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The Kyoto School

First published Mon 27 Feb, 2006

The Kyoto School is a group of 20th century Japanese philosophers who developed original systems of thought by creatively drawing on the intellectual and spiritual traditions of East Asia, those of Mahâyâna Buddhism in particular, as well as on the methods and content of Western philosophy.

After an introductory section, this article will focus on four questions: How should the Kyoto School be defined? What is their central philosophical theme? How should we understand their political thought? What is the cross-cultural legacy of the Kyoto School?

1. Introduction

The unintentional founder of the Kyoto School is Nishida Kitarô[1] (1870–1945), who is generally considered to be modern Japan's greatest philosopher. In the Meiji period (1868–1912), when Japan reopened itself to the world after more than two centuries of national isolation, a generation of scholars devoted themselves to importing Western academic fields of inquiry, including “philosophy.” After many years of studying Western philosophy and Eastern classics, and after a decade of intense practice of Zen Buddhism, Nishida was the first modern Japanese thinker to go beyond learning from the West to construct his own original system of thought. This he began to do in his maiden work, An Inquiry into the Good, published in 1911 (see Nishida 1990). On the basis of this work he obtained a position in the Philosophy Department of Kyoto University, where he went on to ceaselessly develop his thought and to decisively influence subsequent generations of original philosophers, including the two other most prominent members of the Kyoto School, Tanabe Hajime (1885–1962) and Nishitani Keiji (1900–1990).

As is reflected in the name of the School, its founding members were associated with Kyoto University, the most prestigious university in Japan next to Tokyo University. It is perhaps no coincidence that the school formed in Kyoto, the ancient capital and center of traditional Japanese culture, rather than Tokyo, the new capital and center of modernization, i.e., Westernization. While the Kyoto School philosophers all devoted themselves to the study of Western philosophy (indeed they made lasting contributions to the ongoing effort to introduce Western philosophy into Japan), they also kept one foot firmly planted in their own traditions of thought. One scholar of the Kyoto School writes in this regard: “The keynote of the Kyoto school, as persons educated in the traditions of the East despite all they have learned from the West, has been the attempt to bring the possibilities latent in traditional culture into encounter with Western culture” (Minamoto 1994, 217).

It would be misleading, however, if we were to think of the Kyoto School as merely ‘putting a Western rational mask over Eastern intuitive wisdom’. Nor would it be entirely accurate to think of them as simply ‘using Western philosophical idioms and modes of thought to give modern expression to East Asian Buddhist thought’. For not only is the Western influence on their thought more than skin deep, their philosophies are far too original to be straightforwardly equated with traditional Eastern thought. Insofar as they can be identified as East Asian or Mahâyâna Buddhist thinkers, this must be understood in the sense of having critically and creatively developed these traditions in philosophical dialogue with Western thought. It should be kept in mind that their primary commitment is not to a cultural self-expression, or even to a dialogue between world religions, but rather to a genuinely philosophical search for truth.

The Kyoto School has become most well known, especially in the West, for its philosophies of religion. Indeed the reception of the Kyoto School in North America in particular has more often than not taken place in university departments of Religious Studies, where their philosophies of religion have frequently been viewed as representative of Mahâyâna Buddhism, specifically of the latter's Zen and Shin (True Pure Land) forms.[2] While the exchange on these terms has been fruitful, this view can be misleading in two respects. First of all, even if for most of the Kyoto School thinkers a philosophy of religion is the ultimate arche and telos of their thought, it is hardly their sole concern. They address a full array of philosophical issues: metaphysics, ontology, epistemology, logic, philosophical anthropology, philosophy of history, philosophy of culture, ethics, political theory, philosophy of art, etc.

Secondly, even when their focus is on the philosophy of religion, they approach this topic in a non-dogmatic and often surprisingly non-sectarian manner, drawing on and reinterpreting, for example, Christian sources along with Buddhist ones. Even Nishitani, who did in fact come to identify his thought with “the standpoint of Zen,” adamantly refused the label of a “natural theologian of Zen.” He claimed that: “If I have frequently had occasion to deal with the standpoints of Buddhism, and particularly Zen Buddhism, the fundamental reason is that [the original form of reality and the original countenance of human being] seem to me to appear there most plainly and unmistakably” (NKC X, 288; Nishitani 1982, 261).

