idiosyncratic. However, he did want to claim that such images (in virtue not so much of their individual, intrinsic characteristics, but of their place in a whole associative network of imagery) do carry meaning, and are thus fitted to be the vehicles of thought. He also described examples of his own visualizations of abstract concepts (such as the concept of meaning itself: "the blue-grey tip of a kind of scoop … digging into a dark mass of what appears to be plastic material") and even claimed to experience imaginal meanings of connectives such as but (Titchener, 1909). Titchener plainly held that (together with actual sensations, and emotional feelings) mental content is mental imagery.

3.3 The Perky Experiment

Titchener's theories, and, to a very large extent, the introspection based experimental methods he used to test and refine them, have long since fallen into disrepute.[4] However, one series of experiments carried out in Titchener's laboratory, by his student C.W. Perky (1910), has achieved something of a classic, even mythic, status in the literature on imagery. Perky asked her subjects to fixate a point on a screen in front of them and to visualize various objects there, such as a tomato, a book, a leaf, a banana, an orange, or a lemon. As the subjects did this, and unbeknownst to them, a faint patch of color, of an appropriate size and shape, and just above the normal threshold of visibility, was back projected (in soft focus) onto the screen. Apart from on a couple of occasions when the projection apparatus was mishandled, none of Perky's subjects (who ranged from a ten year old child to the trained and experienced introspectors of Titchener's laboratory) ever realized that they were experiencing real percepts; they took what they "saw" on the screen to be entirely the products of their imagination. In fact, however, the projections did influence their experiences: some subjects expressed surprise at finding themselves imagining a banana "upright" rather than the horizontally oriented one they had been trying for; one was surprised to wind up imagining an elm leaf after trying for a maple. On the other hand, purely imaginary details were also reported: One subject could "see" the veins of the leaf; another claimed that the title on the imagined book was readable.

It may be very tempting to take Perky's experiment as a clear demonstration that there are no differences in kind between the subjective experiences of perception and imagery. Although perception is usually more vivid (or, as Hume put it, has greater "vivacity") than mental imagery, the experiment appears to show that this is, at best, a mere difference in degree, and cannot guarantee that we will not systematically confuse the two. However, it is notable that the projected color patches in Perky's setup were clearly seen as such by witnesses who were not actively striving to form an image (Perky, 1910). Furthermore, Segal (1971b) reports that her initial attempts to replicate Perky's findings were a failure. Her subjects spontaneously noticed the projected color patches. In order to reproduce "the Perky effect," Segal found it necessary to induce a prior state of relaxation in her subjects (Segal & Nathan, 1964; Segal, 1971b).[5]

In her replication and extension of Perky's work, Segal also tried projecting faint pictures that were quite different from the mental image she had asked her subjects to form. In some cases the relaxed subjects assimilated even this incongruous stimulus into their imagery, and still did not realize that a real visual stimulus was influencing their experience. For example, some subjects were asked to imagine a New York skyline whilst a faint image of a tomato was projected on the screen. Several of them failed to notice the tomato, but reported imagining New York at sunset (Segal, 1972). Nevertheless, Segal concludes from her extensive experimental studies that the Perky effect does not show that mental images and faint percepts are inherently indistinguishable. Rather, the confusion between image and percept seems to occur because the processes involved in forming a mental image of the requested type interfere with the normal utilization of the mechanisms of perception, and raise perceptual detection thresholds (Segal, 1971b; Segal & Fusella, 1971).

3.4 The Imageless Thought Controversy

Perhaps Wundt's most important German student was Oswald Külpe, who had for several years served as Wundt's assistant professor, but eventually left to set up his own laboratory in the philosophy department of Würzburg University. He and his students there developed a direct challenge to the prevalent imagery theory of thought. Under the influence of both Machian positivism and, later, the act psychology of Brentano and the phenomenology of Husserl, Külpe, like Titchener (whom he had helped train), rejected what he saw as Wundt's unnecessarily strict methodological restrictions on the scope of empirical science, and encouraged his students to extend the scope of the introspective method to the study of the "higher" processes of thought and reasoning (Danziger, 1979, 1980; Ash, 1998). In 1901, two of these students, Mayer and Orth, performed a word association experiment in which subjects were asked to report everything that had passed through their mind between hearing the stimulus word and giving the response. Note that it was normal practice, in this era of psychology, for experimental subjects, or observers as they were more often called, to be drawn from among fellow researchers within the same laboratory, often including the supervising professor. Present day psychologists would, with good reason, suspect such subjects of being liable to produce results strongly biased by theoretical preconceptions (Orne, 1962; Intons-Peterson, 1983). Great pains are usually taken, today, to ensure that subjects in psychological experiments have no idea what hypothesis the experiment is supposed to be testing. In 1901 however, it was thought that experienced and knowledgeable observers were more likely to produce consistent and meaningful results than the psychologically untrained. In the case of the Meyer and Orth experiment, two amongst the four subjects were Meyer and Orth themselves. Nevertheless, they professed to be surprised by some of their findings. In particular:

The subjects frequently reported that they experienced certain events of consciousness which they could quite clearly designate neither as definite images nor yet as volitions. For example, the subject Meyer made the observation that, in reference to the stimulus word "metre" a peculiar event of consciousness intervened which could not be characterized more exactly, and which was succeeded by the spoken response "trochee". (Meyer & Orth, as quoted and translated by Humphrey, 1951)

The jargon term bewusstseinslagen ("states of consciousness" — Humphrey, 1951) was coined to designate these indescribable non-sensorial states, and they soon began to turn up in more and more profusion in the introspective reports generated in the Würzburg laboratory, taking on an increasing theoretical significance as time went by. In 1905 another Würzburg researcher, Ach, also introduced the largely overlapping, but more explicitly intentionalistic concept of bewusstheit or "awareness", an unanalysable "impalpably given ‘knowing’" (Ach, quoted and translated by Humphrey, 1951), and by 1907, Karl Bühler, perhaps the most radical of Külpe's students, was simply referring to gedanken ("thoughts"). Bühler's experiments might, for example, involve giving a subject (often professor Külpe himself) a somewhat gnomic sentence to interpret (e.g., "Thinking is so extraordinarily difficult that many prefer to judge") and then collecting introspective reports of the conscious, but allegedly non-imaginal, gedanken that had occurred between the hearing of the sentence and the giving of the interpretation. Although the Würzburg school never denied that imagery does occur, by this time the greater part of the conscious contents of minds examined in Würzburg seemed to be non-imaginal.

Unsurprisingly, Wundt, and others, refused to accept these new methods and conclusions, and a heated debate, the so called imageless thought controversy, ensued. Though Wundt was surely skeptical of the existence of imageless thoughts, his primary criticisms were methodological. He was very much concerned with the fact that the experiments were necessarily constructed so that the introspective reports were given after the completion of the experimental task (word association, sentence interpretation, or whatever). The Würzburg research thus involved discursive recollection (or was it reconstruction?) of conscious contents that were no longer present to the mind. Such experiments, Wundt argued, were open invitations to suggestion, and, indeed, were

not experiments at all in the sense of scientific methodology: they are counterfeit experiments that seem methodical simply because they are ordinarily performed in a psychological laboratory and involve the coöperation of two persons, who purport to be experimenter and observer. In reality, they are as unmethodical as possible; they possess none of the special features by which we distinguish the introspections of experimental psychology from the casual introspections of everyday life. (Wundt, quoted and translated by Titchener, 1909. Original German, 1907.)

Titchener also strongly objected to the alleged demonstrations of imageless thought, but for different reasons. He did not object to the aims or the introspective methodology of the Würzburg school, but to their purported results, and, for him, the experiments were not so much misconceived as incompetently executed: In particular, he felt, the observers (experimental subjects) in Würzburg had been inadequately trained in the art of introspection. According to Titchener, the main pitfall of introspection was what he called the "stimulus error," the strong tendency to confound the conscious experience itself with whatever it might represent. Thus, to report, when looking at a rectangular table top, that one experiences a rectangle, would be to commit the stimulus error: The "real" conscious content would (on Titchener's view) have the trapezoidal shape that the table top projects upon the retina. For Titchener, the intentionality generally ascribed to imageless thoughts was clear evidence that the Würzburg introspectors were committing the stimulus error systematically: They were not reporting the intrinsic nature of their conscious contents, but what those contents signified. Titchener suggested that the purported bewusstseinslagen etc. were, in fact, faint and fleeting kinaesthetic sensations, feelings of muscular tension and the like (Tweney, 1987). In Titchener's own laboratory, experiments quite similar to those done in Würzburg, but carried out using introspective observers well trained in avoiding the stimulus error (Titchener himself, or his own graduate students), produced no reports of imageless thoughts. Instead, they found the fleeting imagery or the subtle bodily sensations that Professor Titchener's theory predicted (Titchener, 1909; Humphrey, 1951).

This work of Titchener's (like other responses to the imageless thought controversy from America, Britain, and elsewhere) had relatively little impact in Germany, which, with some justification at that time, still regarded itself as very much preeminent in psychological science. Nevertheless, on both sides of the Atlantic the controversy was recognized as touching on deep foundational issues in the science of mind. Although largely forgotten today, it seems to have had a lasting impact on the development not only of psychology, but philosophy as well. The Würzburg school's claims, despite their shaky basis, undoubtedly contributed to a sense that imagery could not be so psychologically important as had traditionally been assumed, and that an alternative way of thinking about cognitive content was needed. Many psychologists and philosophers of this era came, partly for this reason, to feel that thought should be understood in terms of language per se, and that it was a serious mistake ever to have believed that the representational power of language derives from some more fundamental form of representation, such as mental imagery.[6]

But the imageless thought controversy was never satisfactorily resolved, at least in the terms in which it was originally posed. Although the Würzburg school has been praised for drawing psychological attention to the intentionality of mental contents, and for the introduction of once important concepts such as "mental set" into psychology, it would certainly be grossly misleading to suggest that their work provides evidence for the existence of non-sensorial conscious mental contents (i.e. imageless thoughts) that comes anywhere close to meeting contemporary scientific standards. Indeed, the fact that Külpe's and Titchener's laboratories each produced results that fitted their directors' contrasting preconceptions did not go unnoticed by their contemporaries. The unresolvable debate contributed significantly to a growing sense of intellectual crisis within psychology, leading to a deep loss of confidence (persisting to the present) in the scientific value of introspection. It also led to a precipitous decline in scientific interest in imagery. On the one hand its importance in the cognitive economy was now subject to doubt; on the other hand it had come to seem that it was very difficult, if not impossible, to study it experimentally and objectively.

3.5 European Responses: Jaensch, Freud, and Gestalt Psychology

In Germany, some psychologists responded to this crisis by turning away from the experimental study of "cognitive" questions about the workings of the mind in general, and moved instead toward an understanding of their subject as concerned with interpretive studies of persons, or the differences between them. They, generally, became more interested in their subjects' dispositions, values, motives, etc. than in either their imagery (unless, perhaps, its contents were interestingly idiosyncratic) or their bewusstseinslagen (if any such existed) (Danziger, 1980).

An exception is the work of Jaensch (1930) on eidetic imagery (i.e. visual imagery that is experienced as before the eyes rather than "in the head," and that is unusually vivid and stable — most evidence for the existence of eidetic imagery comes from studies of children, and it seems to be rare in adults (Haber, 1979)). Unfortunately, although Jaensch's work has not been without influence, and aspects of it may be of continuing scientific value, it is tainted by his enthusiasm for the Nazi racist ideology that was then taking hold in Germany. Eidetic imagery, he claims (on very meager evidence), is characteristic of the less developed minds of not only children, but also members of "southern," "sun adapted" (i.e. darker skinned) races. (Jaensch later won notoriety for performing an experiment designed to show that "northern" chickens are racially superior — as evidenced by more careful and intelligent pecking — to "southern" ones (Ash, 1998).)

However, the idea that thought processes that rely upon visual imagery (as opposed to verbal thought) are characteristic of minds that are somehow defective or inferior is not confined, in this era, to Nazi or otherwise racist thinkers such as Jaensch. Sigmund Freud (a Jew) seems implicitly to have regarded visual images reported by his patients as part and parcel of their neuroses, as something to be exorcized and replaced by verbally mediated, "rational" insights (Esrock, 1994 ch. 3). Furthermore, according to Jay (1993), in France (and, by implication, to a large extent in continental western Europe in general) 20th century intellectual life, across the political spectrum, was permeated by a "denigration of the visual": visually based thought and experience was actively disvalued in comparison to other modes of sense experience and verbally mediated thinking. Arguably, signs of a similar attitude are evident some decades earlier in England, in the responses Francis Galton received to his pioneering questionnaire about mental imagery vividness. Unlike the regular folk he questioned, many of the scientists and other intellectuals amongst Galton's respondents were distinctly unwilling to admit to ever experiencing (visual) mental imagery (Galton, 1880, 1883; see also Roe, 1951). It is hard to say how widespread such attitudes were, or how they originated (or why they now seem to have faded[7]), but they may well have contributed to the sharp decline in serious interest in imagery, apparent not only in psychology but also philosophy (see Heil, 1998 p. 213; Nyíri, 2001) and literary studies (Esrock, 1994), that is very apparent begining from the early decades of the 20th century, and which, among philosophers and literary critics at any rate, has only quite recently shown signs of reversal (e.g. Rollins, 1989; Ellis, 1995; Heil, 1998; Scarry, 1999; Nyíri, 2001; Arp, 2005).

Many other German psychologists, in the wake of the imageless thought controversy, continued to adhere to the Wundtian ambition of developing an experimental science of the mind, and returned to something like the sort of methodological caution in the use of introspective reports that Wundt himself had advocated, often insisting on the direct corroboration of introspective evidence by observable effects on behavior (Danziger, 1980). This usually meant that, as with Wundt himself, although their experimentally based psychology did not explicitly repudiate the essential role traditionally assigned to imagery in thought and memory, in practice it had rather little to say about it. (Plausible behavioral correlates of imagery processes were not established until the rise of the cognitive psychology movement.)

Perhaps the most influential movement arising from this strand of German psychological thought was Gestalt Psychology. It was also perhaps the last German bred movement to make a major impact in the United States, where it became a sort of "official opposition" to the indigenous and dominant Behaviorism. This was facilitated by the fact that, under the pressure of the rising tide of German Naziism, a significant number of Gestalt Psychology's adherents — including the acknowledged leaders, Max Wertheimer, Wolfgang Köhler, and Kurt Koffka — emigrated to America during the 1920s and 30s (Ash, 1998). Gestalt Theory attempted to explain "higher" thought processes in terms of a sort of hypothetical neuroscience (field theory) rather than in terms of the vicissitudes of introspected thought contents (Thomas, 1987; Ash, 1998). Although the Gestalt psychologists were much concerned with the experimental investigation of subjective experience (from whence they sought most of the evidential support for their views), in practice this research focused almost entirely on perceptual experience. The typical Gestaltist experiment sought immediate, unreflective descriptions of the appearance of a carefully constructed stimulus (frequently complex and illusional), and preferentially used subjects naïve to the theoretical views and concerns of the experimenter. This was something very unlike the deliberate "looking within" practiced by psychologically sophisticated, trained introspectors in the laboratories of Titchener, Külpe, and their students and peers. In certain respects Gestalt psychology foreshadowed, and, indeed, importantly influenced, the cognitivist movement of recent decades (Gardner, 1987). Nevertheless, it had little directly to say about the nature or function of imagery.

3.6 The American Response: Behaviorist Iconophobia (and Motor Theories of Imagery)

Where the Gestalt psychologists, for the most part, ignored the concept of imagery, the Behaviorist movement, which came to dominate American (and, eventually, international) scientific psychology for almost half a century, actively repudiated it. To borrow a coinage from Dennett (1978), Behaviorist psychology was thoroughly iconophobic. Although the rapid rise of Behaviorism in the United States in the early years of the 20th century certainly had multiple causes, social and institutional as well as intellectual (O'Donnell, 1985), the imageless thought controversy, and the questions it raised about introspection as a viable scientific methodology, was certainly prominent amongst the intellectual causes. In the famous "manifesto" by which John B. Watson publicly launched Behaviorism as a self-conscious movement, the controversy over imageless thoughts is cited as the prime example (indeed, the only really explicit example) of the malaise of psychological methodology, for which Behaviorism would be the cure (Watson, 1913a). In a lengthy footnote to this paper, and in a follow-up article, Watson (1913b) cast doubt on the very existence of mental imagery, a position he was to state more forcefully in later work, where he stigmatized the concept (together with all other remotely mentalistic concepts) as a thoroughly unscientific, "medieval" notion, inextricably bound up with religious belief in an immortal soul, and, as such, barely one step away from "old wives tales" and the superstitions of "savagery" (Watson, 1930). He described personal reports of such things as memory images of one's childhood home as "sheer bunk," nothing more than the sentimental "dramatizing" of verbally mediated memories (i.e. conditioned tendencies to say certain things, either out loud or sub-vocally) (Watson, 1928).

Not all American psychologists, even avowed Behaviorists, were quite as vehement as Watson in their denunciation of mentality in general, or imagery in particular, but his views certainly resonated with many. The publication of Watson's manifesto (1913a) had, in fact, been preceded by several less radical critiques of introspective methodology from other American psychologists (Danziger, 1980). Particularly relevant here is Knight Dunlap's "The Case Against Introspection" (1912), because Dunlap, who was a junior colleague of Watson in the Johns Hopkins University Psychology Department, seems to have played a crucial if inadvertent role in the formation of Watson's attitude towards imagery, and, thereby, in the crystallization of Behaviorism itself (Cohen, 1979; Thomas, 1989).

During his early days at Johns Hopkins (where he arrived in 1908) Watson, by his own account, believed that "centrally aroused visual sensations [i.e., mental images] were as clear as those peripherally aroused" (Watson, 1913a), and when Dunlap told Watson of his skepticism concerning what he (Dunlap) called "the old doctrine of images" Watson initially demurred, insisting that he himself made important use of visual imagery, for example in the process of designing experimental apparatus (Dunlap, 1932; cf. Watson, 1936).

However, by this time Watson already seems to have been ambitious to approach human psychology using the methodology that he had already successfully developed for the study of animal behavior (Watson, 1924, 1936). By 1910, the only real factor preventing Watson from conceiving of the study of behavior as embracing the whole of psychology seems to have been "the problem of the higher thought processes" (Burnham, 1968): Thought was supposed to be carried on primarily in imagery, and imagery was not behavior (see Watson, 1913b). Dunlap's objections to the "old doctrine" that held visual imagery to consist in "centrally aroused visual sensations" seems to have played a crucial role in emboldening Watson to deny the existence of imagery altogether, thus enabling him to present the study of behavior as a fully sufficient methodology for psychology (Watson, 1924). Perhaps he believed that his theoretical commitment to the nonexistence of mental pictures entailed a commitment to the nonexistence of quasi-visual experiences (Thomas, 1989).

However, Dunlap never became a Behaviorist himself (Dunlap, 1932), and when his actual views about imagery are examined (Dunlap, 1914) it becomes apparent that he did not intend to deny that people have experiences that are, in a significant sense, quasi-perceptual. Although he described himself as an "iconoclast" (1932), and held that "the image, as a copy or reproduction of sensation . . . does not exist," (Dunlap,1914), Dunlap also asserted that Watson went much too far in rejecting "imagination" as well as "images" (Dunlap, 1932), and he continued to hold that we are in need of an account of the nature of "ideas". Something, something mental and, indeed, quasi-perceptual, is needed to fill the functional role that images played in the traditional psychology of thinking. It is clear that he (unlike Watson) did not deny the existence of imagery in the sense in which it was defined at the beginning of this article (i.e. quasi-perceptual experience). Dunlap's theory would seem to be best understood as a pioneering (though perhaps, ultimately, unconvincing) attempt to explain both the experience of imagery, and the functional role that it plays in thinking, in a way that avoids postulating the presence of pictures in the head, or inner copies of former sense impressions.

According to Dunlap, ideas are actually complexes of muscular sensations, caused by outwardly imperceptible movements, or, at least, tensings, of the muscles, particularly (though not exclusively) the muscles associated with the sense organs themselves, such as those that move the eyes. Particular patterns of muscular response, Dunlap holds, occur during the perception of particular types of objects or events, and may be aroused not only in the course of the actual perception of a relevant object, but also through associative links with the sensations produced by other muscular response patterns appropriate to other sorts of objects or events. These latter patterns may have arisen in actual perception, or may themselves have been aroused associatively in a similar way. Thus, associative trains of thought can be sustained. When the muscular response is aroused associatively, rather than by the actual perceptual presence of the relevant object, we experience the idea, or image, of the object. Visual imagery consists not of copies or echoes of visual sensations, but rather of actual current sensations in the muscles involved in the process of seeing something.

There is indeed a present content essentially connected with imagination or thought; but this present content is in each case a muscle sensation, or a complex of muscle sensations. We are therefore, in investigating images, dealing not with copies, or pale ghosts, of former sensations but with actual present sensations. (Dunlap, 1914)

These muscle sensations are, explicitly, not to be confused with the impalpable imageless thoughts of Würzburg, rather, "This sensation is the true image" (Dunlap, 1914, emphasis in original). (For a more extensive account of Dunlap's theory of imagery, and its influence on Watson, see Thomas (1989).)