The legacy of the Kyoto School, therefore, should be understood neither as Buddhist thought forced into Western garb, nor as universal discourse (which the West happened to have invented or discovered) dressed up in Japanese garb. Rather, it is best understood as a set of unique contributions from the perspective of modern Japan—that is, from a Japan that remains fundamentally determined by its historical layers of traditional culture at the same time as being essentially conditioned by its most recent layer of contact with the West—to a nascent worldwide dialogue of cross-cultural philosophy.­­

In conclusion to this introductory section, let me briefly sketch the content of the remaining sections of this article. In the following section, I will consider the preliminary issues of how to define the Kyoto School and who to include as its members. The name “Kyoto School” has been used in the past, in some cases rather loosely, to refer to a variety of sets of thinkers. It is therefore necessary to begin by discussing the question: Just who belongs to exactly what? The third and central section of this article will treat what is generally considered to be the central philosophical contribution of the Kyoto School, namely, the idea of “Absolute Nothingness.” After discussing the ostensible contrast between “Western Being” and “Eastern Nothingness,” and after looking at some of the Eastern sources of the idea of Absolute Nothingness, I will discuss the topological, dialectical, phenomenological and existential philosophies of Absolute Nothingness developed by Nishida Kitarô, Tanabe Hajime, Nishitani Keiji, and most recently by Ueda Shizuteru (1926–). The fourth section will address the political controversy surrounding the wartime writings and activities of the Kyoto School. The first wave of attention paid to the Kyoto School in the West in the 1980s largely ignored the political controversy that had long surrounded the School in Japan. While this lacuna in Western scholarship was amended in the 1990s, notably with the publication of Rude Awakenings: Zen, the Kyoto School and the Question of Nationalism (Heisig/Maraldo 1994), the political ventures and misadventures of the Kyoto School remain a highly debated subject. In the final section of this article I will return to the question of the cross-cultural legacy of the Kyoto School as a group of thinkers that stood between—or perhaps moved beyond—East and West.

2. Identity and Membership: Who Belongs to What?

2.1 A History of External Naming

There has been considerable debate surrounding the question of how to define the “Kyoto School,” and who to include as its members. By all accounts Nishida Kitarô is considered its originator. Yet it was never his intention to institute a “school” based on his own thought; in fact he is reported to have always encouraged independent thinking in his students. Moreover, unlike Plato's Academy or the Frankfurt School, the Kyoto School never founded an academic institution, its relation with Kyoto University being a de facto one. Indeed the name “Kyoto School” only came into use by the “members” themselves much later, when at all.

Names do not only tell us who or what something is; they also tell us who or what something is not. Definitions not only seek to reveal an internal essence; they also draw a line of demarcation between inside and outside. It is thus not surprising that names and definitions often have their origin in labels appended from without. These labels may subsequently degenerate into stereotypes; or, conversely, they may be positively appropriated and redefined by the group itself. Both of these processes can be seen in the history of the “Kyoto School.”

The name “Kyoto School,” in fact, originated from without; or, more precisely speaking, it originated from the fringes of the School itself. Tosaka Jun (1900–1945), a student of Nishida and Tanabe, coined the expression in 1932 in reference to Nishida, Tanabe and Miki Kiyoshi (1897–1945) as purportedly representative of the epitome of “bourgeois philosophy in Japan” (see Heisig 2001, 4). Tosaka's own developing thought had an explicitly materialist and Marxist orientation, and in his article he criticized the School as promulgating a bourgeois idealism that ignores material historical conditions and issues of social praxis. While Tosaka's critique undoubtedly had an impact on the subsequent development of the Kyoto School's philosophies, ironically Tosaka himself is often considered today, together with Miki, to be a member of the “left wing” of the Kyoto School (see Hattori 2004).

The second significant moment in the naming (or “labeling”) of the “Kyoto School” came more clearly from without, and in an even more politically charged context. As Nishitani was to recollect years later: “The name ‘Kyoto School’ is a name journalists used in connection with discussions that friends of mine and I held immediately before and during the war” (NKC XI, 207; see Heisig 2001, 277). Nishitani is referring here to two symposia that addressed the question of the meaning and direction of the Pacific War and the question of “overcoming modernity.” These two controversial symposia will be discussed in section 4.3 of this article.

In these comments, written in 1977, Nishitani goes on to say that by that time the name “Kyoto School” had come to be used by Americans and others to “indicate purely a school of thought.” Since the 1970s the name “Kyoto School” has gradually recovered its underlying philosophical ring, which for several decades in Japan (especially outside of Kyoto) had been drowned out by its political overtones. This recovery happened first of all in the West, where scholars neglected the political controversies in their enthusiastic reception of the School's philosophies of religion. While the political controversies returned with a vengeance to Western academia a couple of decades later, in a kind of pendulum swing to the hyper-critical, the initial positive attention from without had by then helped to rehabilitate the image of the “Kyoto School” back home in Japan.

Fujita Masakatsu suggests that the question of defining the identity of the Kyoto School has often been a more pressing issue for Western scholars than for the Japanese themselves. He speculates that this has two reasons. One is that the Kyoto School never really had any noteworthy competing schools of original thought within Japan with which to contrast itself, and over against which to explicitly define its own identity. The second reason is that, while Westerners tend to draw out and focus on the shared general characteristics of the School's members, usually in contrast with the general characteristics of Western thought, for Japanese scholars of the Kyoto School the differences between the various members often appear in sharper relief than do their shared commonalities (Fujita 2001, ii).

In any case, just as the formation of the Kyoto School's ideas took place between Western and Eastern horizons of thought, so has the scholarly study and, to some extent, even the defining of the “Kyoto School” taken place between scholars in Japan on the one hand and those in Europe and North America on the other. Since one of the defining characteristics of the Kyoto School philosophers is their attempt to set Japan and their own thought in the context of the wider world, it is fitting that, with the increasingly international study of the Kyoto School, their thought is finally becoming what it always intended to be, namely, “Japanese philosophy in the world” (see Heisig 2004; Fujita/Davis 2005).

2.2 The Question of Definition

Recently in Japan two important volumes have appeared with the name “Kyoto School” in their titles: The Philosophy of the Kyoto School, edited by Fujita Masakatsu (2001), which consists of an anthology of texts by eight Kyoto School thinkers together with an essay on each one by a contemporary scholar; and The Thought of the Kyoto School, edited by Ôhashi Ryôsuke (2004), which contains five essays detailing the controversial history of the name “Kyoto School” as well as seven essays on potential contributions of their thought to various fields of contemporary philosophy. While the two books complement one other in many respects, they nevertheless each suggest a somewhat different approach to defining the school.

Fujita agrees with Takeda Atsushi's working definition of the Kyoto School as: “the intellectual network that was centered on Nishida and Tanabe, and mutually formed by those who were directly influenced in both a personal and scholarly manner by them” (Fujita 2001, ii and 234–35). Accordingly, Fujita's book features such thinkers as Tosaka and Miki, as well as more unanimously accepted figures such as Hisamatsu Shinichi (1889–1980) and Nishitani. As Fujita points out, the relatively open definition of the Kyoto School as such a scholarly and interpersonal “network” has the advantage of highlighting the mutuality of the flow of influence between its members, as well as the fact that “membership” in the unofficial group did not preclude serious disagreement with the thought of Nishida or Tanabe. While critical exchanges did sometimes lead to severed personal relations (Nishida and Tanabe infamously stopped speaking to one another), this was not always the case (Nishitani and Tosaka remained on good personal terms despite their political and philosophical differences). And in either case mutual criticism was philosophically taken seriously, and it frequently provided impetus to further developments in each member's thought. In this sense, according to Fujita, an acceptance of mutual criticism could well be considered one of the defining characteristics of the School.