Dunlap's theory of imagery/ideas was publicly presented only in one brief and rather obscurely published article (Dunlap, 1914) and (apart from its unintended and covert influence on Watson), it seems to have attracted very little interest from his contemporaries. The theory probably owes much to the influence of Hugo Münsterberg, whose "motor theory" of the mind had a considerable vogue amongst American psychologists at the time, but which was soon to be eclipsed by the rise of Behaviorism (Scheerer, 1984). Münsterberg was a German, a former student of Wundt, who had been hired to teach psychology at Harvard when William James moved on, and Dunlap had studied under him before coming to Johns Hopkins (Dunlap, 1932). Another non-pictorialist theory of imagery (relating the phenomenon to attentional processes) had been sketched a little earlier by the pioneering French psychologist Theodule Ribot (1890, 1900), and related ideas also surface later in the Soviet tradition of psychology (Wekker, 1966). However, the most fully developed version of the motor theory of imagery was surely that of Margaret Floy Washburn, a former student of Titchener. Washburn (unlike Dunlap) is quite open in acknowledging her intellectual debt to Münsterberg (Washburn, 1932), and in her book Movement and Mental Imagery (Washburn, 1916) she goes into considerable, if speculative, physiological as well as psychological detail. However, by the time this was published Behaviorist iconophobia was already taking firm hold, and Washburn's version of the motor theory of imagery seems to have failed to attract any more adherents than Dunlap's had.

It should be said that most of the avowedly Behaviorist theorists and researchers who succeeded Watson (who had given up his academic career by 1920, and published his last significant psychological work in 1930) did not reject talk of inner psychological processes quite as vehemently as he had done. Thus, for instance, the covert "fractional anticipatory goal responses" of Hull (1931, 1937), the "cognitive maps" of Tolman (1948), and the "representational mediation processes" of Osgood (1952, 1953) all seem to have played at least some of the explanatory roles that earlier, mentalistic psychologists assigned to images. Most psychologists of the Behaviorist era simply avoided talking about imagery, but there is one important exception. Although he avoided using imagery as an explanatory construct, B.F. Skinner (probably the most famous and influential theorist of the later decades of Behaviorism, and arguably a more radical and consistent Behaviorist even than Watson), nevertheless accepted that imagery experiences were not something that could simply be denied or dismissed (as Watson had attempted to do): Some sort of Behavioristic explanation of them was required. In his Notebooks (1980, p. 160), Skinner briefly describes his own experiences of auditory, musical imagery, and in his influential Science and Human Behavior (Skinner, 1953), he discusses, in a speculative way, the causes of what he calls "conditioned seeing" and "operant seeing" (1953 ch. 17), which are clearly intended as non-mentalistic ways of referring to the experiencing of imagery, that will not violate Behaviorist principles. In his About Behaviorism (1974), Skinner reiterates essentially restates his earlier position, but allows himself to speak more freely of "visualizing," "imaging," and "seeing in the absence of the thing seen."

But, although he describes it as "perhaps the most difficult problem in the analysis of behavior" (1953 p. 265), the significance of Skinner's attempts to grapple with the experience of imagery should not be overstated. Unlike many other aspects of his theoretical work, his remarks on imagery never seem to have become the basis of a sustained experimental research program on the topic (by Skinner himself, or by any of his numerous followers). Indeed, his discussions (1953, 1974) seem designed to explain the phenomenon away, to show that it does not threaten basic Behaviorist commitments, rather than to examine it as a topic of scientific interest in its own right. The focus is, on the one hand, to insist that the occurrence of quasi-perceptual experience in no way constitutes evidence for the existence of mental representations (or anything else mental), and, on the other hand, to consider the sorts of circumstances, the "contingencies of reinforcement," which might cause such experiences to arise for a particular individual at a particular time[8]. Skinner holds that instead of thinking of imagery as a "thing" we should instead think of visualization (and, indeed, seeing) as a form of behavior (albeit a largely or completely covert behavior, hidden from casual observation somewhere under the skin of the organism). However, this positive view is sketched extremely lightly, and, apart from a very passing allusion to eye movements, he tells us little or nothing about the specific forms that such visualization behavior might take, and sets out no systematic evidence to support his suggestions.

According to Paivio (1971), the 1920s and 1930s (when Watson's influence was at its height) were "the most arid period" for imagery research, but Kessel (1972) reports that even through the 1940s and 1950s a scant five references to imagery are to be found in Psychological Abstracts. Admittedly some interest in the psychology of imagery continued outside the United States through these decades. In Britain, for example, psychologists such as Pear (1925, 1927), Bartlett (1927, 1932), and, latterly, McKellar (1957) kept a degree interest in the topic alive, and when Place (1956) made his influential philosophical case for the identification of conscious experience with brain processes, mental imagery was one of his main examples of mental phenomena that would not yeild to a purely behavioral analysis. However, these discussions of imagery did not have much contemporaneous impact on psychologists in the United States (which by the 1930s had already achieved its dominant superpower status in psychology). A general revival of interest in the topic did not get under way in America before the 1960s. By that time the iconophobic consensus was beginning to break down due both to internal strains and external attacks. On the one hand, we find Mowrer (1960a, 1960b, 1977), Sheffield (1961), and others attempting to patch-up Behaviorist learning theory by reintroducing the concept of the mental image in an explanatory, representational role. On the other hand, we see new and striking empirical findings about imagery emerging to play a significant role in the so called Cognitive Revolution, that was soon to break the Behaviorist hegemony over scientific psychology (Gardner, 1987). Before long there was very little audience for Taylor's (1973) attempt to provide a Behavioristic theory of the nature of imagery. (In fact, Taylor identifies mental images with memory engrams in the brain, a move which Skinner, for one, would surely have rejected as thoroughly unbehavioristic.)

3.7 Imagery in Twentieth Century Philosophy

By the early 20th century, particularly in the United States, where it most flourished, psychology had progressively established a disciplinary identity distinct from the parent discipline of philosophy. However, interest in and attitudes towards imagery amongst philosophers followed a very similar trajectory to that seen in psychology. Early in the century, philosophers as otherwise diverse as Russell (1919, 1921) and Bergson (1907) still gave imagery a key role in their theories of meaning and cognition (although it may be significant that Bergson seems to regard what he called the "cinematic" imagery-based thought of "ordinary" and "intellectual" cognition as distinctly inferior to the non-imaginal philosophical intuition that also played a large role in his epistemology). However, before long, and especially in the wake of the imageless thought controversy, doubts were beginning to emerge, in the work of philosophers such as Schlick (1918), Sartre (1936, 1940), Ryle (1949), and especially the later Wittgenstein, both about imagery's importance in cognition, and about whether the whole notion of "pictures in the mind" really made sense.

Indeed, even in the late 19th century Frege (1884 §§59-60) had already argued against the traditional view that the meaningfulness of language derives from the mental images that we associate with words. Images, he pointed out, are subjective and idiosyncratic, whereas word meanings are objective and universal. However, the almost unanimous scorn with which the imagery theory of meaning was regarded by late 20th century analytic philosophers seems mainly to be due to the influence and arguments of the later Wittgenstein (Candlish, 2001; Nyíri, 2001). Today, it is largely thanks to Wittgenstein's efforts that,

an imagistic account of thinking such as is outlined in Russell's Analysis of Mind (Lecture X) [Russell, 1921] or elaborated in H.H. Price's Thinking and Experience [Price, 1953] is usually no more felt to deserve critical attention than is, say, a geocentric account of the universe. (Candlish, 2001 §2).

In fact, Wittgenstein implicitly rejected the imagery theory of meaning even in his early work — the so called "picture theory of meaning" of the Tractatus (Wittgenstein, 1922) is not a version of the imagery theory — but an explicit critique appears only in his posthumously published later writings (although the arguments were already influential during his lifetime, long before they saw print). Perhaps the most sustained critique of the imagery theory of meaning occurs in the opening pages of The Blue and Brown Books (Wittgenstein,1958), although the pithier remarks in the Philosophical Investigations (1953 — especially §139f) may have been more influential. Many other remarks and arguments scattered through Wittgenstein's other posthumously published writings, particularly in Zettel (1967), the Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology (1980a, 1980b), and the Last Writings on the Philosophy of Psychology (1990), demonstrate that he was fascinated by imagery, but deeply skeptical not only about the large cognitive role traditionally assigned to it, but also about the traditional understanding of the image as a sort of inner picture (see, e.g. 1953 I §301, II pp. 196e & 213e).

No-one could seriously doubt that Wittgenstein himself recognized the experiential reality and philosophical importance of imagery: he expends so much effort wrestling with the concept. Nevertheless, as Nyíri (2001) remarks, "Wittgenstein's untiring endeavor [is] to relegate mental images to a merely secondary place." He determinedly rejected the traditional empiricist view that thinking is primarily a play of images, that language is semantically grounded in imagery, and that the principal role of language is to communicate the results of our inner, imaginal thought processes to others. Instead, Wittgenstein regarded language itself as the preeminent vehicle of thought, and he held that the meanings of linguistic expressions arise from the various uses to which they are put. He thus saw no need (and no room) for language to be semantically grounded in any other form of representation. In support of this position, he strove to show that imagery (the only real candidate for the job) could not possibly be the semantic ground of language, and he is very widely believed to have succeeded.

The two themes of the cognitive unimportance of imagery and its non-pictorial nature were taken up, and argued more fully, by numerous post-Wittgensteinian philosophers in the latter half of the twentieth century. Although there may be some tension between the themes (most arguments against the imagery theory of thought and meaning seem to turn upon mental images being, in some sense, picture-like) in practice they have rarely, if ever, come into conflict; rather, both have played their part in setting the iconophobic tone of the era.

Even in the wake of the revival of scientific interest in the cognitive roles of imagery in the 1960s and 70s, the handful of post-Wittgensteinian philosophers who have attempted to defend imagery-based theories of thought and meaning (Price, 1953; Lowe, 1995, 1996; Ellis, 1995; Nyíri, 2001) still find themselves swimming very much against the tide. Philosophers such as Harrison (1962-3), Goodman (1968), and Fodor (1975) have reinforced, restated and extended Wittgenstein's arguments for the irrelevance of imagery to semantics, and have made a powerful and influential case. Goodman argues that what a picture represents is just as much a matter of interpretation and convention as is what a word or sentence represents, the implication being that pictorial representation is no more "natural" or fundamental, no more a "ground" for meaning, than linguistic representation itself. (In fact, Goodman himself is primarily concerned with physical pictures, such as paintings or photographs, but his argument seems to apply to mental pictures quite as well.) Fodor (1975), borrowing liberally from the Wittgenstein of the Philosophical Investigations (1953 §139 f.), makes a compelling case that mental pictures cannot be bearers of intentionality in their own right, that what they mean, what they are images of, will necessarilly remain indeterminate unless it is pinned down by an associated linguistic description. Fodor himself holds that what our mental images represent will be determined by an associated description couched in mentalese, an innate, unconscious, computational "language of thought" (Fodor, 1975); others, such as Kaufmann (1980), apparently think that the necessary descriptions may be couched in the natural language that the imager speaks. On either view, though, the traditional semantic dependency is inverted. Instead of the meaningfulness of language being grounded in imagery, the meaningfulness of imagery is supposed to be grounded in some sort of language.

Arguments against the pictorial nature of imagery, which are scarcely more than hinted at in Wittgenstein's published works, were developed much more explicitly by Ryle (1949). As part of a broader (and very influential) attack on what he called "Descartes' myth" (i.e., Cartesian dualism), Ryle argued that the notion of private, non-physical, mental pictures is an absurdity, and proposed instead that "imagining", "seeing in the mind's eye", and so forth, is better understood as akin to pretending (to ourselves) to experience ordinary, external things. Other philosophers influenced by both Wittgenstein and Ryle soon carried forward this critique of the inner picture: Shorter (1952) and Dennett (1969) (in some respects anticipating the work of Pylyshyn (1973)) suggested that imagery might be more akin to describing or depicting something to oneself, rather than to pretending to see it; and, from a detailed exegesis of Ryle's arguments, Ishiguro (1966, 1967) developed a theory of mental images as intentional objects (in the sense of Anscombe (1965)) having a merely "grammatical" existence: Although the grammar of our language may sometimes make it very awkward to refer to our imagery experiences without seeming to imply that they are caused by certain entities (mental images), it does not follow that such entities actually exist.

Although expressed in very different terms, Ishiguro's position on imagery is not altogether unlike the view developed earlier in the century by Sartre (1940). (See Ryle (1971) for an interesting comparison of his own views about the mental, including mental imagery, to views in the phenomenological tradition, to which Sartre belonged.) Under the influence of Husserl rather than Wittgenstein, Sartre also stressed the intentionality of imagery and denied that mental images (conceived as entities) exist:

The fact of the matter is that the expression ‘mental image’ is confusing. … But since the word image is of long standing we cannot reject it completely. However, in order to avoid all ambiguity, we must repeat at this point that an image is nothing else than a relationship. The imaginative consciousness I have of Peter is not a consciousness of an image of Peter: Peter is directly reached, my attention is not directed on an image but on an object (Sartre, 1940 p. 8).

It is important to be clear that just because Sartre (and Ryle, Shorter, Ishiguro, and others) hold that mental images are not inner pictures, nor even, indeed, any sort of entity, they are not thereby denying that people have quasi-perceptual experiences, or even that these may sometimes be very vivid. Unfortunately, perhaps because the notion that such experiences are caused by inner pictures is so entrenched in our folk psychology, this point does not always seem to have been clear to critics of such views, and it has even been occasionally suggested that they could not possibly be held by anyone personally familiar with the experience of imagery.[9] However, a careful reading of these apparently iconophobic authors soon reveals that they in no way intend to deny the experiential reality of imagery, and most of them make their personal familiarity with it quite clear.[10] They deny only that such experience, however vivid it might be, is caused by (or embodied as) inner pictures.

By contrast, in his Mental Images — A Defence, Hannay (1971) vigorously championed the reality of inner pictures (see also Hannay, 1973, and for a counterargument see Candlish, 1975). But, despite the fact that he had no thought of reinstating imagery to its traditional importance in cognitive and semantic theory, Hannay clearly saw himself (in 1971) as a lonely dissenter, a voice crying in the wilderness against philosophy's virtually monolithic iconophobic consensus. In the subsequent decades that consensus has been fractured, but by no means shattered, by developments in cognitive psychology and cognitive science (discussed below). In particular, in the wake of Kosslyn's (1980, 1994) seminal work on the cognitive psychology of imagery, a growing number of philosophers are ready to defend the reality of mental pictures, and show no sign whatsoever of feeling embattled (von Eckardt, 1988, 1993; Tye, 1988, 1991; Mortensen, 1989; Brann, 1991; Cohen, 1996). Other philosophers, even if not entirely convinced, have certainly taken recent scientific findings about imagery (and the debates they have provoked) very seriously (e.g. Sober, 1976; Block, 1981a, 1981b, 1983a, 1983b; Bower, 1984; Sterelny, 1986; Rollins, 1989; Slezak, 1995; Thomas, 1999).

Nonetheless, the post-Wittgensteinian consensus that imagery cannot be as important as it once seemed to be, that it cannot be the ground of linguistic meaning or the prime vehicle of thought, remains solid (we will consider the actual arguments that support or challenge this consensus in later sections). Furthermore, Bennett & Hacker (2003) have recently made a powerful restatement of the Wittgensteinian case against mental entities in general and mental pictures in particular. Despite all that has happened in cognitive science, imagery has by no means regained its former philosophical prestige.

4. Imagery in Cognitive Science

A revival of interest in imagery was an important component of the so called cognitive revolution in psychology during the 1960s and early 1970s, a period when the Behaviorist intellectual hegemony over the field was broken and the concept of mental representation was established as central and vital to psychological theorizing (Baars, 1986; Gardner, 1987; but see also Leahey, 1992). The first (and formative) textbook of the emerging cognitive approach to psychology (Neisser, 1967) devoted substantial space to mental imagery, and the end of the 1960s brought the publication of a spate of books reviewing and reporting new findings on the psychology of imagery: Richardson (1969), Horowitz (1970), Paivio (1971), Piaget & Inhelder (1971), Segal (1971a), Sheehan (1972).

Although the emergence of computational models of mental processes probably played the leading role in the rise of cognitive psychology and cognitive science, the new interest in imagery was independently motivated, and contributed significantly to the growing feeling, amongst psychologists, that both the ontology and methodology of Behaviorism were excessively restrictive, and that inner mental processes and representations could, after all, be useful, or even indispensible, scientific concepts. Quite apart from the broader talk of revolution in psychology in this era (e.g., Hebb, 1960), there seems to have been a real sense, at the time, that the revival of interest in imagery was, in itself, an insurgent movement liberating psychologists from entrenched but outworn Behaviorist dogmas. The imagery revival was depicted in dramatic terms as "the return of the ostracized" (Holt, 1964; cf. Haber, 1970), as "a dimension of mind rediscovered" (Kessell, 1972), and as marking "a paradigm shift in psychology" (Neisser, 1972b).

4.1 The Imagery Revival

Holt (1964) indicates a number of developments that led some psychologists, in the 1950s, to begin to pay significant attention to imagery again. These include research on hallucinogenic drugs, developments in electroencephalography, the discovery of REM sleep and its correlation with dreaming, and Penfield's (1958) finding that direct electrical stimulation of certain brain areas can give rise to vivid memory (or pseudo-memory) imagery. More significant, however, (according to Holt) was a line of psychological research that was originally inspired by practical, rather than theoretical, concerns: by the perceptual problems experienced by people such as radar operators, long-distance truck drivers, and jet pilots, whose work requires them to remain perceptually alert whilst watching monotonous, impoverished, and barely changing visual stimuli over extended periods of time. In the laboratory, subjects experiencing such sensory deprivation often spontaneously reported vivid, intrusive, and sometimes bizarre mental imagery, "like having a dream while awake" (Bexton, Heron, & Scot, 1954). Despite the introspective nature of the evidence, the practical implications of these findings (for such things as road and air safety) made them hard to dismiss.

Beginning in the 1960s, and perhaps stimulated by some of the research mentioned by Holt, there was also a growing interest in the application of imagery based techniques in psychotherapy and psychosomatic medicine (see, e.g., Horowitz, 1970, 1983). By the 1970s, something of a self conscious imagery movement had taken hold, in which discoveries and theoretical developments coming out of experimental psychology and cognitive science helped to fuel and legitimate an enthusiasm for the application of imagery to psychotherapy, and even to "personal growth," "consciousness expansion," and the like. Great claims continue to be made, by some, for the healing powers of guided imagery, whereby clients (or patients) are encouraged to visualize particular scenes or scenarios thought to have therapeutic value (e.g., Rossman, 2000). Guided imagery techniques are touted for purposes ranging from chronic pain relief (e.g., Fontaine, 2000) to global spiritual renewal (Ekstein, 2001)!

It is sometimes claimed or implied that these sorts of techniques are based upon ancient oriental, and particularly Indian, spiritual practices (e.g., Samuels & Samuels, 1975; Gawain, 1982), and it thus may not be coincidental that a prominent figure in the psychotherapeutic imagery movement is a Pakistani born psychologist, Akhter Ahsen, known not only for his clinical and theoretical writings (e.g., Ahsen, 1965, 1977, 1984, 1985, 1993, 1999), but also because he was instrumental, in the later 1970s, in the foundation of the International Imagery Association, and the peer reviewed Journal of Mental Imagery (which began publication in 1977). The Association's mission, stated on their web site, is "to further the understanding of mental imagery and advance its potential in the development of human consciousness" (see Other Internet Resources). The journal publishes articles on imagery from a wide range of psychological perspectives, including the cognitive. An American Association for the Study of Mental Imagery was also founded in 1978, with a mission to promote "the study of mental imagery as a part of human science and the application of scientific knowledge about mental imagery in the relief of human suffering and the enhancement of personal development" (see Other Internet Resources). Its journal, Imagination, Cognition and Personality, commenced publication in the early 1980s.

4.2 Mnemonic Effects of Imagery

Despite the developments outlined above, interest in imagery amongst experimental psychologists remained at a fairly low level until the mid to late 1960s. It was the recognition, in that period, of the powerful mnemonic effects of imagery that changed the situation, leading to a thriving tradition of experimental research, and securing imagery a firm place in cognitive theory. These mnemonic effects, it turned out, could be clearly demonstrated in readily repeatable experiments that did not rely in any way upon introspective reports.

According to Bugelski (1977, 1984), an important stimulus to the flowering of experimental research on imagery and memory[11] was the 1966 publication of Frances Yates' celebrated and widely read historical study, The Art of Memory. Yates details how imagery based mnemonic techniques, particularly versions of the so-called method of loci, were in widespread use amongst European intellectuals, educators, and orators from classical Greek through to early modern times, and she argues that the knowledge and use of these techniques may have had quite significant effects on the development of Western philosophical, theological, and early scientific thought.

Around the same time, Soviet psychologist Alexander Luria's (1960, 1968) extensive case study of the "mnemonist" Shereshevskii first became available in English, and well known amongst English-speaking psychologists. Shereshevskii's truly prodigious feats of memory were apparently made possible by an abnormally vivid visual imagination, often harnessed to his own version of the method of loci. Experiment soon confirmed that the imagery method of loci, as described by Yates and Luria, was extremely effective in enhancing memory performance in ordinary people (Ross & Lawrence, 1968).

In fact, Canadian psychologist Allan Paivio was already quietly working on the mnemonic effects of imagery in the early 1960s, before either Yates or Luria had published their books (Paivio, 1963, 1965). (His interest in the subject was apparently sparked by a demonstration of imagery mnemonics he witnessed at a public speaking course (Marks, 1997).) However, the considerable attention that Paivio's theoretical speculations and painstaking quantitative experiments were attracting by the end of the decade surely owed much to the interest aroused by the more eye-catching historical and anecdotal studies of Yates and Luria. By the later 1960s, and in the 1970s, many other psychologists would take up research in this area, but Paivio was well established as the field's leading figure.

The findings of this extensive experimental research program on the mnemonic effects of imagery, can be crudely summarized as the discovery of two principal effects. First of all, it was demonstrated quite incontrovertibly that subjects who follow explicit instructions to use simple imagery based mnemonic techniques to memorize verbal material (typically lists of apparently random words, or word pairs) remember it very much better than subjects who do not use such techniques (Bower, 1970, 1972; Bugelski, 1970; Paivio, 1971). Secondly, and somewhat more controversially, Paivio and others claim to have shown that imagery plays a large role in verbal memory even when the experimental subjects are not given explicit instructions to form imagery, and make no deliberate effort to do so. To demonstrate this, Paivio and his associates initially determined quantitative imagery values for each of a long list of nouns: that is to say, the relative ease with which subjects could generate a mental image appropriate to the word, or the likelihood that an image would spontaneously be evoked by the word in question (Paivio, Yuille, & Madigan, 1968).[12] (On the whole, concrete nouns such as ‘cat’ have high imagery values, and abstract nouns such as ‘truth’ have low ones, although there are exceptions to this rule.) Once these quantitative imagery values were established, Paivio was able to show, in various experimental designs, that words with high imagery values were consistently remembered significantly better than those with lower ones, quite regardless of any conscious intent on the subjects' part to form relevant images (Paivio, 1971, 1983, 1991).[13]

4.2.1 Dual Coding and Common Coding Theories of Memory

The Dual Coding Theory of memory was initially proposed Paivio (1971) in order to explain the powerful mnemonic effects of imagery that he and others had uncovered, but its implications for cognitive theory go far beyond these findings. It has inspired an enormous amount of controversy and experimental research in psychology, and played a very large role in stimulating the resurgence of scientific and philosophical interest in imagery. Indeed, it has been described as "one of the most influential theories of cognition this [20th] century" (Marks, 1997), and has been fruitfully applied to a wide range of psychological issues, including: thinking processes (Paivio, 1975a); individual differences in thinking styles (Paivio & Harshman, 1983); language understanding (Paivio & Begg, 1981); bilingualism (Paivio & Desrochers, 1980; Paivio, 1986); metaphor (Paivio, 1979); creative thinking (Paivio, 1983b); the observational/theoretical distinction in science (Clark & Paivio, 1989); the psychology of reading and writing (Sadoski & Paivio, 2001); and even the use of visualization to enhance athletic performance (Munroe et al., 2000).

The more intricate details of Dual Coding Theory are beyond our scope here, but the core idea is very simple and intuitive. Paivio proposes that the human mind operates with two distinct classes of mental representation (or "codes"), verbal representations and mental images, and that human memory thus comprises two functionally independent (although interacting) systems or stores, verbal memory and image memory. Imagery potentiates recall of verbal material because when a word evokes an associated image (either spontaneously, or through deliberate effort) two separate but linked memory traces are laid down, one in each of the memory stores. Obviously the chances that a memory will be retained and retrieved are much greater if it is stored in two distinct functional locations rather than in just one.

The laboratory evidence favoring the theory goes well beyond the original context of verbal learning experiments, however. For example, it is claimed that it finds experimental support in studies of memory for pictures (Richardson, 1980 ch.5) and in chronometric studies of mental comparisons of sizes, distances and other dimensions of variation (Paivio, 1975, 1978a, 1978b; Kosslyn, Murphy, Bemesderfer, & Feinstein, 1977; Moyer & Dumais, 1978). Perhaps the most direct experimental support comes from work on the so called selective interference effect, which occurs when a person tries simultaneously to do two mental tasks both of which call for manipulation of representations from the same code (i.e., two verbal tasks, or two imagery/visuo-spatial tasks). In such circumstances, experimental subjects perform measurably more poorly (i.e., slower and/or with more errors) than they do when attempting either task together with one that calls upon the other code (i.e., a verbal and a simultaneous imagery/visuo-spatial task) (Brooks, 1967, 1968; Atwood, 1971; Segal & Fusella, 1971; Baddeley et al., 1975; Janssen, 1976a, 1976b; Baddeley & Lieberman, 1980; Eddy & Glass, 1981; Hampson & Duffy, 1984; Logie & Baddeley, 1990; De Beni & Moè, 2003). Provided one interprets the imagery code primarily as a system for the representation of shape and spatial and spatio-temporal relationships (rather than as specialized for encoding purely visual properties such as color or brightness) these results find a very natural interpretation in Dual Coding terms: two tasks that use the same code interfere strongly with one another because they call upon the same representational and processing resources.[14]

Nevertheless, the proper interpretation of these experiments (and all the other multifarious relevant laboratory findings) and thus the empirical status of Dual Coding Theory itself, remains controversial. Throughout its history, the theory has been developed and interpreted in the context of opposition to various forms of what have come to be known as common coding theories of memory: Theories committed to explaining all the relevant phenomena in terms of just one type of code (representational format) common to all memories. Thus, to properly understand Dual Coding Theory and the controversies that have surrounded it, it is important to be aware that the prevailing conception of the nature of this common code have changed quite radically over the course of the dual coding versus common coding controversy.

It is also important to distinguish the dual/common coding debate from the better known (at least to philosophers), and ongoing, analog versus propositional debate about imagery, which arose a few years later, in the early 1970s (and will be covered in section 4.3). Although these two controversies did become very entangled, the main points at issue are quite different, and an explicit awareness of this may help us avoid some of the confusions that arose from the entanglement. The analog/propositional debate concerns the nature of imagery itself (to put it very crudely, the analog side thinks mental images are inner pictures, and the propositional side think they are inner descriptions), whereas the dual/common coding debate concerns the functional role played by imagery in the cognitive processes of memory and thought. It may be true that that, amongst cognitive scientists, Dual Coding Theory is most often associated with an analog conception of imagery, and common coding is associated with the propositional conception. However, there seems to be no reason to think that it is incoherent to combine a propositional view of imagery with a form of Dual Coding Theory, as Baylor (1972) and Kieras (1978) have proposed. Also, although perhaps no contemporary theorists combine an analog theory of imagery with a common coding theory of memory, this position was implicitly taken by many philosophers in the past. For instance, Empiricist philosophers such as Berkeley and Hume (and, very arguably, Aristotle) thought of images as being picture-like (analog), and held that all memories (indeed, all mental contents, all ideas) are images of some sort (common code).

When Paivio initially developed Dual Coding Theory in the 1960s, however, psychological thinking was still dominated by neo-Behaviorism, and the prevailing view was that human memory (where it goes beyond the operant or classical conditioning also seen in animals) depends entirely on words, on inner or subvocal speech in one's native tongue: the common code was taken to be a verbal code. This, however, was soon to change. In the very same era that Paivio's ideas were becoming influential, rapid developments in psycholinguistics, the influence of Artificial Intelligence research, and the rise of the computational information processing approach to cognition were profoundly affecting psychological conceptions of mental representation. Although mainstream memory researchers still mostly focused on memory for verbal material, many came to think of this as encoded in the mind in an abstract format analogous to the "deep structures" of Chomskian linguistic theory or the nested data structures of programming languages such as LISP (Collins & Quillian, 1969; Anderson & Bower, 1973). Thus, by the mid 1970s a very different form of common coding theory had become prevalent. Computationally oriented psychologists began to think of memories as being stored as what they called "propositional representations", or just "propositions".

It is important to be aware that this use of the word ‘proposition’ differs, subtly but significantly, from the well established philosophical use of the term, whereby propositions are distinguished sharply from representations (mental or otherwise), and are considered instead to be the underlying, entirely abstract meanings (truths or falsehoods) that representations (such as sentences) may express (Gale, 1967). Thus, following the very influential work of Fodor (1975), philosophers expounding computational theories of mind have usually preferred to talk about "sentential" rather than "propositional" representations, with the understanding that the relevant sentences are to be thought of as expressed not in English (or any other natural, spoken, language) but in mentalese, a computational "language of thought" that is (hypothetically) built into the brain, somewhat as a computer's machine code is built into its CPU. But although it seems to capture their intentions quite well, this philosophical terminology is not widely used by psychologists. In what follows, the philosophical mentalese terminology will generally be favored, but readers should be aware that most of the psychological authors discussed in fact speak of propositional representations.

It is very arguable that the modern, computational and "propositional," common coding view of memory is more theoretically parsimonious than Dual Coding Theory, and certainly it coheres more readily with the broadly computational conception to the mind that remains dominant in cognitive science. Paivio and his supporters make a strong case, however, that Dual Coding Theory has the advantage in its ability to account for the broad range of empirical evidence. The theory has stood up well over the decades both to vigorous conceptual criticism and to many attempted experimental refutations, and Paivio has continued to develop, elaborate, and defend it, periodically reviewing the relevant experimental literature (Paivio, 1971, 1977, 1983a, 1986, 1991, 1995; Paivio & Begg, 1981; Sadoski & Paivio, 2001 — for less partisan reviews see Morris & Hampson, 1983; Richardson, 1980, 1999; Thomas, 1987).

4.2.2 Conceptual Issues in Dual Coding Theory

Despite its impressive empirical successes, Dual Coding Theory has by no means gained universal acceptance, and alternative explanations of the relevant phenomena continue to be proposed and defended. Perhaps the most important reason for this is a perceived incompatibility between the theory (and the notion of mental representation it deploys) and the computational approach to the mind that many regard as fundamental to cognitive science. Paivio himself (1986) explicitly rejects the idea that the human mind can be understood on the model of a computer, and presents Dual Coding Theory as the basis of an alternative approach to cognition. Nevertheless, an argument for a Dual Coding as opposed to a common coding account of memory performance is not ipso facto an argument against the computational view of the mind and the existence and theoretical necessity of a mentalese type code. Some cognitive scientists, conscious of the (in some respects, complementary) merits of both Dual Coding Theory and computationalism, would clearly like to reconcile the two viewpoints. It is worth considering whether or how this can be done in a satisfactory way.

Before that, however, there are certain conceptual issues internal to Dual Coding Theory itself that should be examined. Indeed, the concern that these have never been very adequately addressed (by Paivio or, indeed, anyone else) may well be another important source of dissatisfaction with the theory (Lockhart, 1987). We will return in later sections to more general worries about the nature and possibility of imagery representation per se, but we should also ask just how we should understand the notion of a code (as Paivio uses it),[15] and about how such codes are to be differentiated, characterized, and counted.

Indeed, it seems obvious to some commentators (e.g., Kintsch, 1977; Flanagan, 1984) that Paivio, through focusing too much on visual imagery, has counted wrongly, and that if there is an imagery code at all, there must be one for each of the senses: a visual imagery code, an auditory one, an olfactory one, and so on. Indeed, Flanagan (1984) always talks of "six-code theory" rather than dual coding. But, despite his frequent references to imagery as "modality specific" representation, Paivio is committed to the view that there is a single, integrated imagery system, handling auditory, haptic, olfactory, etc. memories as well as visual ones (Paivio, 1986 pp. 56-58). We can accept that non-visual aspects of our imagery experience may well play a much larger role in our mental life than is commonly acknowledged (Newton, 1982) without endorsing the idea of "six-code" theory. Despite the ingrained bias toward focusing upon its visual aspect, it is quite plausible that imagery is best understood as fundamentally multi-modal. Indeed, the idea that mental images are, and must always remain, strictly segregated by sense mode is compelling only if we regard the senses as independent, segregated channels through which sense impressions of different types are funneled into the mind, and if we also think of mental imagery as arising within those sense channels, or as directly derived from their immediate outputs. This, of course, is the view of perception and imagery that has come down to us from Empiricist philosophy: the perspective from which mental images were taken to be either "decaying sense" (Hobbes, 1651), or copies of former sense impressions (Hume, 1740 p. 1; see Matthews, 1969).[16]

This Empiricist view of perception continues to be very influential, but it is by no means universally accepted, and many arguments, both empirical and theoretical, have been advanced against it (Morgan, 1977).[17] Some theorists, indeed, completely reject the idea of functionally independent senses, and argue that perception can only be correctly understood if the sense organs are viewed not as independent channels, but as components of a single, integrated, multi-modal perceptual system (Stoffregen & Bardy, 2001; Walk & Pick, 1981; L.E. Marks, 1978; von Hornbostel, 1927). On this view, perceptual experience is inherently multi-modal (although, of course, we often focus our interest on just one particular modal aspect of it), and there is every reason to think that quasi-perceptual experience, imagery, is the same (Thomas, 1987, 1999b n.6). From this perspective, there is no justification whatsoever for segregating imagery codes by sense mode.

However, even for those (no doubt the majority) who continue to conceive of the five (or so) senses as distinct and more or less passive input channels, it does not follow that imagery might not be multi-modal, that the sight and the scent of the rose that we imagine might not be best understood as aspects of a single, integrated imaginative experience rather than separate adventitiously associated visual and olfactory images. After all, it is quite conceivable that the representations we experience as imagery, and that get stored in long term memory, might arise not in the sensory channels themselves, but, instead, are synthesized at or beyond the point where the deliverances of the senses are brought together to form our polysensory experience of the world. This is consistent both with certain influential contemporary views about perception and imagery (e.g., Pylyshyn 1978, 1999, 2003b) and with some very traditional philosophical perspectives, such as those of Aristotle and Kant.[18] (It might, however, be harder to reconcile with other influential contemporary views of the nature of imagery, such as Kosslyn's quasi-pictorial theory of visual imagery (1980, 1994). Kosslyn seems inclined to embrace some form of Dual Coding Theory (Kosslyn, Holyoak, & Huffman, 1976; Kosslyn, 1994 p. 335), but perhaps he really ought to prefer the "six-code" version.)

Let us now consider the verbal code. Paivio himself has always made it quite clear that he is thinking of inner speech (and the like) in natural language (in English, or whatever one's native tongue happens to be). However, as mentalese (or "propositional representation") came to play a key role in cognitive theory in general, and, in particular, to displace covert speech as the central theoretical concept of the dominant common coding view of memory, it seemed natural to some cognitive theorists to construe the two codes of Dual Coding Theory as imagery and mentalese rather than imagery and English (Baylor, 1973; Kosslyn, Holyoak, & Huffman, 1976; Kieras, 1978). In similar vein, Anderson (1983) suggested a tri-code theory, with imagery, verbal, and "propositional" memory codes.

It is not clear to what extent the established empirical advantages of the imagery/English version of Dual Coding Theory (as an account of memory phenomena) would carry over to an imagery/mentalese version (let alone a tri-code theory). However, quite apart from any such concerns, and even if we think (as many do) that there are other good and independent reasons to believe in the existence of a mentalese code, there are still problems with the imagery/mentalese version of Dual Coding. On any viable construal of Dual Coding Theory , the two codes, whatever they might be, are on a par with one another, playing parallel and complementary explanatory roles. One would expect entities with such similar explanatory roles to also be on the same level within the theory's ontology. That seems to be the case for mental images and mental (natural language) words, but it does not seem to be true for images and mentalese representations. Both mental imagery and inner speech are familiar and common phenomena of conscious experience. They are psychological explananda as well as explanantia. By contrast, mentalese representations are explanantia only. Mentalese is not a phenomenon. It is not directly experienced (if it were it would surely have been known about long before 1975!).[19] Indeed, we have no reason whatsoever to think that mentalese exists unless we believe that it is essential for the adequate explanation of our cognitive powers. Many cognitive scientists do believe this, of course, but from their perspective there are very good reasons to believe (and it is generally believed) that not just cognition in general, but imagery in particular cannot be fully explained without appeal to mentalese. Some hold that mentalese is necessary to account for the intentionality of imagery (Fodor, 1975; Rollins, 1989; Tye, 1991; Kosslyn, 1994 p. 6); others hold that mentalese descriptions are actually constitutive of imagery (Simon, 1972; Baylor, 1973; Moran, 1973; Pylyshyn, 1978, 2002b, 2003b; Kieras, 1978; Hinton, 1979). On either of these views, the imagery/mentalese version of Dual Coding Theory (and Anderson's tri-code theory) mixes ontological and explanatory levels in a disconcertingly awkward and asymmetrical way: on the one hand the mentalese code functions in the theory as a more or less the equal partner of imagery, paralleling its role in the explanation of memory phenomena; on the other, mentalese is more fundamental, grounding the representational power of imagery, or perhaps even its very being.

It may be possible, however, to reconcile some form of Dual Coding Theory with computationalism (and its mentalese representations) in a more elegant and satisfactory manner. It has been suggested that both of Paivio's codes, both mental images and mental words, might, in a more or less symmetrical way, emerge from, be constructed on the basis of, or otherwise be equivalently dependent upon, underlying, unconscious mentalese representations (Morris & Hampson, 1983; Marschark et al., 1987; Marschark & Hunt, 1989). Paivio's actual position, after all, is that the elements of the verbal code are themselves a form or imagery: auditory and/or vocal-motor images of the spoken words of one's native language (or possibly occasionally even visual images of written words) (Paivio, 1971, 1986 p. 57). If this is the case, there seem to be least two elegant and principled ways in which one might conceive of the relation between Paivio's codes and mentalese. One might argue (following Pylyshyn) that just as visual images are ultimately reducible to mentalese representations, so too are the auditory (or whatever) images that constitute mental words. Alternatively, one might argue (following Fodor or Kosslyn) that although imagery may not be reducible to mentalese, nevertheless, all types of mental image, verbal or otherwise, can function as mental representations only inasmuch as they have semantic properties (meanings or intentionality), and they have these semantic properties only in virtue of associated mentalese representations.

But if verbal representations are themselves a form of imagery, as Paivio holds, another problem arises for Dual Coding Theory (quite regardless of whether one thinks its codes must somehow be underpinned by mentalese). All the relevant representations now seem to be imagery of some sort, and we have already argued that we should not differentiate imagery codes on the basis of sensory modality. In what sense, then, can we now justify talking of two distinct codes? Paivio himself holds that the necessary duality arises because there is a greater degree of functional integration within codes than between codes (Paivio, 1986). The idea, apparently, is that associative connections between different verbal images are stronger, or more numerous, or form a more richly interconnected network, than do associative connections between verbal images and non-verbal ones (and vice-versa). However, it is by no means clear that this difference of degree is an adequate basis for differentiating the codes, or even that it is real. After all, Paivio frequently insists (and the overall theory requires) that there are rich associative interconnections between the two codes, and is it by no means obvious (nor, to the best of my knowledge, is it empirically established) that, for instance, my mental image of the word ‘cat’ is more strongly or richly associated with mental images of other words (‘fur,’ ‘claws,’ ‘meow,’ ‘dog’) than it is with mental images of cats, cat fur, cat claws, etc.

There may, however be another way of suitably differentiating the codes. Regardless of whether their representational power is intrinsic, or is grounded in mentalese (or something else), non-verbal images represent (or are normally taken or used to represent) whatever they are images of — my image of the Eiffel Tower represents the Eiffel Tower for me, my auditory image of the sound of a trumpet represents the sound of a trumpet, and so on. By contrast, verbal images (except for the rare occasions when we are thinking about rather than merely in language) are not used to represent what they are images of (i.e., some spoken or written word or words), but, rather, what the imagined word or words means: my auditory image of the words ‘Eiffel Tower’ is not normally used to represent the words ‘Eiffel Tower’ (as they might be spoken on some occasion), but, rather, the Eiffel Tower itself. Mental images (as elements of the imagery code) represent what they are images of; mental words (when functioning as elements of the verbal code) represent what the words mean. The two codes thus employ quite different representational modes. This is not a mere difference of degree, and (although the matter needs further exploration) it seems possible that it might be an adequate basis for the duality that Paivio's theory requires.