One point that Tosaka made early on, which often gets repeated still today, is that without Tanabe's critical appropriation of Nishida's thought there would be no tradition of the Kyoto School; we would have only successors of “Nishida Philosophy” and not a genuine school of mutually related yet independent thinkers. The question remains, however, just how independent a thinker can be with respect to Nishida's thought and still be considered a member of the School. For even when subsequent figures in the School sharply questioned certain aspects of Nishida's thought, they tended at the same time to appropriate and creatively develop other shared concepts and motifs. (A movement of self-critical development can in fact be seen in the ceaseless progression of Nishida's own thought. Nishida thought of himself as a “miner” who never managed to stay put in one place long enough to “refine the ore” he had unearthed.)

Hence the Kyoto School, perhaps like any vibrant school of thought, should be seen as a cluster of original thinkers who, while not uncritically subscribing to any prescribed dogma, nevertheless came to share, and dispute, a number of common concerns as well as basic concepts and terminology. As we shall see, the most fundamental of their shared and disputed concepts is that of “Absolute Nothingness,” a notion that has, in fact, most often been used as a point of reference for defining the School.

Ôhashi explicitly questions the appropriateness of defining the Kyoto School merely in terms of a network of personal and scholarly relations. According to Ôhashi, in order for a group of thinkers to form a genuine “school” of philosophy, “there must be the common possession or formation of a thought” (Ôhashi 2004, 9). For Ôhashi, this common thought of the Kyoto School is “Absolute Nothingness,” and he accordingly suggests the following as a definition of the School: “a group of philosophers spanning several generations who developed their thought in several areas of philosophy with the idea of ‘Nothingness’ as a basis” (ibid., 10; see Ôhashi 2001, 13). While he does include Hattori Kenji's essay on the “left wing of the Kyoto School” as the opening chapter of his The Thought of the Kyoto School, previously Ôhashi explicitly excluded Miki from the School on account of his principally Marxists orientations (Ôhashi 1990, 12). (We might note here in passing that, in his major later period work, The Logic of Imagination, Miki does affirm the Nishida inspired idea that “Nothingness is what transcends the subjective and the objective and envelopes them” (quoted in Fujita 2004, 125).)

Among Western scholars, John Maraldo has most thoroughly probed the question of Kyoto School identity and membership. He isolates six criteria that scholars have used to include and exclude thinkers from the Kyoto School: (1) connection with Nishida; (2) association with Kyoto University; (3) stance toward Japanese and Eastern intellectual traditions; (4) stance toward the interrelated matters of Marxism, the nation state, and the Pacific War; (5) stance toward Buddhism and toward religion in general; and (6) stance toward the notion of Absolute Nothingness. Maraldo shows how each one of these criteria have been used in various ways, consciously or unconsciously, since the 1930s to either promote the philosophical significance or disparage the political ideology of the Kyoto School (Maraldo 2005, 33–38).

I would add two more related and interrelated criteria. One is an essentially ambivalent stance (i.e., neither simple rejection nor simple acceptance) toward Western philosophy and the West in general. For example, Nishida and others undertake a critical reception of Western ontology in order to develop an Eastern meontology or “logic of Nothingness,” and attempt to combine a Western “logic of things” with an Eastern “logic of heart-mind.” I will discuss such issues in section 3 of this article.

Another criterion that could be used to define the School is an essentially ambivalent attitude toward Western modernity (or toward modernization as Westernization). A critical stance toward a unilateral globalization of Western modernity, a stance which at the same time accepts in part its unavoidability and in some respects even affirms its necessity, gave rise to the idea of “overcoming modernity”—an overcoming that would take place not by retreating from Western modernity, but by going through and beyond it. This going through and beyond, moreover, would not simply be a matter of going further down the road of linear progress; it would entail a hermeneutical as well as ultimately a (me)ontological and existential re-gress, a radical “step back.” For the Kyoto School, a critical and creative retrieval of the traditions of the East, those of East Asian Mahâyâna Buddhism in particular, is thought to enable the radical religious and philosophical “trans-descendence” necessary to move through and beyond the limits and problems of Western modernity.

This idea of “overcoming modernity” has proven to be both one of the more stimulating and one of the more controversial aspects of their thought. For some it promises to contribute an important new East Asian perspective to the current debates over post-modernism in philosophy and post-colonialism in culture studies. Yet because the Kyoto School's ideas of “overcoming modernity” developed in conjunction with their wartime political theories, theories which typically saw the nation of Japan as playing a key role in the historical movement through and beyond Western modernity, it has also proven to be one of the more often criticized aspects of their thought. (It is noteworthy in this regard that contemporary Japanese epigones of (Western) post-modernism have for the most part eschewed making the connection between their adoption of recent Western self-criticism of modernity/Eurocentrism and the Kyoto School's earlier critique of these.) In any case, it is true that even after the Kyoto School ceased formulating the idea of overcoming modernity in political terms, the idea lives on in their postwar philosophies of religion and culture. Hence, a radical problematization of Western modernity can be considered an important aspect of their identity as a school of thought.

Another significant Western contributor to the question of the Kyoto School's identity is James Heisig, who succeeded Jan Van Bragt as the head of the Nanzan Institute for Religion and Culture in Nagoya, an institute which has for several decades now been at the center of international research on the Kyoto School. In his recent book, Philosophers of Nothingness: An Essay on the Kyoto School, Heisig suggests that we follow the lead of Takeuchi Yoshinori (1913–2002) and define the School by “triangulating” it around the three leading figures of Nishida, Tanabe, and Nishitani (Heisig 2001, 3–7 and 275–78).

It is indeed these three figures that form the core of what has become known as the Kyoto School, and in this article I will accordingly focus my attention primarily on them, if also at times on Ueda Shizuteru as the current leading figure of the School. It should nevertheless be kept in mind that these are only three or four of a much wider group of original thinkers, some squarely within and some on the fringes of the Kyoto School.

2.3 Members, Associate Members, and Related Thinkers

Ôhashi Ryôsuke's thesis, advanced already in his landmark German anthology, Die Philosophie der Kyôto-Schule (1990), is that the Kyoto School should be understood as a group of thinkers involved in a pluralistic yet cooperative and sustained attempt to think on the basis of an idea of “Nothingness” or “Absolute Nothingness.” This distinguishes their thought from that of traditional Western onto-logy with its basis of “being.” With this definition in mind, Ôhashi lists the central members of the Kyoto School according to generation as follows: Nishida and Tanabe make up the first generation; Hisamatsu, Nishitani, Kôsaka Masaaki (1900–1969), Shimomura Toratarô (1900–1995), Kôyama Iwao (1905–1993), and Suzuki Shigetaka (1907–1988) make up the second generation; and Takeuchi Yoshinori, Tsujimura Kôichi (1922–), and Ueda Shizuteru make up the third generation. Elsewhere he also suggests that the psychologist Kimura Bin (1931–) could be considered part of the third generation of the School, particularly if we shift the criterion of definition from interpersonal relations to a genealogy of thought (Ôhashi 2004, 9).

Of the third generation, Ueda Shizuteru, who has done extensive original work on Meister Eckhart, Zen, and Nishida, is considered by most to be the central figure of the Kyoto School active today. Tsujimura Kôichi, who studied under Heidegger as well as under Hisamatsu and Nishitani, has provocatively and influentially written on Heidegger's thought from a Zen and Kyoto School perspective. Abe Masao (1915–), a former student of Hisamatsu, has been an important representative of the Kyoto School and an inter-religious dialogue catalyst in North America, although he is less well known in Japan itself. If we were to view the Kyoto School as living past its third generation, Ôhashi Ryôsuke (1944–), a prolific philosopher in his own right, whose works in both Japanese and German address a broad range of philosophical issues, would undoubtedly count as a central figure of its fourth generation. Other contemporary active affiliates of the School, who could be seen as belonging to its fourth generation, include Hase Shôtô, Horio Tsutomu, Ômine Akira, Fujita Masakatsu, Mori Tetsurô, Kawamura Eiko, Matsumura Hideo, Nakaoka Narifumi, Okada Katsuaki, and Keta Masako. If the School shows promise of living on to future generations, it is with young scholars such as Minobe Hitoshi and Akitomi Katsuya, with advanced doctoral candidates in Japanese Philosophy at Kyoto University such as Mizuno Tomoharu and Sugimoto Kôichi, as well as with a handful of non-Japanese philosophers who have studied with members of the third and fourth generations of the School.