Particularly seminal or influential contributions to the imagery literature, or works that provide particularly useful reviews or collections of aspects of this literature, are marked with a red bullet: . Items that are cited in this entry but that say little or nothing directly about mental imagery are marked with a blue bullet: . Some items are annotated. Lack of an annotation should not be taken as an implicit comment on the value or interest of the work in question.
AASMI (American Association for the Study of Mental Imagery) (n.d.). Web page, retrieved April 30, 2004, from
Abelson, R.P. (1979). Imagining the Purpose of Imagery. Behavioral & Brain Sciences (2) 548-549.
Ahsen, A. (1965). Eidetic Psychotherapy: A Short Introduction. New York: Brandon House.
Ahsen, A. (1977). Eidetics: An Overview. Journal of Mental Imagery (1) 5-38.
Ahsen A. (1984). ISM: The Triple Code Model for Imagery and Psychophysiology. Journal of Mental Imagery (8) 15-42.
Ahsen, A. (1985). Unvividness Paradox. Journal of Mental Imagery (9) 1-18.
Ahsen, A. (1993). Imagery Paradigm: Imaginative Consciousness in the Experimental and Clinical Setting. New York: Brandon House.
Ahsen, A. (1999). Hot and Cold Mental Imagery: Mind over Body Encounters. New York: Brandon House.
Akins, K. (1996). Of Sensory Systems and the "Aboutness" of Mental States. Journal of Philosophy (91) 337-372.
Aloimonos, Y. (Ed.). (1993). Active Perception. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
Anderson, J.R. (1978). Arguments Concerning Representations for Mental Imagery. Psychological Review (85) 249-77.
Argues that the analog vs.propositional (picture vs. description) question is ill posed.
Anderson, J.R. (1979). Further Arguments Concerning Representations for Mental Imagery: A Response to Hayes-Roth and Pylyshyn. Psychological Review (86) 395-406.
Anderson, J.R. (1983). The Architecture of Cognition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
Anderson, J.R. & Bower G.H. (1973). Human Associative Memory. Washington D.C.: Winston/ New York: Wiley.
An early critique of Dual Coding Theory from a computational, common coding perspective.
Anderson, R.E. (1998). Imagery and Spatial Representation. In W. Bechtel & G. Graham (Eds.) A Companion to Cognitive Science (pp. 204-211). Oxford: Blackwell.
Review article.
Ando, T. (1965). Aristotle's Theory of Practical Cognition. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
Andrade, J., Kavanagh, D., & Baddeley, A.D. (1997). Eye-Movements and Visual Imagery: A Working Memory Approach to the Treatment of Post-Traumatic Stress Disorder. British Journal of Clinical Psychology (36) 209–223.
Anscombe, G.E.M. (1965). The Intentionality of Sensation: A Grammatical Feature. In R.J. Butler (Ed.). Analytical Philosophy — Second Series (pp. 158-180). Oxford: Blackwell.
Antonietti, A. (1999). Can Students Predict When Imagery Will Allow Them to Discover the Problem Solution? European Journal of Cognitive Psychology (11) 407-428.
Arp, R. (2005). Scenario Visualization: One Explanation of Creative Problem Solving. Journal of Consciousness Studies (12, iii) 31-60.
Argues, from the standpoint of Evolutionary Psychology and the theory of the modular mind, for the key role of imagery in innovative and creative thought and problem solving.
Ash, M.G. (1998). Gestalt Psychology in German Culture, 1890-1967. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
Atwood, G. (1971). An Experimental Study of Visual Imagination and Imagery. Cognitive Psychology (2) 290-299.
A demonstration of the selective interference effect in a memory task. For a more methodologically satisfactory demonstration of same, see Janssen (1976a, 1976b).
Audi, R. (1978). The Ontological Status of Mental Images. Inquiry (21) 348-361.
Aveling E. (1927). The Relevance of Visual Imagery to the Process of Thinking 2. British Journal of Psychology (18) 15-22.
A companion piece to Pear (1927) and Bartlett (1927).
Baars, B.J. (1986). The Cognitive Revolution in Psychology. New York: Guilford Press.
Baars, B.J. (Ed.) (1996). Special issue on mental imagery of Consciousness and Cognition (5-iii).
Baddeley, A.D. (1976). The Psychology of Memory. London: Harper.
Baddeley, A.D. (1994). Working Memory. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Baddeley, A.D., Grant, S., Wright, E., & Thompson, N. (1975). Imagery and Visual Working Memory. In P.M.A. Rabbit & S. Dornic (Eds.), Attention and Performance 5. London: Academic Press.
A demonstration of the selective interference effect (cf. Brooks, 1968).
Baddeley, A.D. & Hitch, G. (1974). Working Memory. In G.H. Bower (Ed.) The Psychology of Learning and Motivation, Vol. 8. New York & London: Academic Press.
Baddeley, A.D. & Lieberman, K. (1980). Spatial Working Memory. In R.S. Nickerson (Ed.), Attention and Performance VIII. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
Demonstates the spatial basis of the selective interference effect.
Bajcsy, R. (1988). Active Perception. Proceedings of the IEEE (76) 996-1005.
Ballard, D.H. (1991). Animate Vision. Artificial Intelligence (48) 57-86.
Barber, T.X. (1959). The Afterimages of "Hallucinated" and "Imagined" Colors. Journal of Abnormal and Social Psychology (59) 136-139.
Experimental demonstration that, in some subjects, negative afterimages may be induced by purely imagined colors.
Barquero, B. & Logie, R.H. (1999). Imagery Constraints on Quantitative and Qualitative Aspects of Mental Synthesis. European Journal of Cognitive Psychology (11) 315-333.
Barsalou, L.W. (1999). Perceptual Symbol Systems (with commentaries and author's reply). Behavioral and Brain Sciences (22) 577-660. Preprint available online
Purportedly not directly about imagery, but deals with the closely adjacent topic of mental representations that are inherently perceptual in character, and argues that they are adequate to account for cognition, and explanatorily superior to "amodal" conceptions of representation (such as mentalese) For some recent supporting evidence, that also makes the link with imagery explicit, see Kan et al. (2003), and for some philosophical support see Nyíri (2001).
Bartlett, F.C. (1927). The Relevance of Visual Imagery to the Process of Thinking. British Journal of Psychology (18) 23-29.
A companion piece to Pear (1927) and Aveling (1927).
Bartlett, F.C. (1932). Remembering. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
Bartley, W.W. (1973). Wittgenstein. New York: Lippincott.
Bartolomeo, P. (2002). The Relationship Between Visual perception and Visual Mental Imagery: A Reappraisal of the Neuropsychological Evidence. Cortex (38) 357-378. Available online
Reviews the clinical evidence on deficits in visual mental imagery (and related deficits in visual perception) resulting from brain injury. He concludes that the evidence is not consistent with the Quasi-Pictorial Theory of Kosslyn (1980, 1994), but favors thePerceptual Activity Theory of Thomas (1999b). See also, Bartolomeo & Chokron (2002).
Bartolomeo, P., Bachoud-Lévi, A-C., De Gelder, B. Denes, G., G., Dalla Barba, G., Brugieres, P. & Degos, J.-P. (1998). Multiple-Domain Dissociation between Impaired Visual Perception and Preserved Mental Imagery in a Patient with Bilateral Extrastriate Lesions. Neuropsychologia (36) 239-249.
Neurological evidence suggests that imagery does not depend on activity in the early visual areas of the brain. For an opposing view see Kosslyn, Alpert et al. (1993), Kosslyn, Thompson et al. (1995), Kosslyn, Pascual-Leone et al. (1999). See Kosslyn & Thompson (2003) for further review of this issue and an attempt to reconcile the conflicting findings from neuroimaging studies, but see also Bartolomeo (2002) for more on the neurological evidence.
Bartolomeo, P., Bachoud-Lévi, A-C., & Denes, G. (1997). Preserved Imagery for Colours in a Patient with Cerebral Achromatopsia. Cortex (33) 369-378.
See note on previous item.
Bartolomeo, P. & Chokron, S. (2002). Can We Change our Vantage Point to Explore Imaginal Neglect? Behavioral and Brain Sciences (25) 184-185.
Expands on the argument first made by Bartolomeo (2002), that the evidence concerning the neurological syndrome of representational neglect (Bisiach & Luzzatti, 1978; Bartolomeo, D'Erme, & Gainotti, 1994) is not consistent with either Pictorial or Propositional theories of imagery, but favors Perceptual Activity Theory.
Bartolomeo, P., D'Erme, P., & Gainotti, G. (1994). The Relation between Visuospatial Neglect and Representational Neglect. Neurology (44) 1710-1714.
See Bisiach & Luzzatti (1978).
Basso, A., Bisiach, E., & Luzzatti, C. (1980). Loss of Mental Imagery: A Case Study. Neuropsychologia (18) 435-442.
Baylor, G.W. (1972). A Treatise on the Mind's Eye: An Empirical Investigation of Visual Mental Imagery. Ph.D. thesis, Carnegie-Mellon University, Pittsburgh, PA. (University Microfilms 72-12, 699.)
The first serious attempt to simulate imagery computationally. The major inspiration for the description theory of Pylyshyn (1973).
Baylor, G.W. (1973). Modelling the Mind's Eye. In A. Elithorn & D. Jones (Eds.), Artificial and Human Thinking. Amsterdam: Elsevier.
A brief sketch of the model detailed in Baylor (1972).
Beare, J.I. (1906). Greek Theories of Elementary Cognition: From Alcmaeon to Aristotle. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Belardinelli, M.O., Di Matteo, R., Del Gratta, C., De Nicola, A., Ferretti A., Tartaro, A., Bonomo, L., & Romani, G.L. (2004). Intermodal Sensory Image Generation: An fMRI Analysis. European Journal of Cognitive Psychology (16) 729-752.
Finds that the left middle-inferior temporal area of the brain is activated by imagery tasks in any sensory modality.
Bennett, M.R. & Hacker, P.M.S. (2003). Philosophical Foundations of Neuroscience. Oxford: Blackwell.
The central thesis of this book, strongly influenced by Wittgenstein, is that mental states, processes, characteristics, experiences, etc. are not properly attributed to brains, but, rather, only to whole persons or organisms. In chapter 6, cognitive theories that treat mental images as inner representations, embodied as brain states, are criticized and rejected from this perspective.
Bensafi, M., Porter, J., Pouliot, S., Mainland, J., Johnson, B., Zelano, C., Young, N., Bremner, E., Aframian, D., Kahn, R., & Sobel, N. (2003). Olfactomotor Activity During Imagery Mimics that During Perception. Nature Neuroscience (6) 1142 — 1144.
Provides some direct support for a perceptual activity account (Thomas, 1999b) of olfactory imagery. Analogous to the findings of Brandt & Stark (1997) and Laeng & Teodorescu (2002) on eye movements during visual imagery.
Bergson, H. (1907). Creative Evolution.. (Authorized translation from the original French by A. Mitchell: New York: Holt, 1911.)
Chapter 4 deals with "the cinematographical mechanism of thought," Bergson's account of the nature and limitations of image thinking.
Berkeley, G. (1734). A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge. (2nd edn.) In M.R. Ayers (Ed.). George Berkeley: Philosophical Works Including the Works on Vision. London: Dent, 1975.
The ideas of Berkeley's philosophy are, to all intents and purposes, mental images.
Betts, G.H. (1909). The Distribution and Functions of Mental Imagery. New York: Teachers College, Columbia University.
A seminal, questionnaire-based investigation of individual differences in imagery vividness and in the frequency of the spontaneous occurence of imagery in thinking. The Betts Questionnaire upon Mental Imagery (QMI) continues to be used (although often in modified and abbreviated forms) in vividness research.
Bexton, W.H., Heron, W., & Scott, T.H. (1954). Effects of Decreased Variation in the Sensory Environment. Canadian Journal of Psychology (8) 70-76.
Sensory deprivation discovered to give rise to spontaneous and bizarre imagery.
Bisiach, E. & Berti, A. (1990). Waking Images and Neural Activity. In R.G. Kunzendorf & A.A. Sheikh (Eds.) The Psychophysiology of Mental Imagery: Theory, Research and Application. Amityville, NY: Baywood.
Bisiach, E. & Luzzatti, C. (1978). Unilateral Neglect of Representational Space. Cortex (14) 129-133.
Brain damaged patients who ignore things to their left also ignore the left side in their imagery. Also see the next item, and: Bartolomeo, D'Erme, & Gainotti, (1994), Coslett (1997).
Bisiach, E., Luzzatti, C., & Perani, D. (1979). Unilateral Neglect, Representational Schema and Consciousness. Brain (102) 609-618.
Blachowicz, J. (1997). Analog Representation Beyond Mental Imagery. Journal of Philosophy (94) 55-84.
Blake, A. & Yuille, A. (Eds.) (1992). Active Vision. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Block, N. (Ed.) (1981a). Imagery. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Widely read collection of pieces concerned with the analog/propositional debate..
Block, N. (Ed.) (1981b). Readings in Philosophy of Psychology, Vol. 2. London: Methuen.
Section on imagery adds to and complements the above.
Block, N. (1983a). Mental Pictures and Cognitive Science. Philosophical Review (92) 499-539.
Block, N. (1983b). The Photographic Fallacy and the Debate about Mental Imagery. Noûs (17) 651-661.
Bloor, D. (1983). Wittgenstein: A Social Theory of Knowledge. London: Macmillan.
Blumenthal, A.C. (1975). A Reappraisal of Wilhelm Wundt. American Psychologist (30) 1081-1088.
Blumenthal, H.J. (1977-8). Neoplatonic Interpretations of Aristotle on Phantasia. Review of Metaphysics (31) 242-257.
Boring, E.G. (1950). A History of Experimental Psychology (2nd edn.). New York: Appleton.
Bower, G.H. (1970). Imagery as a Relational Organizer in Associative Memory. Journal of Verbal Learning and Verbal Behavior (9) 529-533.
Bower, G.H. (1972). Mental Imagery and Associative Learning. In L.W. Gregg (Ed.), Cognition in Learning and Memory. New York: Wiley.
Bower, K.J. (1984). Imagery: From Hume to Cognitive Science. Canadian Journal of Philosophy (14) 217-234.
Defends the view that mental images are copies of (in the same format as) percepts .
Brandt, S.A. & Stark, L.W. (1997). Spontaneous Eye Movements During Visual Imagery Reflect the Content of the Visual Scene. Journal of Cognitive Neuroscience (9) 27-38.
Some direct experimental support of a perceptual activity theory of imagery (Hebb, 1968; Neisser, 1976; Thomas, 1999b). This work has been recently replicated and extended by Laeng & Teodorescu (2002). Similar evidence comes from Demarais & Cohen (1998), Spivey & Geng (2001), Bensafi et al. (2003), de’Sperati (2003), and Hong et al. (1997).
Brann, E.T.H. (1991). The World of the Imagination: Sum and Substance. Savage, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
An ambitious philosophical history of conceptions of imagination and imagery, from ancient to contemporary times.
Brett, E.A. & Ostroff, R. (1985). Imagery and Posttraumatic Stress Disorder: An Overview. American Journal of Psychiatry (142) 417-424.
Bringman, W.G. & Tweney, R.D. (Eds.) (1980). Wundt Studies. Toronto: Hogrefe.
Brodie, A. (1986-7). Medieval Notions and the Theory of Ideas. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (86) 153-167.
Brooks, L.R. (1967). The Suppression of Visualization by Reading. Quarterly Journal of Experimental Psychology (19) 287-299.
Brooks, L. R. (1968). Spatial and Verbal Components of the Act of Recall. Canadian Journal of Psychology (22) 349-368.
The classic demonstration of selective interference between spatial perception and spatial (including visual) imagery. See Hampson & Duffy (1984) for a replication in congenitally blind subjects, and De Beni & Moè ( 2003) for a morerecent study of the effect .
Brown, J.R. (1991). The Laboratory of the Mind: Thought Experiments in the Natural Sciences. London: Routledge.
Bugelski, B.R. (1970). Words and Things and Images. American Psychologist (25) 1002-10012.
On imagery effects in verbal learning experiments.
Bugelski, B.R. (1971). The Definition of the Image. In S.J. Segal (Ed.) Imagery: Current Cognitive Approaches. New York: Academic Press.
Bugelski, B.R. (1977). Mnemonics. In International Encyclopedia of Psychiatry, Psychology, Psychoanalysis, and Neurology, Vol. 7. New York: Van Nostrand Reinhold.
Bugelski, (1979). Eidetic Posession: Is Exorcism Necessary? Behavioral and Brain Sciences (2) 598-599.
Skeptical as to whether eidetic imagery is a genuine phenomenon. (A commentary on Haber (1979).)
Bugelski, B.R. (1984). Imagery. In R.J. Corsini (Ed.). Encyclopedia of Psychology, Vol. 2 (pp.185-187). New York: Wiley.
Bugelski, B.R., Kidd, E., & Segmen, J. (1968). Image as a Mediator in One Trial Paired Associate Learning. Journal of Experimental Psychology (76) 69-73.
Burnham, J.C. (1968). On the Origins of Behaviorism. Journal of the History of the Behavioral Sciences (4) 143-151.
Candlish, S. (1975). Mental Images and Pictorial Properties. Mind (84) 260-262.
A critique of Hannay's (1971) defense of pictorialism.
Candlish, S. (1976). The Incompatibility of Perception and Imagery: A Contemporary Orthodoxy. American Philosophical Quarterly (13) 63-68.
Stewart Candlish informs me that the title of this article was misprinted in the published version. The title given here is the one he intended.
Candlish, S. (2001). Mental Imagery. In S. Schroeder (Ed.). Wittgenstein and Contemporary Philosophy of Mind. London: Palgrave.
Discusses Wittgenstein's views on imagery, and their influence.
Carpenter, P.A. & Eisenberg, P. (1978). Mental Rotation and the Frame of Reference in Blind and Sighted Individuals. Perception and Psychophysics (23) 117-124.
Mental rotation effect (Shepard & Cooper, 1982) demonstrated in congenitally blind subjects using tactile stimuli (cf. Marmor & Zaback, 1976; and see also: Jonides, Kahn, & Rozin, 1975; Kerr, 1983; Zimler & Keenan, 1983).
Casey, E.S. (1971). Imagination: Imagining and the Image. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (31) 475-90.
Casey, E.S. (1976). Imagining: A Phenomenological Study. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
Casey, E.S. (1977-8). Imagining and Remembering. Review of Metaphysics (31) 187-209.
Chambers, D. (1993). Images are Both Depictive and Descriptive. In B. Roskos-Ewoldsen, M.J. Intons-Peterson & R.E. Anderson (Eds.). Imagery, Creativity and Discovery: A Cognitive Perspective (pp. 77-97). Amsterdam: Elsevier.
Chambers, D. & Reisberg, D. (1985). Can Mental Images be Ambiguous? Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance (11) 317-328.
A very striking experiment; but see Peterson et al. (1992), Rollins (1994), Cornoldi et al, (1996), Slezak (1991, 1995), and other listed works by Chambers and/or Reisberg for related (and often conflicting) experimental results, and competing interpretations.
Chambers, D. & Reisberg, D. (1992). What an Image Depicts Depends on What an Image Means: An Image of a Duck Does Not Include a Rabbit's Nose. Cognitive Psychology (24) 145-174.
Churchland, P.S., Ramachandran, V.S., & Sejnowski, T.J. (1994). A Critique of Pure Vision. In C. Koch & J. Davis (Eds.). Large Scale Neuronal Theories of the Brain. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Clark, J.M. & Paivio, A. (1989). Observational and Theoretical Terms in Psychology: A Cognitive Perspective on Scientific Language. American Psychologist (44) 500-512.
Attempts to apply Dual Coding Theory (Paivio, 1971) to an issue in the philosophy of science.
Cohen, D. (1979). J. B. Watson — the Founder of Behaviorism: A Biography. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
Cohen, J. (1996). The Imagery Debate: A Critical Assessment. Journal of Philosophical Research (21) 149-182.
Collins, A.M. & Quillian, M.R. (1969). Retrieval Time from Semantic Memory. Journal of Verbal Learning and Verbal Behavior (8) 240-247.
Cornoldi, C., Logie, R.H., Brandimonte, M.A., Kaufmann, G., & Reisberg, D. (1996). Stretching the Imagination: Representation and Transformation in Mental Imagery. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
See note at Chambers & Reisberg (1985).
Coslett, H.B. (1997). Neglect in Vision and Visual Imagery: A Double Dissociation. Brain (120) 1163-1171.
See note at Bisiach & Luzzatti (1978).
Crammond, D.J. (1997). Motor Imagery: Never in Your Wildest Dreams. Trends in Neuroscience (20-2) 54-57.
Currie, G. (1995). Visual Imagery as the Simulation of Vision. Mind and Language (10) 25-44.
Currie, G. (2000). Imagination, Delusion and Hallucinations. Mind and Language (15) 168-183.
Currie, G. & Ravenscroft, I. (1997). Mental Simulation and Motor Imagery. Philosophy of Science (64) 161-180.
Damasio, A. (2003). Looking for Spinoza: Joy, Sorrow, and the Feeling Brain. New York, Harcourt.
Danto, A.C. (1958). Concerning Mental Pictures. Journal of Philosophy (55) 12-20.
Danziger, K. (1979). The Positivist Repudiation of Wundt. Journal of the History of the Behavioral Sciences (15) 205-230.
Danziger, K. (1980). The History of Introspection Reconsidered. Journal of the History of the Behavioral Sciences (16) 241-262.
Daston, L. (1998). Fear and Loathing of the Imagination in Science. Dædalus (127-1) 73-95.
Davies, M. & Stone, T. (1995). Mental Simulation. Oxford: Blackwell.
de Beauvoir, S. (1960) The Prime of Life. (Translated from the French by P. Green. Cleveland, OH: World Publishing Company, 1962.)
De Beni, R. & Cornoldi, C. (1988). Imagery Limitations in Totally Congenitally Blind Subjects. Journal of Experimental Psychology: Learning, Memory, and Cognition (14) 650-655.
De Beni, R. & Moè, A. (2003). Imagery and rehearsal as study strategies for written or orally presented passages. Psychonomic Bulletin & Review (10) 975-980.
A recent study of the selective interference effect. Cf. Brooks (1967, 1968).
De Volder, A.G., Toyama, H., Kimura, Y., Kiyosawa, M., Nakano, H., Vanlierde, A., Wanet-Defalque, M.-C., Mishina, M., Oda, K., Ishiwata, K., & Senda, M. (2001). Auditory Triggered Mental Imagery of Shape Involves Visual Association Areas in Early Blind Humans. NeuroImage (14) 129–139.
See Lambert et al. (2004) for more on the neuroscience of imagery in the congenitally blind.
de’Sperati, C. (2003). Precise Oculomotor Correlates of Visuospatial Mental Rotation and Circular Motion Imagery. Journal of Cognitive Neuroscience (15) 1244–1259.
Cf. Brandt & Stark (1997), and Laeng & Teodorescu (2002)..