Yet we appear to be at a turning point in the history of the Kyoto School, as is reflected in current retrospective attempts to define it. With Ueda's and then Hase's retirements from Kyoto University, on the one hand, and with the recent creation in 1998 of a Department of the History of Japanese Philosophy at Kyoto University[3] (see the web site listed below) under the head of Fujita Masakatsu on the other, the Kyoto School is perhaps becoming, for better and for worse, more an object of scholarship than a predominantly living tradition. However, as with most schools of philosophy, the line between critical scholarship and creative appropriation is hardly a clear one, and in practice the retrospective study of the Kyoto School often blends together with its further development as a vibrant school of thought.

It is also important to point out that today in Japan the Kyoto School is not only studied in Kyoto. Since the appearance of Tokyo based philosopher Nakamura Yûjiô's first book on Nishida in 1983, Nishida and the Kyoto School have steadily began receiving serious attention once again from scholars and students in areas of Japan outside of Kyoto. Worth special mention in this regard is Kosaka Kunitsugu, whose lucid and prolific scholarship on Nishida and others has done a great deal for the sympathetic yet sober textual analysis of the Kyoto School. The recent creation of the Nishida Philosophy Association (see the website listed below) promises to bring about a new era of cooperative exchange between Tokyo based and Kyoto based scholars of the School.

To return to the question of membership, consideration should also be given to those who could be referred to as “related thinkers” or “associate members” of the Kyoto School. The widest understandings (or misunderstandings[4]) of the Kyoto School include in it a number of thinkers who have a more or less occasional relation to the inner circle of the School. On the one hand, there is the case of D. T. Suzuki (Suzuki Daisetsu) (1870–1966). Suzuki maintained a long personal relationship with Nishida since their days as schoolmates. He not only helped introduce the young Nishida to the practice of Zen, his articulation of Mahâyâna Buddhist thought is also acknowledged as having influenced the formation of certain key ideas in Nishida's last essay on the philosophy of religion. But Suzuki—who is justifiably famous in his own right for, among other things, helping introduce Zen to the West—was neither trained as a philosopher nor was he associated with Kyoto University; and thus he is perhaps best thought of as a “closely related thinker” to the School.

Then there are the cases of Watsuji Tetsurô (1889–1960) and Kuki Shûzô (1888–1941). Both of these philosophers were brought to Kyoto University by Nishida, and both developed philosophies which were more or less influenced by Nishida's thought (see Maraldo 2005, 34 and 52). And yet, both their thought and their activities remained too independent to count them among the inner circle of the School. It should be kept in mind, however, that these two “associate members” in particular are first rate philosophers in their own right, whose original work outshines that of many of the less original though full-fledged members of the School. Watsuji's novel theory of “culture and climate” (fûdo), together with his major work on the ethics of “betweenness” (aidagara), and Kuki's combination of logical rigor and existential insight in his major writings on the problem of contingency, together with his provocative works on Japanese aesthetics (notably his hermeneutical phenomenology of “iki”), have each made lasting contributions to philosophy and are worthy of international scholarly attention.

Finally, there is the matter of thinkers who have developed their ideas more or less under the influence of Nishida and other members of the Kyoto School. A complete list of this group of “influenced thinkers” would be long, but it would include such names as Takahashi Satomi, Takizawa Katsumi, Mutai Risaku, Yuasa Yasuo, Kimura Bin, Sakabe Megumi, and Nakamura Yûjirô. A number of non-philosophers, such as the world-famous architect Andô Tadao (Tadao Ando), who designed the Ishikawa Nishida Kitaro Museum of Philosophy (see the website listed below), have also been influenced by Nishida and the Kyoto School.

3. Absolute Nothingness: Giving Philosophical Form to the Formless

Have discussed issues of definition and membership of the Kyoto School, we are now prepared to pursue the question of what unifies their thought as a school of philosophy. I will here follow the suggestion of Ôhashi, Nishitani, and other representatives of the Kyoto School itself, and focus on the shared—and at times disputed—idea of “Absolute Nothingness” (zettai-mu).[5]­­

3.1 Western Being vs. Eastern Nothingness? Ontology vs. Meontology?

Nishitani wrote the following with regard to Nishida and Tanabe: “[Their] philosophies share a distinctive and common basis that sets them apart from traditional Western philosophy: Absolute Nothingness. … Clearly the idea of Absolute Nothingness came to awareness in the spirituality of the East; but the fact that it has also been posited as a foundation for philosophical thought represents a new step virtually without counterpart in the history of Western philosophy” (NKC IX, 225–26; Nishitani 1991, 161).