Demarais, A.M & Cohen, B.H. (1998). Evidence for Image-Scanning Eye Movements during Transitive Inference. Biological Psychology (49) 229-247.
Eye movements during imagery re-enact those that would be expected during perception of a similar scene. This lends support to the perceptual activity theory of imagery (Hebb, 1968; Hochberg, 1968; Sarbin & Juhasz, 1970; Neisser, 1976; Thomas, 1999b). For further evidence for re-enactive perceptual behavior during imagery see: Brandt & Stark (1997), Spivey & Geng (2001), Laeng & Teodorescu (2002), Bensafi et al. (2003), de’Sperati (2003), and Hong et al. (1997).
Denis, M. (1991). Image and Cognition. New York: Harvester Wheatsheaf. (Original French, 1989.)
Useful survey.
Denis, M. & Carfantan, M. (1985). People's Knowledge About Images. Cognition (20) 49-60.
An empirical study of the folk psychology of imagery.
Denis, M., Engelkamp, J., & Richardson, J.T.E. (Eds.) (1988). Cognitive and Neuropsychological Approaches to Mental Imagery. Dordrecht, Netherlands: Martinus Nijhoff.
Denis, M., Logie, R.H., Cornoldi, C., De Vega, M. & Engelkamp, J. (Eds.) (2001). Imagery, Language, and Visuo-Spatial Thinking. Hove, U.K.: Psychology Press.
Denis, M., Mellet, E., & Kosslyn, S.M. (Eds.) (2004). Neuroimaging of Mental Imagery. Special issue of the European Journal of Cognitive Psychology (vol. 16, No. 5, September 2004).
Dennett, D.C. (1969). Content and Consciousness. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
Argues that the inherent vagueness of images suggests that they are more like descriptions than pictures. (A similar argument to that of Shorter (1952). See Hannay (1971), Block (1983b), or Tye (1991) for rebuttals.
Dennett, D.C. (1978). Two Approaches to Mental Imagery. In his Brainstorms. Montgomery, VT: Bradford Books.
Dennett, D.C. (1991). Consciousness Explained. Boston, MA: Little, Brown.
Chapter 10 attempts to integrate Kosslyn's quasi-pictorial theory of imagery into Dennett's philosophical framework.
Descartes, R. (1649). The Passions of the Soul. (Translated from the French by R. Stoothoff, in J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff & D. Murdoch (Trans. & Eds.). The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Vol.1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985.)
Descartes, R. (1664). L'Homme (Treatise of Man). (Facsimile of the original French, together with an English translation by T.S. Hall: Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1972. An abridged translation, by R. Stoothoff, is also available in J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff & D. Murdoch (Trans. & Eds.). The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Vol.1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985.)
Descartes' seminal mechanical theory of human physiology, including mechanistic accounts of perception, memory, emotion, and imagination. The work is thought to have been written in or before 1633, but was not published until 1664.
D'Esposito, M., Detre, J.A., Aguirre, G.K., Stallcup, M., Alsop, D.C., Tippet, L.J., & Farah, M.J. (1997). A Functional MRI Study of Mental Image Generation. Neuropsychologia (35) 725-730.
Finds that visual association cortex, but not primary visual cortex, is activated during visual mental imagery. (See Bartolomeo (2002) and Kosslyn & Thompson (2003) for review of the issue.)
Deutsch, M. (1981). Imagery and Inference in Physical Research. In Tweney, R. D., Doherty, M. E., & Mynatt, C. R. (Eds.), On Scientific Thinking (pp. 354-360). New York: Columbia University Press. (Extract from original work of 1959.)
Dilman, I. (1968). Imagination. Analysis (28) 90-97.
DiVesta, F.J., Ingersoll, G., & Sunshine P. (1971). A Factor Analysis of Imagery Tests. Journal of Verbal Learning and Verbal Behavior (10) 471-479.
Doob, L.W. (1964). Eidetic Imagery amongst the Ibo. Ethnology (3) 357-363.
A study of eidetic imagery in a traditional African culture.
Doob, L.W. (1965). Exploring Eidetic Imagery among the Kamba of Central Kenya. Journal of Social Psychology (67) 3-22.
Another study of eidetic imagery in a traditional African culture.
Doob, L.W. (1966). Eidetic Imagery: A Cross-Cultural Will-o’-the-Wisp? Journal of Psychology (63) 13-34.
Doob, L.W. (1972). The Ubiquitous Appearance of Images. In P.W. Sheehan (Ed.). The Function and Nature of Imagery (pp. 311-332). New York: Academic Press.
A review of work on the cross-cultural study of imagery.
Dror, I.E., Ivey, C., & Rogus, C. (1997). Visual Mental Rotation of Possible and Impossible Objects. Psychonomic Bulletin and Review (4) 242-247.
Dunlap, K. (1912). The Case Against Introspection. Psychological Review (19) 404-413.
Dunlap, K. (1914). Images and Ideas. Johns Hopkins University Circular (3 — March 1914) 25-41.
A motor theory of imagery. See Washburn (1916) for a related view, and Thomas (1989) for discussion.
Dunlap, K. (1932). Knight Dunlap. In C. Murchison (Ed.), A History of Psychology in Autobiography (Vol. 2, pp. 35-61). Worcester, MA: Clark University Press.
Durgin, F.H. (2002). The Tinkerbell Effect: Motion Perception and Illusion. Journal of Consciousness Studies (9, v-vii) 88-101.
Eddy, J.K. & Glass, A.L. (1981). Reading and Listening to High and Low Imagery Sentences. Journal of Verbal Learning and Verbal Behavior (20) 333-345.
The selective interference effect in verbal memory.
Ekstein, M. (2001). Visions of a Compassionate World: Guided Imagery for Spiritual Growth and Social Transformation. Jerusalem: Urim Publications.
Ellis, R.D. (1995). Questioning Consciousness: The Interplay of Imagery, Cognition, and Emotion in the Human Brain. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
Gives an imagery based theory of thought and semantics. See Thomas (1997b) for discussion.
Esrock, E.J. (1994). The Reader's Eye: Visual Imaging as Reader Response. Baltimore, MD. Johns Hopkins University Press.
A historical treatment of the role of the concept of mental (as opposed to verbal) imagery in 20th century literary criticism, and a proposal, drawing on cognitive psychology research, for a mental imagery based theory of response to literature. Cf. Scarry (1999).
Fallgatter, A.J., Mueller, T.J., & Stirk W.K. (1997). Neurophysiological Correlates of Mental Imagery in Different Sensory Modalities. International Journal of Psychophysiology (25) 145-153.
Fancher, R.E. (1996). Pioneers of Psychology (3rd edn.). New York: W.W. Norton.
Farah, M.J. (1984). The Neurological Basis of Mental Imagery: A Componential Analysis. Cognition (18) 245-72.
Interprets the then know neurological evidence according to the theory of Kosslyn (1980). See Sergent (1990) for a critique, and Bartolomeo (2002) for a more recent review of the neurology that comes to very diferent conclusions.
Farah, M.J. (1988). Is Visual Imagery Really Visual? Overlooked Evidence from Neuropsychology. Psychological Review (95) 307-317.
Farah, M. J., Hammond, K. M., Levine, D. N., & Calvanio, R. (1988). Visual and Spatial Mental Imagery: Dissociable Systems of Representation. Cognitive Psychology (20) 439-462.
Farah, M. J., Soso, M. J., & Dasheif, R. M. (1992). Visual Angle of the Mind's Eye Before and After Unilateral Occipital Lobectomy. Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance (18) 241-246.
Farley, A.M. (1974). VIPS: A Visual Imagery Perception System; the Result of Protocol Analysis. Ph.D. thesis, Carnegie-Mellon University, Pittsburgh, PA.
Computer model of imagery based on the perceptual activity theory of Hochberg (1968).
Farley, A.M. (1976). A Computer Implementation of Constructive Visual Imagery and Perception. In R.A. Monty J.W. Senders (Eds.) Eye Movements and Psychological Processes. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
A concise account of the model developed by Farley (1974).
Ferguson, E.S. (1977). The Mind's Eye: Nonverbal Thought in Technology. Science (197) 827-836.
Ferguson, E.S. (1992). Engineering and the Mind's Eye. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
ffytche, D.H., Howard, R.J., Brammer, M.J,. David, A., Woodruff, P., & Williams, S. (1998). The Anatomy of Conscious Vision: An fMRI Study of Visual Hallucinations. Nature Neuroscience (1) 738-742.
Finke, R.A. (1980). Levels of Equivalence in Imagery and Perception. Psychological Review (87) 113-132.
Finke, R.A. (1985). Theories Relating Imagery to Perception. Psychological Bulletin (98) 236-259.
Finke, R.A. (1986). Mental Imagery and the Visual System. Scientific American (245 #iii, March) 76-83.
Finke, R.A. (1989). Principles of Mental Imagery. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Useful textbook of the experimental cognitive psychology of imagery.
Finke, R.A., Pinker, S., & Farah, M.J. (1989). Reinterpreting Visual Patterns in Mental Imagery. Cognitive Science (13) 51-78.
Finke, R.A. & Shepard, R.N. (1986). Visual Functions of Mental Imagery. In K.R. Boff, L. Kaufman, & J.P. Thomas (Eds.). Handbook of Perception and Human Performance, Vol. 2. New York: Wiley-Interscience.
Finke, R.A., Ward, T.B., & Smith, S.M. (1992). Creative Cognition: Theory, Research, and Applications. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Gives imagery a large role in inventive thinking.
Flanagan, O.J.jr., (1984). The Science of the Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Suggests a "six-code" instead of a Dual Code theory of memory (cf. Kintsch, 1977).
Flew, A. (1953). Images, Supposing and Imagining. Philosophy (28) 246-254.
Fodor, J.A. (1975). The Language of Thought. New York: Thomas Crowell. (Paperback edition: Harvard University Press, 1980)
Argues that imagery representations must be semantically dependent on representations that are linguistic in form.
Fodor, J.A. (1983). The Modularity of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Fontaine, K. (2000). Healing Practices: Alternative Therapies for Nursing. Upper Saddle River, NJ : Prentice Hall.
Includes a section on guided imagery techniques for pain relief.
Frege, G. (1884). Grundlagen der Arithmetik (The Foundations of Arithmetic). (Translated from the German by J.L. Austin, Oxford: Blackwell, 1953.)
Argues, in §§59-60, that the meanings of words, being public and objective, cannot be based upon imagery, which is inherently private, subjective, and idiosyncratic.
Freyd, J.J. (1987). Dynamic Mental Representations. Psychological Review (94) 427-38.
Imagery in motion.
Furbank P.N. (1970). Reflections on the Word ‘Image’. London: Secker & Warburg.
Discusses (very critically) the widespread use of the word ‘imagery’ as a term of art of literary criticism, with a historical account of the origins of the usage that (amongst other things) deals with the relation between the concepts of literary imagery and mental imagery. Furbank's conception of the latter is clearly heavily influenced by Sartre (1940), and, especially, Ryle (1949).
Furlong, E.J. (1953). Abstract Ideas and Images. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary volume 27) 121-136.
Furlong, E.J. (1961). Imagination. London: Allen & Unwin.
Gale, R.M. (1967). Propositions, Judgements, Sentences and Statements. In P. Edwards (Ed.), The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Vol. 6 (pp. 494-505). New York: Macmillan.
Galton, F. (1880). Statistics of Mental Imagery. Mind (5) 301-318. Reprint available online
Pioneering individual differences survey of imagery vividness..
Galton, F. (1883). Inquiries into Human Faculty and its Development. London: Macmillan.
Includes a summary and further discussion of the results of the above, a model for general images (of character types) from superimposed photographs, and a descriptive account of arithmetical images, the "number forms".
Gardner, H. (1987). The Mind's New Science: A History of the Cognitive Revolution (2nd edition). New York: Basic Books.
Includes a fairly good account of the "analog-propositional" debate.
Gawain, S. (1982). Creative Visualization. New York: Bantam.
Gendler, T.S. (1998). Galileo and the Indispensability of Scientific Thought Experiment. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science (49) 397-424.
Georgopoulos, A.P., Lurito, J.T., Petrides, M., & Schwartz, A.B. (1989). Mental Rotation of the Neuronal Population Vector. Science (243) 234-236.
A neuroscientific study of the mental rotation effect (in monkeys) which links it to motor control.
Giaquinto, M. (1992). Visualizing as a Means of Geometrical Discovery. Mind and Language (7) 382-401.
Giaquinto, M. (1993). Visualizing in Arithmetic. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (53) 385-396.
Gibson, J.J. (1966). The Senses Considered as Perceptual Systems. Boston, MA: Houghton Mifflin.
Gibson, J.J. (1970). On the Relation Between Hallucination and Perception. Leonardo (3) 425-7.
Gibson, J.J. (1974). Visualizing Conceived as Visual Apprehending Without Any Particular Point of Observation. Leonardo (7) 41-42.
Gibson, J.J. (1979). The Ecological Approach to Visual Perception. Boston, MA: Houghton Mifflin.
Glasgow, J.I. (1993). The Imagery Debate Revisited: A Computational Perspective. Computational Intelligence (9) 310-333.
Printed with numerous peer commentaries and author's reply.
Glasgow, J. & Papadias, D. (1992). Computational Imagery. Cognitive Science (16) 355-394.
Goldenberg, G. (1989). The Ability of Patients with Brain Damage to Generate Mental Visual Images. Brain (112) 305-325.
Goldenberg, G., Müllbacher, W., & Nowak, A. (1995). Imagery Without Perception — A Case Study of Anosognosia for Cortical Blindness. Neuropsychologia (33) 1375-1382.
A case of Anton's syndrome (blindness denial) in a patient blinded because of almost complete destruction of V1 (primary visual cortex). There is evidence that this patient had good visual imagery despite most of V1 being absent.
Goodman, N. (1968). Languages of Art. Indianapolis, IN: Bobbs-Merrill.
Makes a forceful argument against any role for resemblance in representation.
Gray, C.R. & Gummerman, K. (1975). The Enigmatic Eidetic Image: A Critical Examination of Methods, Data, and Theories. Psychological Bulletin (82) 383-407.
Grüsser, O.-J. & Landis, T. (1991). Visual Agnosias and Other Disturbances of Visual Perception and Cognition. London: Macmillan.
Has little directly to say about mental imagery proper, but provides useful reviews of what is known about other types of quasi-perceptual phenomena, such as phosphenes (ch. 10) and afterimages (ch. 23).
Haber, R.N. (1970). Imagine! They are Finally Talking about Images Again. Contemporary Psychology (15) 556-559.
Haber, R.N. (1979). Twenty Years of Haunting Eidetic Imagery: Where's the Ghost? Behavioral and Brain Sciences (2) 583-629.
A major review of research on the elusive phenomenon of eidetic imagery, with appended commentaries.
Haber, R.N. (1983). The Impending Demise of the Icon: A Critique of the Concept of Iconic Storage in Visual Information Processing. Behavioral & Brain Sciences (6) 1-54.
The so called "iconic memory" discussed here is not mental imagery. It is both phenomenologically and functionally quite different.
Hampson, P.J. (1979). The Role of Imagery in Cognition. Ph.D. thesis, University of Lancaster, Lancaster, U.K.
Hampson, P.J. & Duffy, C. (1984). Verbal and Spatial Interference Effects in Congenitally Blind and Sighted Subjects. Canadian Journal of Psychology (38) 411-20.
Selective interference effects (see Brooks (1967, 1968)) demonstrated between spatial perception and spatial imagery in the congenitally blind.
Hampson, P.J., Marks, D.F., & Richardson, J.T.E. (Eds.) (1990). Imagery: Current Developments. London: Routledge.
Hampson, P.J. & Morris, P.E. (1978). Unfulfilled Expectations: A Critique of Neisser's Theory of Imagery. Cognition (6) 79-85.
A critique of Neisser's (1976) perceptual activity theory of imagery. See Neisser (1978) for reply.
Hampson, P.J. & Morris, P.E. (1979). Cyclical Processing: A Framework for Imagery Research. Journal of Mental Imagery (3) 11-22.
An attempt to synthesize the quasi-pictorial and perceptual activity theories.
Hannay, A. (1971). Mental Images — A Defence. London: Allen & Unwin.
Argues for the reality of inner pictures.
Hannay, A. (1973). To See a Mental Image. Mind (82) 161-262.
Harman, G. (1998). Intentionality. In W. Bechtel & G. Graham (Eds.). A Companion to Cognitive Science (pp. 602-610). Oxford: Blackwell.
Includes a discussion of the intentionality of imagery.
Harrison, B. (1962-3). Meaning and Mental Images. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (63) 237-250.
Hauck, P.D., Walsh, C.C., & Kroll, N.E.A. (1976). Visual Imagery Mnemonics: Common vs. Bizarre Mental Images. Bulletin of the Psychonomic Society (7) 160-162.
Hayes, J.R. (1973). On the Function of Visual Imagery in Elementary Mathematics. In W.G. Chase (Ed.) Visual Information Processing. New York: Academic Press.
Hayes-Roth, F. (1979). Distinguishing Theories of Mental Representation: A Critique of Anderson's "Arguments Concerning Mental Imagery". Psychological Review (86) 376-382.
Hebb, D.O. (1960). The American Revolution. American Psychologist (15) 735-745.
Hebb, D.O. (1968). Concerning Imagery. Psychological Review (75) 466-477.
Outlines a version of motor or perceptual activity theory.
Hebb, D.O. (1969). The Mind's Eye. Psychology Today (2) 54-57 & 67-68.
Hegarty, M. (1992). Mental Animation: Inferring Motion from Static Displays of Mechanical Systems. Journal of Experimental Psychology: Learning, Memory, and Cognition (18) 1084-1102.
Animated mental images.
Heil, J. (1982). What Does the Mind's Eye Look At? Journal of Mind and Behavior (3) 143-149.
An adverbial account of imagery, which may be considered the philosophical counterpart (at the level of language analysis) to the perceptual activity theory in cognitive science. Imagery is regarded not as the having of a mental object (an image) in the mind, rather it is a type of activity, a way of thinking about some actual or possible real-world object. See Rabb (1975), Tye (1984) for other versions of adverbial theory.
Heil, J. (1998). Philosophy of Mind. London: Routledge.
Mainly an introductory textbook, but the in the final chapter Heil argues for an imagery based account of intentionality and thought.
Hesslow, G. (2002). Conscious Thought as Simulation of Behavior and Perception. Trends in Cognitive Sciences (6) 242-247.
Suggests that imagery can be thought of as a simulation of vision. Apparently unaware of Currie's (1995; Currie & Ravenscroft, 1997) earlier suggestions to that effect, or the apparatus of simulation theory (e.g. Davies & Stone, 1995) behind them.
Heuer, F., Fischman, D., & Reisberg, D. (1986). Why Does Vivid Imagery Hurt Colour Memory? Canadian Journal of Psychology (40) 161-175.
Individual differences study using the VVIQ questionnaire of Marks (1973). A companion piece to Reisberg, Culver, Heuer, & Fischman (1986).
Hilgard, E.R. (1981). Imagery and Imagination in American Psychology, Journal of Mental Imagery (5) 5-66.
Historical reflections, with appended commentaries..
Hinton, G. (1979). Some Demonstrations of the Effects of Structural Descriptions in Mental Imagery. Cognitive Science (3) 231-250.
Argues for the view that images are "structural descriptions". A version of the "propositional" theory defended by Pylyshyn.
Hobbes, T. (1651). Leviathan. (Edited by C.B. Macpherson, Harmondsworth, U.K.: Penguin, 1968.)
Hochberg, J. (1968). In the Mind's Eye. In R.N. Haber (Ed.). Contemporary Theory and Research in Visual Perception. Holt Rinehart & Winston. New York. pp. 309-331.
Argues for a perceptual activity approach.
Holt, R.R. (1964). Imagery: The Return of the Ostracised. American Psychologist (19) 254-266.
Influential account of the history of imagery in scientific psychology.
Hong, C.C.-H., Potkin, S.G., Antrobus, J.S., Dow, B.M., Callaghan, G.M., & Gillin, J.C. (1997). REM Sleep Eye Movement Counts Correlate with Visual Imagery in Dreaming: A Pilot Study. Psychophysiology (34) 377-381.
Support for a perceptual activity account of imagery. Cf. Brandt & Stark (1997) and Laeng & Teodorescu (2002).
Horne, P.V. (1993). The Nature of Imagery. Consciousness and Cognition (2) 58-82.
With commentary.
Horowitz, M.J. (1970). Image Formation and Cognition. New York: Appelton.
Largely concerned with the clinical relevance of imagery.
Horowitz, M.J. (1983). Image Formation and Psychotherapy. New York: Aronson.
This is essentially a revised edition, somewhat more appropriately titled, of Horowitz (1970).
Hull, C.L. (1931). Goal Attraction and Directing Ideas Conceived as Habit Phenomena. Psychological Review (38) 487-506.
Hull, C.L. (1937). Mind, Mechanism and Adaptive Behavior. Psychological Review (44) 1-32.
Hume, D. (1740). A Treatise of Human Nature. (2nd Oxford edition, edited by L.A. Selby-Bigge & P.H. Nidditch. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1978.)
Hume's ubiquitous ideas are, to all intents, mental images.
Humphrey, G. (1951). Thinking. London: Methuen.
Contains what is probably still the best account in English of the views of the influential imageless thought school of German introspective psychology, including translations from primary sources.
Intons-Peterson, M.J. (1983). Imagery Paradigms: How Vulnerable are They to Experimenter's Expectations? Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance (9) 394-412.
Shows that results of some imagery experiments can be seriously distorted by even very subtle cues as to the experimenters' expectations.
Intons-Peterson, M.J. & Roskos-Ewoldsen, B.B. (1989). Sensory Perceptual Qualities of Images. Journal of Experimental Psychology: Learning, Memory, and Cognition (15) 188-199.
Ishai, A. & Sagi, D. (1995). Common Mechanisms of Visual Imagery and Perception. Science (268) 1772-1774.
Ishai, A. & Sagi, D. (1997). Visual Imagery: Effects of Short- and Long-Term Memory. Journal of Cognitive Neuroscience (9) 734-742.
Ishai, A. & Sagi, D. (1998). Visual Imagery and Visual Perception: The Role of Memory and Conscious Awareness. In S.R. Hameroff, A.W. Kaszniak & A.W. Scott (Eds.). Toward a Science of Consciousness II: The Second Tucson Discussions and Debates (pp. 321-328). Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Ishiguro, H. (1966). Imagination. In B.A.O. Williams & A. Montefiore (Eds.). British Analytical Philosophy (pp. 153-178). London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
Principally a discussion of Ryle's (1949) views. Not to be confused with Ishiguro (1967) where she presents her own original theory.
Ishiguro, H. (1967). Imagination. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume (41) 37-56.
Images as intentional objects (in the sense of Anscombe 1965). Strongly influenced by Wittgenstein and Ryle.
Jaensch, E.R. (1930). Eidetic Imagery and Typological Methods of Investigation. (Translated from the German by O.A. Oeser.) London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
A seminal study of eidetic imagery, but seriously tainted by the racist assumptions of its Nazi milieu.
James, W. (1890). The Principles of Psychology. New York: Holt. Harvard University Press edition of 1983.
Janssen, W.H. (1976a). Selective Interference in Paired-Associate and Free Recall Learning: Messing up the Image. Acta Psychologia (40) 35-48.
Janssen, W. (1976b). On the Nature of Mental Imagery. Soesterburg, Netherlands: Institute for Perception TNO.
Jay, M. (1993). Downcast Eyes: The Denigration of Vision in Twentieth-Century French Thought. Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
Jeannerod, M. (1994). The Representing Brain: Neural Correlates of Motor Intention and Imagery. Behavioral and Brain Sciences (17) 187-245. Preprint available online
Johnson, M. (1987). The Body in the Mind: The Bodily Basis of Meaning, Imagination and Reason. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
Cognitive metaphor theory and the concept of image schema. See also Lakoff & Johnson (1980, 1999).
Jones, G.V. (1986). Lexical Imagery and Semantics. In D.G. Russell, D.F. Marks & J.T.E. Richardson (Eds.) Imagery 2 (pp. 67-71). Dunedin, New Zealand: Human Performance Associates.
Argues that it is differences in the predicability rather than in the imagery value (Paivio, 1971; Paivio, Yuille & Madigan, 1968) of words that accounts for their differential memorability.
Jonides, J., Kahn, R., & Rozin, P. (1975). Imagery Instructions Improve Memory in Blind Subjects. Bulletin of the Psychonomic Society (5) 424-6.
Instructions to use imagery mnemonics (that had been assumed to work in sighted subjects by inducing them to form visual imagery) seem to just as effective in improving memory performance when they are given to congenitally blind subjects (cf. Zimler & Keenan, 1983; and see also: Marmor & Zaback, 1976; Carpenter & Eisenberg, 1978; Kerr, 1983).
Juhasz, J.B. (1969). Imagining, Imitation and Role Taking. Doctoral Thesis. University of California Berkeley.
Juhasz, J.B. (1972). An Experimental Study of Imagining. Journal of Personality (40) 588-600.
Derives support for a version of perceptual activity theory (Sarbin & Juhasz, 1970; Sarbin, 1972) from a study of individual differences.
Just, M.A., Newman, S.D., Keller, T.A., McEleney, A., & Carpenter, P.A. (2004). Imagery in sentence comprehension: an fMRI study. NeuroImage (21) 112– 124.
Kan, I.P., Barsalou, L.W., Solomon, K.O., Minor, J.K., & Thompson-Schill, S.L. (2003). Role of Mental Imagery in a Property Verification Task: fMRI Evidence for Perceptual Representations of Conceptual Knowledge. Cognitive Neuropsychology (20) 525-540.
Experimental and neuroimaging evidence that conceptual knowledge is encoded in the form of perceptual representations (Barsalou, 1999) or imagery, rather than as "amodal" mentalese representations..
Kant, I. (1781/1787). Critique of Pure Reason. (Edited and translated from the 1st and 2nd German editions by N.K. Smith, London: Macmillan, 2nd edn. 1933.)
Kaski, D. (2002). Revision: Is Visual Perception a Requisite for Visual Imagery? Perception (31) 717-731.
Review article considering whether, or to what degree, the neural structures that subserve visual imagery are the same as those that subserve visual perception.
Kaufmann, G. (1980). Imagery, Language and Cognition. Oslo, Norway: Universitetsforlaget.
Psychological study of imagery in problem solving. Suggests that the intentionality of mental imagery derives from that of natural language.
Keilkopf, C.F. (1968). The Pictures in the Head of a Man Born Blind. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (28) 501-513.
Kerr, N.H. (1983). The Role of Vision in "Visual Imagery" Experiments: Evidence from the Congenitally Blind. Journal of Experimental Psychology: General (112) 265-77.
Many "classic" experimental effects attributed to imagery can be reproduced in blind subjects.
Kessel, F.S. (1972). Imagery: A Dimension of Mind Rediscovered. British Journal of Psychology (63) 149-62.
Kieras, D. (1978). Beyond Pictures and Words: Alternative Information-processing Models for Imagery Effects in Verbal Memory. Psychological Bulletin (85) 532-554.
Argues that something like Dual Coding Theory may still be correct even though imagery may ultimately be reducible to "propositional" (mentalese) descriptions.
Kind, A. (2001). Putting the Image back in Imagination. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (62) 85-109.
Argues (against the claims of certain 20th century analytical philosophers) that there is a conceptual connection between imagery and creative imagination. Cf. Thomas (1997a).
Kintsch, W. (1977). Memory and Cognition. New York: Wiley.
Cf. Flanagan (1984).
Klatzky, R.L., Lederman, S.J., & Matula D.E. (1991).Imagined Haptic Exploration in Judgements of Object Properties. Journal of Experimental Psychology: Learning, Memory, and Cognition (17) 314-322.
A rare study of haptic imagery .
Kolers, P.A. (1987). Imaging. In R.L. Gregory & O.L. Zangwill (Eds.). The Oxford Companion to the Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Kolers, P.A. & Smythe, W.E. (1979). Images, Symbols, and Skills. Canadian Journal of Psychology (33) 158-184.
Kosman, L.A. (1975). Perceiving that we Perceive: On The Soul III.2. Philosophical Review (84) 499-519.
On Aristotle's notion of the common sense or sensus communis.
Kosslyn, S.M. (1975). Information Representation in Visual Images. Cognitive Psychology (7) 341-370.
Kosslyn, S.M. (1980). Image and Mind. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
Seminal statement and defence of the computational Quasi-Pictorial theory of imagery, which has become the dominant view in cognitive science.
Kosslyn, S.M. (1981). The Medium and the Message in Mental Imagery: A Theory. Psychological Review (88) 46-66.
Kosslyn, S.M. (1983). Ghosts in the Mind's Machine: Creating and Using Images in the Brain. New York: Norton.
A popularization of the Quasi-Pictorial theory.
Kosslyn, S.M. (1987). Seeing and Imagining in the Cerebral Hemispheres: A Computational Approach. Psychological Review (94) 148-75.
Kosslyn, S.M. (1994). Image and Brain: The Resolution of the Imagery Debate. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Updates the Quasi-Pictorial theory with an account of how imagery might be neurologically embodied.
Kosslyn, S. M., Alpert, N. M., Thompson, W. L., Maljkovic, V., Weise, S. B., Chabris, C. F., Hamilton, S. E., Rauch, S. L., & Buonanno, F. S. (1993). Visual mental imagery activates topographically organized visual cortex: PET investigations. Journal of Cognitive Neuroscience (5) 263-287.
See annotation to Kosslyn, Ganis, & Thompson (2001).
Kosslyn, S.M., Behrmann, M., & Jeannerod, M. (Eds.) (1995). The Cognitive Neuroscience of Mental Imagery. Neuropsychologia special issue (33, #11).
Kosslyn, S.M., Ganis, G., & Thompson, W.L., (2001). Neural Foundations of Imagery. Nature Reviews: Neuroscience (2) 635-642.
Claims that imagery depends on activity in the early, retinotopically mapped visual areas of the brain. For contradictory evidence see, e.g., Roland & Gulyàs (1994), Mellet et al. (1996), D'Espositoet al. (1997), Bartolomeo et al. (1997), Bartolomeo et al. (1998). For an attempted reconciliation of the contradictions see Kosslyn & Thompson (2003). Note also that Thomas (1999b) and Pylyshyn (2002a, 2002b, 2003a, 2003b) argue that even if Kosslyn is right that the retinotopically mapped areas are activated during imagery, this does not confirm his quasi-pictorial theory of imagery. Other, independently motivated, theories can accomodate this evidence.
Kosslyn, S.M. & Hatfield, G. (1984). Representation Without Symbol Systems. Social Research (51) 1019-1045.
Kosslyn, S.M., Holyoak, K.J., & Huffman, C.S. (1976). A Processing Approach to the Dual Coding Hypothesis. Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Learning and Memory (2) 223-233.
Kosslyn, S.M., Murphy, G.L., Bemesderfer, M.E. & Feinstein, K.J. (1977). Category and Continuum in Mental Comparisons. Journal of Experimental Psychology: General (106) 341-375.
Experimental support for Dual Coding Theory from the symbolic distance effect. (Cf. Paivio, 1975b, 1978a, 1978b).
Kosslyn, S.M., Pascual-Leone, A., Felician, O., Camposana, S., Keenan, J.P., Thompson, W.L., Ganis, G., Sukel, K.E.. & Alpert, N.M. (1999). The Role of Area 17 in Visual Imagery: Convergent Evidence from PET and rTMS. Science (284) 167-170.
See annotation to Kosslyn, Ganis, & Thompson (2001).
Kosslyn, S.M., Pinker, S., Smith, G.E., & Shwartz, S.P. (1979). On the Demystification of Mental Imagery. Behavioral & Brain Sciences (2) 535-581.
A defense of the Quasi-Pictorial theory of imagery, with commentaries and reply.
Kosslyn, S.M. & Pomerantz, J.R. (1977). Imagery, Propositions and the Form of Internal Representations. Cognitive Psychology (9) 52-76.
A defence of Quasi-Pictorial theory against "propositional"/descriptional alternatives.
Kosslyn, S.M. & Shwartz, S.P. (1977). A Simulation of Visual Imagery. Cognitive Science (1) 265-295.
Computer model of Quasi-Pictorial theory.
Kosslyn, S.M., Sukel, K.E., & Bly, B.M. (1999). Squinting with the Mind's Eye: Effects of Stimulus Resolution on Imaginal and Perceptual Comparisons. Memory and Cognition (19) 276-282.
Kosslyn, S.M. & Thompson, W.L. (2003). When is Early Visual Cortex Activated During Visual Imagery? Psychological Bulletin (129) 723-746.
Attempts to reconcile conflicting findings as to whether retinotopically mapped areas of visual cortex, especially V1, are activated during visual imagery. For a different perspective from neurology, see Bartolomeo (2002).
Kosslyn, S.M., Thompson, W.L., Kim, I.J., & Alpert, N.M. (1995). Topographical Representation of Mental Images in Primary Visual Cortex. Nature (378) 496-498.
See annotation to Kosslyn, Ganis, & Thompson (2001).
Kozhevnikov, M., Hegarty, M., & Mayer R.E. (2002). Revising the Visualizer-Verbalizer Dimension: Evidence for Two Types of Visualizers. Cognition and Instruction (20) 47-77.
Kreiman, G., Koch C., & Freid, G. (2000). Imagery Neurons in the Human Brain. Nature (408) 357-361.
Kunzendorf, R.G., Justice, M., & Capone, D. (1997). Conscious Images as "Centrally Excited Sensations": A Developmental Study of Imaginal Influences on the ERG. Journal of Mental Imagery (21) 155-166.
Kunzendorf, R.G. & Sheikh, A.A. (Eds.) (1990). The Psychophysiology of Mental Imagery: Theory, Research and Application. Amityville, NY: Baywood.
Laeng, B. & Teodorescu, D.-S. (2002). Eye Scanpaths During Visual Imagery Reenact those of Perception of the Same Visual Scene. Cognitive Science (26) 207-231. Reprint available online
Replicates and extends the findings of Brandt & Stark (1997), providing direct experimental support for the perceptual activity theory of imagery (Hebb, 1968; Neisser, 1976; Thomas, 1999b). Similar evidence comes from Demarais & Cohen (1998), Spivey & Geng (2001), Bensafi et al. (2003), de’Sperati (2003), and Hong et al. (1997).
Lakoff, G. & Johnson, M. (1980). Metaphors We Live By. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
Cognitive metaphor theory. See also Lakoff & Johnson (1999) and Johnson (1987).
Lakoff, G. & Johnson, M. (1999). Philosophy in the Flesh. New York: Basic Books.
Cognitive metaphor theory and image schemata. See also Lakoff & Johnson (1980) and Johnson (1987).
Lambert, S., Sampaio, E., Mauss, Y., & Scheiber, C. (2004). Blindness and Brain Plasticity: Contribution of Mental Imagery? An fMRI Study. Cognitive Brain Research (20) 1-11.
Imagery in congenitally blind subjects (presumably haptic/tactile imagery) is accompanied by activation of the primary visual area of the brain (V1). See De Volder et al. (2001) for more on the neuroscience of imagery in the congenitally blind.
Landy, M.S., Maloney, L.T., & Pavel, M. (Eds.). (1996). Exploratory Vision: the Active Eye. New York: Springer-Verlag.
Lang, P.J. (1979). A Bio-Informational Theory of Emotional Imagery. Psychophysiology (16) 495-512.
A version of the description or "propositional" theory of imagery .
Lawrie, R. (1970). The Existence of Mental Images. Philosophical Quarterly (20) 253-7.
Leahey, T.H. (1981). The Mistaken Mirror: On Wundt's and Titchener's Psychologies. Journal of the History of the Behavioral Sciences (17) 273-282.
Leahey, T.H. (1992). The Mythical Revolutions of American Psychology. American Psychologist (47) 308-318.
Levine, D. N., Warach, J., & Farah, M. (1985). Two Visual Systems in Mental Imagery: Dissociation of "What" and "Where" in Imagery Disorder Due to Bilateral Posterior Cerebral Lesions. Neurology (35) 1010-1018.
Locke, J. (1700). An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Edition of S. Pringle-Pattison (1924). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
It is not entirely clear whether Locke's term idea can always properly be equated with mental image (Lowe, 1995). However, he certainly sometimes seems to have imagery in mind, and idea was generally treated as equivalent to mental image by many of his most important successors, including Berkeley and Hume.
Lockhart, R.S. (1987). Code Dueling. Canadian Journal of Psychology (41) 387-389.
Review of Paivio (1986).
Logie, R.H. & Baddeley, A.D. (1990). Imagery and Working Memory. In P.J. Hampson, D.F. Marks & J.T.E. Richardson (Eds.) Imagery: Current
(pp. 103-128). London: Routledge.
Logie, R.H. & Denis, M. (Eds.) (1991). Mental Images in Human Cognition. Amsterdam: Elsevier Science Publishers B.V.
Long, G.M. (1980). Iconic Memory: A Review and Critique of the Study of Short-Term Visual Storage. Psychological Bulletin (88) 785-820.
The so called "iconic memory" discussed here is not mental imagery. It is both phenomenologically and functionally quite different..
Loverock, D.S. & Modigliani, V. (1995). Visual Imagery and the Brain: A Review. Journal of Mental Imagery (19) 91-132.
Lowe, E.J. (1995). Locke on Human Understanding. London: Routledge.
Includes a defense of Locke's theory that our understanding of linguistic meaning is grounded in our ideas. Locke's ideas can be (but perhaps need not be) interpreted as being mental pictures.
Lowe, E.J. (1996). Subjects of Experience. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
Contains a sophisticated philosophical defense of the Lockean view that the meanings of linguistic utterances are rooted in imagery. Cf. Ellis (1995), Thomas (1997b).
Luria, A.R. (1960). Memory and the Structure of Mental Processes. Problems of Psychology (4) 81-94.
Luria's first published account in English of his studies of the remarkable mnemonic and imagery abilities of Shereshevskii. However,the findings became well known only with the publication of Luria's (1968) book.
Luria, A.R. (1968). The Mind of a Mnemonist. (Translated from the Russian by L. Solotaroff.) New York: Basic Books.
Seminal case study of a "hyper-imager".
Luzzatti, C., Vecchi, T., Agazzi, D., Cesa-Bianchi, M., & Vergani, C. (1998). A Neurological Dissociation Between Preserved Visual and Impaired Spatial Processing in Mental Imagery. Cortex (34) 461-469. Available online
Mangan B (2001) Sensation's Ghost: The Non-Sensory "Fringe" of Consciousness. Psyche (7). (Online serial). Available online
Marks, D.F. (1972). Individual Differences in the Vividness of Visual Imagery and their Effects. In P. W. Sheehan (Ed.), The Function and Nature of Imagery (pp. 83-108). New York: Academic Press.
Marks, D.F. (1973). Visual Imagery Differences in the Recall of Pictures. British Journal of Psychology (64) 17-24.
Introduces the VVIQ questionnaire, used for measuring individual differences in imagery vividness.
Marks, D.F. (1983). Mental Imagery and Consciousness: A Theoretical Review. In A.A. Sheikh (Ed.) Imagery: Current Theory, Research, and Application. New York: Wiley.
Marks, D.F. (Ed.) (1986). Theories of Image Formation. New York: Brandon House.
Marks, D.F. (1997). Paivio, Allan Urho. In N. Sheehy, A. J. Chapman, & W.A. Conroy (Eds.), Biographical Dictionary of Psychology (pp. 432-434). New York: Routledge.
Marks, D.F. (1999). Consciousness, Mental Imagery and Action. British Journal of Psychology (90) 567-585.
Reviews work on individual differences in imagery vividness, and relates it to the psychology of action.
Marks, L.E. (1978). The Unity of the Senses. Academic Press: New York.
Marmor, G.S. & Zaback, L.A. (1976). Mental Rotation by the Blind: Does Mental Rotation Depend on Visual Imagery? Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance (2) 515-521.
Mental rotation effect (Shepard & Cooper, 1982) demonstrated in congenitally blind subjects using tactile stimuli (cf. Carpenter & Eisenberg, 1978; and see also Jonides, Kahn, & Rozin, 1975; Kerr, 1983; Zimler & Keenan, 1983).
Marschark, M. & Hunt, R.R. (1989) A Reexamination of the Role of Imagery in Learning and Memory. Journal of Experimental Psychology: Learning, Memory and Cognition (15) 710-720.
A version of Dual Coding Theory, but instead of imagery and verbal representations being stored as such in long term memory (as Paivio holds), they are here seen as constructed on the fly during recall from long term memories stored in the form of a more fundamental mentalese ("propositional") code.
Marschark, M., Richman, C.L., Yuille J.C., & Hunt R.R. (1987). The Role of Imagery in Memory: On Shared and Distinctive Information. Psychological Bulletin (102) 28-41.
A version of Dual Coding Theory, but with the codes emergent from a more fundamental mentalese ("propositional") code.
Matthews, G.B. (1969). Mental Copies. Philosophical Review (78) 53-73.
McKellar, P. (1957). Imagination and Thinking. London: Cohen & West.
McKim, R.H. (1972). Experiences in Visual Thinking. Monterey, CA: Brooks/Cole.
Aims to help readers improve their abilities as visual (image) thinkers.
McMahon, C.E. (1973). Images as Motives and Motivators: A Historical Perspective. American Journal of Psychology (86) 465-90.
Mechelli, A., Price, C.J., Friston, K.J., & Ishai, A. (2004). Where Bottom-up Meets Top-down: Neuronal Interactions during Perception and Imagery. Cerebral Cortex (14) 1256-1265.
Mel, B.W. (1986). A Connectionist Learning Model for 3- Dimensional Mental Rotation, Zoom, and Pan. In Program of the Eighth Annual Conference of the Cognitive Science Society. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
Mel, B.W. (1990). Connectionist Robot Motor Planning. San Diego, CA: Academic Press.
A connectionist account of imagery, that links it to action plans.
Mellet, E., Tzourio, N., Crivello, F., Joliot, M., Denis, M., & Mazoyer, B. (1996). Functional anatomy of spatial mental imagery generated from verbal instructions. Journal of Neuroscience (16) 6504-6512.
Suggests that imagery does not depend on activity in the early, retinotopically mapped visual areas of the brain (cf. D'Esposito et al., 1997). For an opposing view see Kosslyn, Alpert et al. (1993), Kosslyn, Thompson et al. (1995), Kosslyn, Pascual-Leone et al. (1999). See Kosslyn & Thompson (2003) for a review of this issue and an attempt to reconcile the conflicting findings.
Miller, A.I. (1984). Imagery in Scientific Thought: Creating 20th Century Physics. Boston MA: Birkhäuser.
Argues for an essential role for imagery in modern physical thought (and scientific thought in general).
Mischel, T. (1970). Wundt and the Conceptual Foundations of Psychology. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (31) 1-26.
Miyashita, Y. (1995). How the Brain Creates Imagery: Projection to Primary Visual Cortex. Science (268) 1719-1720.
Modrak, D.K.W. (1987). Aristotle: The Power of Perception. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
Moran, T.P. (1973). The Symbolic Imagery Hypothesis: A Production System Model. Ph.D. thesis. Carnegie-Mellon University, Pittsburgh, PA. (University Microfilms 74-14,657.)
Morgan, M.J. (1977). Molyneux's Question: Vision, Touch and the Philosophy of Perception. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
Morris, P.E. & Hampson, P.J. (1983). Imagery and Consciousness. Academic Press. London.
Usefully summarizes much experimental evidence. Covers quasi-pictorial, description, and perceptual activity theories, and attempts a theoretical synthesis.
Mortensen, C. (1989). Mental Images: Should Cognitive Science Learn from Neurophysiology? In P. Slezak & W.R. Albury (Eds.). Computers, Brains and Minds (pp. 123-136). Dordrecht, Netherlands: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
Mowrer, O.H. (1960a). Learning Theory and the Symbolic Processes. New York: Wiley.
An attempt to introduce imagery into Behaviorist theory.
Mowrer, O.H. (1960b). Learning Theory and Behavior. New York: Wiley.
An attempt to introduce imagery into Behaviorist theory.
Mowrer, O.H. (1977). Mental Imagery: An Indispensible Psychological Concept. Journal of Mental Imagery (2) 303-321.
Theoretical and historical reflections.
Moyer, R.S. & Dumais S.T. (1978). Mental Comparison. In G.H. Bower (Ed.). The Psychology of Learning and Motivation, Volume 12. New York: Academic Press.
Munroe, K J., Giacobbi, P.R.jr., Hall, C.R., & Weinberg, R. (2000). The Four W's of Imagery Use: Where, When, Why, and What. The Sport Psychologist (14) 119-137.
Nadaner, D. (1988). Visual Imagery, Imagination, and Education. In K. Egan & D. Nadaner (Eds.). Imagination and Education. Milton Keynes, U.K.: Open University Press.
Narayanan, N.H. (1993). Imagery: Computational and Cognitive Perspectives. Computational Intelligence (9) 303-308.
Neisser, U. (1967). Cognitive Psychology. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
The first textbook of the new Cognitive approach to psychology, which did much to set the new field's tone and direction. Its sections on imagery remain valuable.
Neisser, U. (1970). Visual Imagery as Process and as Experience. In J.S. Antrobus (Ed.). Cognition and Affect. Boston, MA: Little, Brown & Co.
Neisser, U. (1972a). Changing Conceptions of Imagery. In P.W. Sheehan (Ed.). The Function and Nature of Imagery. London: Academic Press.
Neisser, U. (1972b). A Paradigm Shift in Psychology. Science (176) 628-30.
A major player in the cognitive revolution places the revival of imagery research at its heart.
Neisser, U. (1976). Cognition and Reality. San Francisco, CA: W.H. Freeman.
Proposes one of the most fully developed versions of the Perceptual Activity Theory of imagery: an alternative to both pictorial/analog and propositional/descriptional accounts.
Neisser, U. (1978a). Anticipations, Images and Introspection. Cognition (6) 167-174.
Defends the theory of Neisser (1976) from the critique of Hampson & Morris (1978).
Neisser, U. (1978b). Perceiving, Anticipating and Imagining. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science (9) 89-106.
Summary version of the theory of Neisser (1976).
Newton, N. (1982). Experience and Imagery. The Southern Journal of Philosophy (21) 475-487.
Argues the importance of non-visual modes of imagery in human experience.
Newton, N. (1989). Visualizing is Imagining Seeing: a reply to White. Analysis (49) 77-81.
Nicholas, J.M. (Ed.) (1977). Images, Perception and Knowledge, (Western Ontario Studies in the Philosophy of Science, #8). Dordrecht/Boston: Reidel.
Noë, A. (Ed.) (2002). Is the Visual World a Grand Illusion? Journal of Consciousness Studies Special double issue (9 -v & vi).
Noë, A. (2004). Action in Perception. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Nussbaum, M.C. (1978). The Role of Phantasia in Aristotle's Explanation of Action. In her Aristotle's De Motu Animalium: Text with Translation, Commentary, and Interpretative Essays. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
Nyíri, J.C. (2001). The Picture theory of Reason. In B. Brogaard & B. Smith (Eds.), Rationality and Irrationality (Schriftenreihe-Wittgenstein Gesellschaft, Vol. 29). Vienna: Öbv&hpt. Preprint available online
A contemporary philosophical defence of imagery theories of thought and meaning, and a retrospect on their 20th century eclipse.
O'Donnell, J.M. (1985). The Origins of Behaviorism: American Psychology, 1870-1920. New York: New York University Press.
O'Craven, K.M. & Kanwisher, N. (2000). Mental Imagery of Faces and Places Activates Corresponding Stimulus Specific Brain Regions. Journal of Cognitive Neuroscience (12) 1013-1023.
Orne, M.T. (1962). On The Social Psychology of the Psychological Experiment: With Particular Reference to Demand Characteristics and their Implications. American Psychologist (17) 776-783.
O'Regan, J.K. (1992). Solving the "Real" Mysteries of Visual Perception: The World as an Outside Memory. Canadian Journal of Psychology (46) 461-488. Preprint available online
O'Regan, J. K., & Noë, A. (2001). A Sensorimotor Account of Vision and Visual Consciousness. Behavoral and Brain Sciences (24) 939-973. Reprint available online
Oster, G. (1970, February). Phosphenes. Scientific American (222-ii) 82-87.
Phosphenes should not be confused with mental images.
Osgood, C.E. (1952). The Nature and Measurement of Meaning. Psychological Bulletin (49) 197-237.
Osgood, C.E. (1953). Method and Theory in Experimental Psychology. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Oyama, T. & Ichikawa, S. (1990). Some Experimental Studies on Imagery in Japan. Journal of Mental Imagery (14) 185-196.
Paivio, A. (1963). Learning of Adjective-Noun Paired Associates as a Function of Adjective-Noun Word Order and Noun Abstractness. Canadian Journal of Psychology (17) 370-379.
Paivio, A. (1965). Abstractness, Imagery and Meaningfulness in Paired Associate Learning. Journal of Verbal Learning and Verbal Behavior (4) 32-38.
Paivio, A. (1971). Imagery and Verbal Processes. New York: Holt, Rinehart and Winston. Republished in 1979 — Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum
Classic statement of the Dual Coding (imaginal and linguistic) theory of memory and mental representation, with much empirical evidence on the mnemonic effects of imagery. Paivio's work (together with Shepard's mental rotation experiments) probably played the key role in making imagery a scientifically respectable topic of investigation in cognitive science.
Paivio, A. (1975a). Imagery and Synchronic Thinking. Canadian Psychological Review (16) 147-163.
Paivio, A. (1975b) Perceptual Comparisons Through the Mind's Eye. Memory and Cognition (3) 635-647.
Experimental support for Dual Coding Theory from the symbolic distance effect. (Cf. Paivio, 1978a, 1978b).
Paivio, A. (1977). Images, Propositions and Knowledge. In J.M. Nicholas (Ed.). Images, Perception and Knowledge. Dordrecht/Boston, MA: Reidel.
Paivio, A. (1978a). Comparisons of Mental Clocks. Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance (4) 61-71.
Experimental support for Dual Coding Theory from the symbolic distance effect. (Cf. Paivio, 1975b. 1978b).
Paivio, (1978b), Mental Comparisons Involving Abstract Attributes. Memory and Cognition (6) 199-208.
Experimental support for Dual Coding Theory from the symbolic distance effect. (Cf. Paivio, 1975b. 1978a).
Paivio, A. (1979). Psychological processes in the Comprehension of Metaphor. In A. Ortony (Ed.), Metaphor and Thought (pp. 150-171). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
Paivio, A. (1983a). The Empirical Case for Dual Coding. In J.C. Yuille (Ed.), Imagery, Memory and Cognition: Essays in Honour of Allan Paivio. Hillsdale NJ: Erlbaum.
Paivio, A. (1983b). The Mind's Eye in Arts and Science. Poetics (12) 1-18.
Paivio, A. (1986). Mental Representations: A Dual Coding Approach. New York: Oxford University Press.
A major restatement and defense of Dual Coding Theory.
Paivio, A. (1991). Dual Coding Theory: Retrospect and Current Status. Canadian Journal of Psychology (45) 255-287.
Paivio, A. (1995). Imagery and Memory. In M.S. Gazzaniga (Ed.) The Cognitive Neurosciences. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. (pp. 977-986.)
For an even more recent restatement and defense of Dual Coding Theory, see Sadoski & Paivio (2001).
Paivio, A. & Begg I. (1981). Psychology of Language. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
Paivio, A. & Desrochers, A. (1980). A Dual Coding Approach to Bilingual Memory. Canadian Journal of Psychology (34) 390-401.
Paivio, A. & Harshman, R. (1983). Factor Analysis of a Questionnaire on Imagery and Verbal Habits and Skills. Canadian Journal of Psychology (37) 461-483.
Paivio, A., Yuille, J.C., & Madigan, S. (1968). Concreteness, Imagery and Meaningfulness Values for 925 Nouns. Journal of Experimental Psychology Monographs (78 — #1, part 2).
Palmer, S.E. (1978). Fundamental Aspects of Cognitive Representation. In E. Rosch & B.B. Lloyd (Eds.), Cognition and Categorization. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
Argues that the analog/propositional debate over imagery misses the point about the nature of representation in computational theories of mind.
Pear, T.H. (1924). Imagery and Mentality. British Journal of Psychology (14) 291-299.
Pear, T.H. (1927). The Relevance of Visual Imagery to the Process of Thinking 1. British Journal of Psychology (18) 1-14.
A companion piece to Bartlett (1927) and Aveling (1927).
Pelizzon, L., Brandimonte, M.A., & Favretto, A. (1999). Imagery and Recognition: Dissociable Measures of Memory? European Journal of Cognitive Psychology (11) 429-443.
Penfield, W. (1958). Some Mechanisms of Consciousness Discovered During Electrical Stimulation of the Brain. Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences (44) 51-66.
Perky, C.W. (1910) An Experimental Study of Imagination. American Journal of Psychology (21) 422-52.
A famous study showing that mental images could be confused with (faint) percepts under certain conditions. See Segal (1971, 1972) for a modern attempt at replication.
Peterson, M.A., Kihlstrom, J.F., Rose, P.M., & Glisky, M.L. (1992). Mental Images Can be Ambiguous: Reconstruals and Reference Frame Reversals. Memory and Cognition (20), 107-123.
See the comment on Chambers & Reisberg (1985).
Petre, M. & Blackwell, A.F. (1999). Mental Imagery in Program Design and Visual Programming. International Journal of Human-Computer Studies (51) 7-30.
A study of the (apparently quite significant) role played by imagery in the thought processes of computer programming.
Piaget, J. & Inhelder, B. (1971). Mental Imagery in the Child. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul. (Originally published in French as L'Image Mentale chez L'Enfant. Presses Universitaires de France, 1966.)
Pinker, S. (1980). Mental Imagery and the Third Dimension. Journal of Experimental Psychology: General (109) 354-71.
Pinker, S. (1988). A Computational Theory of the Mental Imagery Medium. In M. Denis, J. Engelkamp, & J.T.E. Richardson (Eds.). Cognitive and Neuropsychological Approaches to Mental Imagery. Dordrecht, Netherlands: Martinus Nijhoff.
A three-dimensional version of the picture (or array) theory.
Place, U.T. (1956). Is Consciousness a Brain Process? British Journal of Psychology (47) 44-50.
Imagery is one of Place's key examples of conscious experiences that, he argues, are best understood as contingently identical to brain processes. Despite this article's fame, and its seminal status in 20th century philosophy of mind, Place's specific views on mental imagery have received little attention. He always insisted, both here and in later work, that imagery (like other conscious experiences) was to be identified with brain processes rather than brain states.
Popper, K.R. (1976). Unended Quest: An Intellectual Autobiography. London: Fontana/Collins.
Prather, S.C. & Sathian, K. (2002). Mental Rotation of Tactile Stimuli. Cognitive Brain Research (14) 91-98.
Predebon, J. & Wenderoth, P. (1985). Imagined Stimuli: Imaginary Effects? Bulletin of the Psychonomic Society (23) 215-216.
Price, H.H. (1953). Thinking and Experience. London: Hutchinson.
Contains a defense of an imagery based account of thinking and meaning.
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (1973). What the Mind's Eye Tells the Mind's Brain: A Critique of Mental Imagery. Psychological Bulletin (80) 1-25.
A seminal attack on pictorial accounts of imagery. This was the opening salvo of the infamous analog/propositional dispute.
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (1978). Imagery and Artificial Intelligence. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science (9) 19-55.
Pylyshyn argues that images are best conceived of as propositional descriptions within a general computational account of mental representation.
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (1981). The Imagery Debate: Analogue Media Versus Tacit Knowledge. Psychological Review (88) 16-45.
A restatement of the propositional/descriptional account of imagery that squarely confronts the empirical arguments brought by pictorialists.
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (1984). Computation and Cognition: Toward a Foundation for Cognitive Science. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (1999). Is Vision Continuous with Cognition? The Case for Cognitive Impenetrability of Visual Perception. Behavioral and Brain Sciences (22) 341-423. Reprint available online
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (2002 a). Mental Imagery: In search of a theory. Behavioral and Brain Sciences (25) 157-182 (-237 including commentaries and reply). Reprint available online
A major restatement and updating of Pylyshyn's conceptual and empirical objections to pictorial theories of imagery, including a critique of recent claims (e.g. Kosslyn, 1994; Kosslyn, Pascual-Leone et al., 1999) that neuroscientific evidence suports pictorialism.
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (2002 b). Stalking the elusive mental image screen (reply to commentaries). Behavioral and Brain Sciences. (25) 216-237. Reprint available online
The reply to the invited commentaries on Pylyshyn (in press a). Expands usefully on what Pylyshyn sees as wrong with the neuroscience based arguments for pictorialism.
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (2003 a). Return of the Mental Image: Are There Pictures in the Brain? Trends in Cognitive Sciences (7) 113-118. Reprint available online
Essentially a précis of Pylyshyn (2002 a & b), but with some additional examples.
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (2003 b). Seeing and Visualizing : It's Not What You Think. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. Preprint available online
Pylyshyn, Z.W. (2005). Mental Imagery. In R.L. Gregory (ed.), The Oxford Companion to the Mind (2nd ed.) Oxford: Oxford University Press. Preprint available online
Succinctly restates Pylyshyn's major criticisms of pictorial theories of imagery.
Rabb, J.D. (1975). Imaging: An Adverbial Analysis. Dialogue (14) 312-318.
An adverbial theory of imagery. Cf. Heil (1982), Tye (1984).
Reisberg, D. (Ed.) (1992). Auditory Imagery. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
Reisberg, D. (1994). Equipotential Recipes for Unambiguous Images: A Reply to Rollins. Philosophical Psychology (7) 359-366.
See Rollins (1994) and the annotation to Chambers & Reisberg (1985).
Reisberg, D. & Chambers, D. (1991). Neither Pictures Nor Propositions: What Can We Learn From a Mental Image? Canadian Journal of Psychology (45) 336-352.
See annotation to Chambers & Reisberg (1985).
Reisberg, D., Culver, L.C., Heuer, F., & Fischman, D. (1986). Visual Memory: When Imagery Vividness Makes a Difference. Journal of Mental Imagery (10) 51-74.
Individual differences study using the VVIQ questionnaire of Marks (1973). Vivid imagers show worse color memory than less vivid imagers. A companion piece to Heuer, Fischman, & Reisberg (1986).
Reisberg, D., Pearson, D.G., & Kosslyn, S.M. (2003). Intuitions And Introspections About Imagery: The Role Of Imagery Experience In Shaping An Investigator's Theoretical Views. Applied Cognitive Psychology (17) 147 - 160
People's initial theoretical intuitions about the nature of imagery correlate with how vivid they take their own imagery to be. (Vividness assessed by the VVIQ questionnaire (Marks, 1973)).
Reisberg, D., Smith, J.D., Baxter, D.A., & Sonenshine, M. (1989). "Enacted" Auditory Images are Ambiguous; "Pure" Auditory Images are Not. Quarterly Journal of Experimental Psychology (41A) 619-641.
An auditory analogue of the effect discovered by Chambers & Reisberg (1985).
Reisberg, D., Wilson, M., & Smith, J.D. (1991). Auditory Imagery and Inner Speech. In R.H. Logie & M. Denis (Eds.). Mental Images in Human Cognition. Amsterdam: Elsevier Science Publishers B.V. (pp. 59-81).
Rey, G. (1981). Introduction: What are Mental Images? In N. Block (Ed.) Readings in the Philosophy of Psychology, Vol. 2. London: Methuen.
Rhem, L.P. (1973). Relationships Among Measures of Visual Imagery. Behavior Research and Therapy (11) 265-270.
Rhodes, G. & O'Leary, A. (1985) Imagery Effects on Early Visual Processing. Perception and Psychophysics (37) 382-388.
Ribot, T. (1890). Psychologie de L'Attention. Paris: Alcan. Translated as: The Psychology of Attention. Chicago: Open Court, 1903
Sketches a theory of in terms of the control of attention.
Ribot, T. (1900). Essai sur L'Imagination Créatrice. Paris: Alcan. Translated as: Essay on the Creative Imagination. Chicago: Open Court, 1906.
Includes an attentional theory of imagery, broadly akin to the motor theories of Dunlap (1914) and Washburn (1916).
Richards, N. (1977). Depicting and Visualising. Mind (82) 218-229.
Richardson, A. (1969). Mental Imagery. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
Despite its age, this remains a useful literature review, especially because it covers not only mental imagery in the narrower sense in which the term is usually used today (what Richardson calls "memory imagery"), but also other more or less distantly related quasi-perceptual phenomena such as eidetic imagery, hypnagogic imagery, hallucinations, and after-images.
Richardson, J.T.E. (1975). Concreteness and Imagability. Quarterly Journal of Experimental Psychology (27) 235-249.
Richardson, J.T.E. (1980). Mental Imagery and Human Memory. London: Macmillan.
Although the book is mainly concerned with empirical issues, chapter two is a Wittgenstein influenced philosophical discussion of the concept of imagery.
Richardson, J.T.E. (1999). Mental Imagery. Psychology Press: Hove, U.K.
Useful textbook surveying the cognitive psychology of imagery, including individual differences research.
Riedlinger, T. J. (1982). Sartre's Rite of Passage. Journal of Transpersonal Psychology (14) 105-123.
Robson, J. (1986). Coleridge's Images of Fantasy and Imagination. In D.G. Russell, D.F. Marks, & J.T.E. Richardson (Eds.) Imagery 2 (pp.190-194). Dunedin, New Zealand: Human Performance Associates.
Mental imagery in Romantic psychological theory.
Rode, G., Rossetti, Y., Perenin, M.-T., & Boisson, D. (2004). Geographic Information Has to Be Spatialised to Be Neglected: A Representational Neglect Case. Cortex (40) 391-397. Available online
Further evidence regarding the neurological syndrome of representational neglect in which sufferers fail to report features to one side (usually the left) of an imagined scene (Bisiach & Luzzatti, 1978; Bartolomeo, D'Erme, & Gainotti, 1994). The findings appear to favor both a Perceptual Activity theory of imagery (Thomas, 1999b; see Bartolomeo, 2002; Bartolomeo & Chokron, 2002) and the Dual Coding theory of the function of imagery in memory (Paivio, 1971, 1986; Sadoski & Paivio, 2001).
Roe, A. (1951). A Study of Imagery in Research Scientists. Journal of Personality (19) 459-70.
Finds social scientists, in particular, tend to report weak or absent imagery.
Roland, P.E. & Gulyàs B. (1994). Visual Imagery and Visual Representation. Trends in Neuroscience (17) 281-286.
Suggests that imagery does not depend on activity in the early, retinotopically mapped visual areas of the brain (cf. D'Esposito et al., 1996). For an opposing view see Kosslyn, Alpert et al. (1993), Kosslyn, Thompson et al. (1995), Kosslyn, Pascual-Leone et al. (1999). See Kosslyn & Thompson (2003) for a review of this issue and an attempt to reconcile the conflicting findings.
Rollins, M. (1989). Mental Imagery: On the Limits of Cognitive Science. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
Considers the possibility of "pictorial attitudes" (analogous to propositional attitudes).
Rollins, M. (1994). Re: Reinterpreting Images. Philosophical Psychology (7) 345-358.
See Reisberg (1994) and the annotation to Chambers & Reisberg (1985).
Roskos-Ewoldsen, B., Intons-Peterson, M.J., & Anderson, R.E. (Eds.) (1993). Imagery, Creativity and Discovery: a Cognitive Perspective. Amsterdam: Elsevier.
Ross, J. & Lawrence, K.A. (1968). Some Observations on Memory Artifice. Psychonomic Science (13) 107-108.
An experimental validation of the effectiveness of the classical method of loci mnemonic (see Yates, 1966).
Rossman, M.L. (2000). Guided Imagery for Self-Healing: An Essential Resource for Anyone Seeking Wellness. Tiburon, CA: HJ Kramer.
Roy, D., Hsiao, K.-Y., & Mavridis N. (2004). Mental Imagery for a Conversational Robot. IEEE Transactions on Systems, Man, and Cybernetics - part B: Cybernetics (34) 1374-1383. Preprint available online
Russell, B. (1919). On Propositions: What They are and How they Mean. Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume (2) 1-43. Reprinted in K. Blackwell (Ed.) (1983). The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, Volume 8: the Philosophy of Logical Atomism and Other Essays, 1914-19, (pp. 276-306). London: Allen & Unwin.
An imagery based theory of linguistic meaning.
Russell, B. (1921). The Analysis of Mind. London: Allen & Unwin.
Re-presents Russell's (1919) imagery based theory of linguistic meaning in the context of a general theory of mind.
Russell, D.G., Marks, D.F., & Richardson, J.T.E. (Eds.) Imagery 2. Dunedin, New Zealand: Human Performance Associates.
Proceedings of the Second International Imagery Conference (Swansea, Wales, 1985).
Russow, L.-M. (1978). Some Recent Work on Imagination. American Philosophical Quarterly (15) 57-66.
Russow, L.-M. (1980). Towards a Theory of Imagination. Southern Journal of Philosophy (28) 353-369.
Ryle, G. (1949). The Concept of Mind. London: Hutchinson.
Chapter 8 contains a seminal critique of pictorial accounts of imagery and questions the traditional concept of imagination as the image producing faculty. It is suggested that both imagination and imagery are conceptually related to pretending.
Ryle, G. (1971). Phenomenology versus The Concept of Mind. In his Collected Papers, Volume 1: Critical Essays. London: Hutchinson.
Some qualifications of the view expressed in Ryle (1949).
Ryle, G. (1979). On Thinking. Oxford: Blackwell.
Chapter 3 deals with "Thought and Imagination".
Saariluoma, P. & Kalakoski, V. (1998). Apperception and Imagery in Blindfold Chess. Memory (6) 67-90.
Sadoski, M. & Paivio, A. (2001). Imagery and Text: A Dual Coding Theory of Reading and Writing. Mahwah, NJ: Erlbaum.
For earlier work on Dual Coding Theory, see above for many other citations to Paivio's work.
Samuels, M. & Samuels, N. (1975). Seeing with the Mind's Eye: The History, Techniques and Uses of Visualization. New York/Berkeley, CA: Random House/The Bookworks.
Not a scholarly work.
Sarbin, T.R. (1972). Imagination as Muted Role Taking. In P.W. Sheehan (Ed.). The Function and Nature of Imagery, (pp. 333-354). Academic Press. New York.
A version of perceptual activity imagery theory, strongly influenced by Ryle (1949).
Sarbin, T.R. & Juhasz, J.B. (1970). Toward a Theory of Imagination. Journal of Personality (38) 52-76.
A version of perceptual activity imagery theory (see Thomas, 1999b).
Sartre, J.-P. (1936). Imagination: A Psychological Critique. (Translated from the French by F. Williams, Ann Arbor, MI: University of Michigan Press, 1962.)
An insightful critical account of early 20th century European views of imagery and imagination.
Sartre, J.-P. (1940). The Psychology of Imagination. (Translated from the French by B. Frechtman, New York: Philosophical Library, 1948.)
Presents Sartre's own positive theory of imagery and imagination. Argues for the intentionality of imagery, and holds that mental images are not inner objects.
Scarry, E. (1999). Dreaming by the Book. Princeton NJ: Princeton University Press.
A literary critic on the power of language to evoke mental imagery, and the importance of such imagery in the proper appreciation of literature. Cf. Esrock (1994).
Scheerer, E. (1984). Motor Theories of Cognitive Structure: A Historical Review. In W.Prinz & A.F. Sanders (Eds.), Cognition and Motor Processes. Berlin/Heidelberg: Springer-Verlag. (pp. 77-98).
Includes a brief description of Washburn's (1916) motor theory of imagery.
Schlick M. (1918). General Theory of Knowledge. (Translation from the 2nd German edition (1925) by A.E. Blumberg, Vienna/New York: Springer-Verlag, 1974.)
Argues, on grounds derived from Berkeley, that concepts cannot be rooted in imagery, and that science cannot rely on "knowing by means of images". Schlick went on to become the leader of the Logical Positivist Vienna Circle.
Schwitzgebel, E. (2002). How Well do we Know our Own Conscious Experience? The Case of Visual Imagery. Journal of Consciousness Studies (9, v-vi) 35-53. Reprint available online
Argues that we we do not have a very good grasp of what our imagery experience is subjectively like.
Schwitzgebel, E. (2004). Introspective training: Reflections on Titchener's lab manual. Journal of Consciousness Studies (11, vii-viii) 58-76. Reprint available online
Segal, S.J. (Ed.) (1971a). Imagery: Current Cognitive Approaches. New York: Academic Press.
Segal, S.J. (1971b). Processing of the Stimulus in Imagery and Perception. In S.J. Segal (Ed.) Imagery: Current Cognitive Approaches, (pp. 73-100). New York: Academic Press.
On attempting to replicate the Perky (1910) experiment.
Segal, S.J. (1972). Assimilation of a Stimulus in the Construction of an Image: The Perky Effect Revisited. In P.W. Sheehan (Ed.), The Function and Nature of Imagery, (pp. 203-230). New York & London: Academic Press.
Segal, S.J. & Fusella, V. (1971). Effects of Images in Six Sense Modalities on Detection (d’) of Visual Signal from Noise. Psychonomic Science (24) 55-56.
Segal, S.J. & Nathan, S. (1964). The Perky Effect: Incorporation of an External Stimulus into Imagery Experience under Placebo and Control Conditions. Perceptual and Motor Skills (18) 385-395.
Sergent, J. (1990). The Neuropsychology of Visual Image Generation: Data, Method, and Theory. Brain and Cognition (13) 98-129.
Challenges the conclusions of Farah (1984).
Sheehan, P.W. (Ed.) (1972). The Function and Nature of Imagery. Academic Press. New York & London.
Valuable anthology of the state of the art at the time.
Sheehan, P.W. (1978). Mental Imagery. In B.M. Foss (Ed.) Psychology Survey. No.1. London: Allen & Unwin.
Good review article, but now very dated.
Sheffield, F.D. (1961). Theoretical Considerations in the Learning of Complex Sequential Tasks from Demonstration and Practice. In A.A. Lumsdaine (Ed.) Student Response in Programmed Instruction (NAS-NRS Publication No. 943). Washington, DC: National Academy of Sciences—National Research Council.
Imagery introduced into an essentially Behaviorist theory.
Sheikh, A.A. (Ed.) (1983). Imagery: Current Theory, Research, and Application. New York: Wiley.
Useful, wide ranging collection.
Shepard, R.N. (1975). Form, Formation, and Transformation of Internal Representations. In R.L. Solso (Ed.) Information Processing and Cognition: the Loyola Symposium. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
Defends an analog account of imagery. Introduces the concept of "second order isomorphism".
Shepard, R.N. (1978a). Externalization of Mental Images and the Act of Creation. In B.S. Randhawa & B.F. Coffman (Eds.). Visual Learning, Thinking and Communication. London: Academic Press.
Shepard, R.N. (1978b). The Mental Image. American Psychologist (33) 125-137.
Shepard, R.N. (1981). Psychophysical Complementarity. In M. Kubovy & J.R. Pomerantz (Eds.) Perceptual Organization. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
Shepard, R.N. (1984). Ecological Restraints on Internal Representation. Psychological Review (91) 417-447.
Shepard, R.N., Cooper, L.A., et al. (1982). Mental Images and Their Transformations. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
A useful compendium of the seminal work by Shepard and his students on the mental rotation of images (and related phenomena).
Shepard, R.N. & Metzler, J. (1971). Mental Rotation of Three-Dimensional Objects. Science (171) 701-703.
A classic psychological experiment. The first, most striking, and best known of the mental rotation studies. Together with the work on the mnemonic effects of imagery (see Paivio, 1971) this played a major role in re-establishing the scientific respectability of imagery research.
Shepard, R.N. & Podgorny, P. (1978). Cognitive Processes That Resemble Perceptual Processes. In W.K. Estes (Ed.) Handbook of Learning and Cognitive Processes. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
Shields, C. (2000). Subordinate Psychic Faculties of Imagination and Desire, Supplementary Document to Aristotle's Psychology", in Edward N. Zalta (Ed.) The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Summer 2002 Edition. URL =
Shorter, J.M. (1952). Imagination. Mind (61) 528-542.
Perhaps the earliest suggestion that imagining is more like describing than like seeing a picture (C.f. Dennett, 1969).
Simon, H.A. (1972). What is Visual Imagery? An Information Processing Interpretation. In L.W. Gregg (Ed.). Cognition in Learning and Memory. New York: Wiley.
Early sketch of a computational model of imagery.
Skinner, B.F. (1953). Science and Human Behavior. New York: The Free Press.
Imagery as "conditioned seeing" or "operant seeing".
Skinner, B.F. (1974). About Behaviorism. New York: Knopf.
Imagery is not an inner representation but a covert behavior.
Skinner, B.F. (1980). Notebooks. (Ed. & Introduction by R. Epstein). Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
Slezak, P. (1991). Can Images be Rotated and Inspected? A Test of the Pictorial Medium Theory. In Proceedings, Thirteenth Annual Conference of the Cognitive Science Society (pp. 55-60). Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum. Reprint available online
See note at Chambers & Reisberg (1985).
Slezak, P. (1992). When Can Visual Images Be Re-Interpreted? Non-Chronometric Tests of Pictorialism. In Proceedings, Fourteenth Annual Conference of the Cognitive Science Society (pp. 124-129). Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum. Reprint available online
See note at Chambers & Reisberg (1985).
Slezak, P. (1995). The "Philosophical" Case Against Visual Imagery. In P. Slezak, T. Caelli, & R. Clark (Eds.) Perspectives on Cognitive Science: Theories, Experiments and Foundations. Norwood, NJ: Ablex.
A recent attempt to press the cognitivist case against pictorialism by a psychologically sophisticated philosopher.
Slingerland, E. (2003). Effortless Action: Wu-wei as Conceptual Metaphor and Spiritual Ideal in Early China. New York: Oxford University Press.
Applies the cognitive metaphor and image schema theory of Lakoff & Johnson (1980, 1999; Johnson, 1987) to the analysis of classical Chinese thought.
Snoeyenbos, M. & Sibley, E. (1978). Sartre on Imagination. Southern Journal of Philosophy (16) 373-388.
Sober, E. (1976). Mental Representations. Synthése (33) 101-148.
Largely a discussion of the possibilities of mental representation via imagery.
Sommer, R. (1978). The Mind's Eye. New York: Delacorte Press.
Includes an interesting case study of a "non-imager" .
Sparing, R., Mottaghy, F.M., Ganis, G., Thompson, W.L., Töpper, R., Kosslyn, S.M., & Pascual-Leone, A. (2002). Visual Cortex Excitability Increases During Visual Imagery - A TMS Study in Healthy Human Subjects. Brain Research (938) 92–97.
Spivey, M.J. & Geng J.J. (2001). Oculomotor Mechanisms Activated by Imagery and Memory: Eye Movements to Absent Objects. Psychological Research (65) 235-241.
Eye movements during imagery re-enact those that would be expected during perception of a similar scene. This lends support to the perceptual activity theory of imagery (Hebb, 1968; Hochberg, 1968; Sarbin & Juhasz, 1970; Neisser, 1976; Thomas, 1999b). For further evidence for re-enactive perceptual behavior during imagery see: Brandt & Stark (1997), Demarais & Cohen (1998), Laeng & Teodorescu (2002), Bensafi et al. (2003), de’Sperati (2003), and Hong et al. (1997).
Squires, J.E.R. (1968). Visualising. Mind (77) 58-67.
Sterelny, K. (1986). The Imagery Debate. Philosophy of Science (53) 560-583.
A philosopher's take on the analog/propositional debate.
Stoffregen, T.A. & Bardy B.G. (2001). On Specification and the Senses. Behavioral and Brain Sciences (24) 195-261. Preprint available online
Strawson, P.F. (1971). Imagination and Perception. In L. Foster & J.L. Swanson (Eds.), Experience and Theory (pp. 31-54). London: Duckworth.
Kant's theory of the imagination.
Stromeyer, C.F. & Psotka, J. (1970). The Detailed Texture of Eidetic Imagery. Nature (225) 346-349.
This well known and spectacular demonstration of the abilities of an eidetic imager has proven impossible to replicate.
Taylor, J.G. (1973). A Behavioural Theory of Images. South African Journal of Psychology (3) 1-10.
A rare attempt to assimilate imagery into Behaviorist theory, but see also Skinner (1953, 1974).
Taylor, P. (1981). Imagination and Information. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (42) 205-223.
Despite arguments to the contrary from Sartre and Wittgenstein, we can gain new information from our mental imagery.
Teng, N.Y. (1998). The Depictive Nature of Visual Mental Imagery. Presented at the 20th World Congress of Philosophy, August 6-10 1998, Boston, MA. Available online
Thomas, N.J.T. (1987). The Psychology of Perception, Imagination and Mental Representation, and Twentieth Century Philosophies of Science. Ph.D. thesis, Leeds University, Leeds, U.K. (A.S.L.I.B. Index to Theses 37-iii No. 37-4561).
Thomas, N.J.T. (1989). Experience and Theory as Determinants of Attitudes toward Mental Representation: The Case of Knight Dunlap and the Vanishing Images of J.B. Watson. American Journal of Psychology (102) 395-412. Preprint available online
Discusses the historical circumstances surrounding the "banishment" of imagery from psychological theory in the Behaviorist tradition, and considers certain conceptual confusions that may induce some people to discount the psychological significance of imagery. Dunlap's (1914) theory is outlined.
Thomas, N.J.T. (1997a). Imagery and the Coherence of Imagination: a Critique of White. Journal of Philosophical Research, (22) 95-127. Preprint available online
Defends the traditional (Aristotelian) view of the concept of imagination as derivative from the concept of imagery, and argues that the root concept of both is perceiving as. Traces resistance to the Aristotelian view to unsupported pictorialist assumptions. For an alternative (but not incompatible) defense of the conceptual connection between imagination and imagery see Kind (2001).
Thomas, N.J.T. (1997b). A Stimulus to the Imagination. Psyche (3) (Online serial). Available online
An essay review of Ellis (1995), which reviews some standard objections to the sort of imagery based semantics he proposes, and sets this idea of an imagery theory of meaning in its historical context.
Thomas, N.J.T. (1999a). Imagination. In Dictionary of Philosophy of Mind, Chris Eliasmith (Ed.). Available online
Provides a brief sketch of the history of the concept, from Aristotle to the present.
Thomas, N.J.T. (1999b). Are Theories of Imagery Theories of Imagination? An Active Perception Approach to Conscious Mental Content. Cognitive Science (23) 207-245. Preprint available online
Assesses cognitive theories of imagery both in empirical terms and in the light of their relationship to theories of imagination and its rolein creative thought. Proposes and defends Perceptual Activity Theory as an alternative that is empirically and conceptually superior to both quasi-pictorial and propositional theories.
Tippett, L.J. (1992). The Generation of Visual Images: A Review of Neuropsychological Research and Theory. Psychological Bulletin (112) 415-432.
Titchener, E.B. (1901-5). Experimental psychology: A manual of laboratory practice (4 volumes). New York: Macmillan.
Titchener, E.B. (1909). Lectures on the Experimental Psychology of the Thought-Processes. New York: Macmillan.
A radical defense of an image centered introspective psychology against the claims of the Wurzburg imageless thought school of introspectors.
Trehub, A. (1977). Neuronal Models for Cognitive Processes: Networks for Learning, Perception and Imagination. Journal of Theoretical Biology (65) 141-169.
A neuroscientific account of imagery, that identifies it with activity in the retinotopic maps of the visual areas of the brain. Trehub (1991) provides a revised and more detailed version of the theory, which seems broadly consistent with the quasi-pictorial theory of Kosslyn (1980, 1994).
Trehub, A. (1991). The Cognitive Brain. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Ambitious and detailed neuroscientific theory, that, consistently with Kosslyn (1994), regards imagery as activity in the retinotopic maps of the brain's visual cortex.
Tolman, E.C. (1948). Cognitive Maps in Rats and Men. Psychological Review (55) 189-208. Reprint available online
Toulmin, S. (1969). Ludwig Wittgenstein. Encounter (32) 58-71.
Tweedale, M.M. (1990). Mental Representations in Later Medieval Scholasticism. In J.-C. Smith (Ed.). Historical Foundations of Cognitive Science. Dordrecht, Netherlands: Kluwer.
Tweney, R.D. (1987). Programmatic Research in Experimental Psychology: E.B. Titchener's Laboratory Investigations, 1891-1927. In M.G. Ash & W.R. Woodward (Eds.), Psychology in Twentieth Century Thought and Society (pp.34-57). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
Tweney, R.D., Doherty, M.E., & Mynatt, C.R. (Eds.) (1981). On Scientific Thinking. New York: Columbia University Press.
Contains anecdotal but very suggestive extracts concerning the key role that imagery can play in the thought processes of scientists.
Tye, M. (1984). The Debate About Mental Imagery. Journal of Philosophy (81) 678-691.
An adverbial account of imagery that is abandoned in Tye's later writings on the subject. Cf. Rabb (1975) and Heil (1982) for other defenses of the adverbial theory.
Tye, M. (1988). The Picture Theory of Mental Images. Philosophical Review (97) 497-520.
A persuasive defense of quasi-pictorial theory against descriptionist criticisms.
Tye, M. (1991). The Imagery Debate. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
This fills out the argument of Tye (1988) and gives an admirably clear philosophical account of the analog/propositional debate and the conceptual basis of (quasi-)pictorialism. However, it fails to look seriously beyond this context, and is rather unreliable on historical and empirical issues.
Vanlierde, A. & Wanet-Defalque, M.C. (2004). Abilities and Strategies of Blind and Sighted Subjects in Visuo-Spatial Imagery. Acta Psychologica (116) 205–222.
Vecchi, T. (1998). Visuo-Spatial Imagery in Congenitally Totally Blind People. Memory (6) 91–102.
von Eckardt, B. (1984). Mental Images and their Explanations. Journal of Philosophy (81) 691-693.
A rejoinder to Tye (1984) — and one he seems to have taken to heart (see Tye, 1988, 1991).
von, Eckardt, B. (1988). Mental Images and Their Explanations. Philosophical Studies (53) 441-460.
A further critique of Tye's (1984) adverbial theory, and defense of pictorialism.
von Eckardt, B. (1993). What is Cognitive Science? Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
Presents Kosslyn's research on imagery, and his quasi-pictorial theory (Kosslyn, 1980), as a paradigmatic example of Cognitive Science.
von Hornbostel, E.M. (1927). The Unity of the Senses. Psyche (7) 83-89.
Walk, R.D. & Pick, H.L. (Eds.) (1981). Intersensory Perception and Sensory Integration. New York: Plenum Press.
Warnock, M. (1976). Imagination. London: Faber & Faber.
Imagery and imagination in Hume and Kant, in Romantic theory, and in Sartre and Wittgenstein.
Washburn, M.F. (1916). Movement and Mental Imagery. Boston, MA: Houghton Mifflin.
A motor theory of imagery. See Dunlap (1914) for another version.
Washburn, M.F. (1932). Some Recollections. In C. Murchison (Ed.), A History of Psychology in Autobiography, Vol.2. Worcester, MA: Clark University Press. (pp. 333-358). Reprint available online
Watson, J.B. (1913a). Psychology as the Behaviorist Views It. Psychological Review (20) 158-177. Reprint available online
The classic "Behaviorist manifesto". Questions the very existence of imagery.
Watson, J.B. (1913b). Image and Affection in Behavior. Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods (10) 421-8.
A more careful and detailed version of the anti-imagery position put forward in Watson (1913a).
Watson, J.B. (1924). Psychology from the Standpoint of a Behaviorist (2nd ed.). Philadelphia, PA: Lippincott.
Watson, J.B. (1928). The Ways of Behaviorism. New York: Harper.
Reports of memory images are "sheer bunk".
Watson, J.B. (1930). Behaviorism (2nd ed.). Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
Watson, J.B. (1936). John Broadus Watson. In C. Murchison (Ed.), A History of Psychology in Autobiography (Vol. 3, pp. 271-281). Worcester, MA: Clark University Press.
Wekker, L.M. (1966). On the Basic Properties of the Mental Image and a General Approach to their Analogue Simulation. In Psychological Research in the U.S.S.R. Moscow: Progress Publishers.
Imagery theory in the Soviet psychological tradition. Somewhat similar to the motor theories of Dunlap (1914) and Washburn (1916).
Wexler, M., Kosslyn, S.M., & Berthoz, A. (1998). Motor Processes in Mental Rotation. Cognition (68) 77-94.
Wheeler, M.E., Petersen, S.E., & Buckner, R.L. (2000). Memory's Echo: Vivid Remembering Reactivates Sensory Specific Cortex. Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences of the U.S.A. (97) 11125-11129.
White, A.R. (1990). The Language of Imagination. Oxford: Blackwell.
Part 1 is an excellent, if selective, concise history of the concept of imagination. Part 2 argues (in the teeth of the strong historical consensus detailed in part 1) that there is no conceptual connection whatsoever between imagination and imagery. See Thomas (1997a) for a critique of this view.
Wittgenstein, L. (1922). Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. (Ed. C.K. Ogden, trans. C.K. Ogden & F.P. Ramsey, Introduction by B. Russell.) London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner. (First published in German in 1921.)
The "picture theory of meaning" presented in this work is not an imagery theory of meaning.
Wittgenstein, L. (1953). Philosophical Investigations. (Ed. G.E.M. Anscombe & R. Rhees, trans. G.E.M. Anscombe.). Oxford: Blackwell.
Contains a powerful and very influential critique of the imagery theory of linguistic meaning.
Wittgenstein, L. (1958). The Blue and Brown Books. (Ed. R. Rhees.). Oxford: Blackwell.
Opens with a critique of the imagery theory of linguistic meaning.
Wittgenstein, L. (1961). Zettel. (Ed. G.E.M. Anscombe & G.H. von Wright; trans. G.E.M. Anscombe.). Oxford: Blackwell.
Wittgenstein, L. (1980a). Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology: Volume 1. (Ed. G.E.M. Anscombe & G.H. von Wright; trans. G.E.M. Anscombe.). Oxford: Blackwell.
Wittgenstein, L. (1980b). Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology: Volume 2. (Ed. G.H. von Wright & H. Nyman; trans. C.G. Luckhardt & M.A.E. Aue.). Oxford: Blackwell.
This posthumous compilation of Wittgenstein's notes includes many scattered remarks or brief discusions about imagery (volume 1 of the Remarks and the Last Writings also contain a few). Most of the best points probably found their way into the Philosophical Investigations, however.
Wittgenstein, L. (1990). Last Writings on the Philosophy of Psychology. (ed. G.H. von Wright & H. Nyman, trans. C.G. Luckhardt & M.A.E. Aue.) Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
Wollock, J. (1997). The Noblest Animate Motion: Speech, Physiology and Medicine in Pre-Cartesian Linguistic Thought. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
Wraga, M. & Kosslyn, S.M. (2003). Imagery. In L. Nadel (Ed.) Encyclopedia of Cognitive Science, (Vol. 2, pp. 466-470). London: Nature Publishing/Macmillan.
A concise but superficial introduction to the cognitive science of imagery.
Wright, E. (1983). Inspecting Images. Philosophy (58) 57-72.
Wundt, W. (1912). An Introduction to Psychology (2nd edn.). New York: Macmillan. Translated from the German.
Yates, F.A. (1966). The Art of Memory. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
A celebrated and seminal history of mnemonic uses of imagery, from ancient to early modern times. Argues that such techniques have had a previously unrecognized importance in the history of western intellectual life.
Yomogida, Y., Sugiura, M., Watanabe, J., Akitsuki, Y., Sassa, Y., Sato, T., Matsue, Y., & Kawashima, R. (2004). Mental Visual Synthesis is Originated in the Fronto-temporal Network of the Left Hemisphere. Cerebral Cortex (14) 1376-1383.
"Visual mental synthesis" is here used to mean the production of "imagination imagery" of novel objects by the combination of parts or aspects of mental images of familiar objects.
Yuille, J.C. (Ed.) (1983). Imagery, Memory and Cognition: Essays in Honour of Allan Paivio. Hillsdale, NJ: Erlbaum.
Zemach, E.M. (1969). Seeing, "Seeing", and Feeling. Review of Metaphysics (23) 3-24.
Zimler, J. & Keenan, J.M. (1983). Imagery in the Congenitally Blind: How Visual are Visual Images? Journal of Experimental Psychology: Learning, Memory, and Cognition (9) 269-282.
The mnemonic effects of imagery (that are normally assumed to work in sighted subjects via the formation of visual imagery) are also demonstrable with congenitally blind subjects (cf. Jonides, Kahn, & Rozin, 1975; Marmor & Zaback, 1976; Carpenter & Eisenberg, 1978; Kerr, 1983).

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