“First philosophy” in the Western tradition is ontology, which asks the question of “being qua being,” and tends to answer this question either in terms of the most universal “being-ness” or in terms of the “highest being.” For Aristotle, the essence of being was “substance,” ambiguously thought either as the particular (Socrates) or the concrete universal form (human being), and the highest being was the “unmoved mover.” Greek ontology later influenced the Christian theological tradition to think of God as the “highest being,” such that the dual threads of the Western tradition as a whole took shape as what Heidegger calls “onto-theology.” Hence, the fundamental philosophical question of the onto-theological mainstream of the West is, “What is being?” On the other hand, the counter-question which the Kyoto School finds in the East is, “What is Nothingness?” In place of an ontology, first philosophy in the East is more often a “meontology”: a philosophy of non-being or Nothingness.

Perhaps we should say “mu-logy” rather than “meontology”; for, strictly speaking, the Greek meon, “non-being,” should be translated into Japanese as hi-u. What I am translating as “Nothingnesss,” mu, is written with a single character rather than as a negation (hi) of being (u). This is crucial since the Nothingness with which they are concerned is not the simple negation or privation of being. It is closer to Heidegger's “question of being,” which, attentive to what he calls the “ontological difference” between being (das Sein) and beings (das Seiende), asks after that which can only appear as “no-thing” when we think only in terms of things, that is, when we think (or calculate) merely in terms of determinate beings. Heidegger thus calls “the Nothing” (das Nichts) the “veil of being.” Das Sein or das Nichts is for Heidegger that which grants an open place, a clearing (Lichtung), for beings to show themselves. Just as “nature (phusis) loves to hide” (Heraclitus), being lets beings come to presence by itself withdrawing into absence or self-concealment (see Heidegger 1975, Vol. 9, 103–22; and Vol. 65, 246–47).

Tanabe studied with Heidegger in the early 1920s. (In fact, upon returning to Japan in 1924, Tanabe was the first scholar in the world to write an article on Heidegger's thought.) When he later wrote the following, Tanabe no doubt had Heidegger's 1929 “What is Metaphysics?” lecture in mind: “All science needs to take some entity or other as its object of study. The point of contact is always in being, not in nothing. The discipline that has to do with Nothingness is philosophy” (THZ VI, 156; see Heisig 2001, 121).

Heidegger was of course not the first Western philosopher to ask after that which is radically other than beings, or even “beyond being” as such.[6] For example, Tanabe could have also found support for the idea that philosophy investigates Nothingness in the following passage from Hegel: “Das Erste der Philosophie aber ist, das absolute Nichts zu erdenken” [Yet the first task of philosophy is to conceive of absolute Nothingness] (quoted from Hegel's “Glauben und Wissen” in Ôhashi 1984, 203). The Kyoto School might even be thought of as recovering a suggestion from one of the first Presocratic philosophers, Anaximander: namely, to think finite beings as determinations, or delimitations, of “the Indefinite” or “the Unlimited” (to apeiron).

Moreover, as Kyoto School thinkers frequently do point out, Christian negative theologians and mystics, most notably Meister Eckhart, at times make use of the notion of “the Nothing” to refer to that which transcends all concepts and all oppositions. For Eckhart, “Nothing” (niht) was one way of indicating the “Godhead” (gôtheit) beyond “God” delimited as a personal being (see Eckehart 1963, 328). Niht here is an expression, at the limits of language, which attempts to indicate “the nothingness of indistinct fullness from which flow … all oppositions and relations” (Schürmann 1978, 168). Eckhart speaks of a breakthrough, not only beyond the ego, but also beyond God Himself, a breakthrough, that is, to an abyssal Godhead understood as “the silent desert into which no distinction ever gazed, of Father, Son, or Holy Ghost" (Eckehart 1963, 316). Analogously, Nishida writes that “when we truly enter thoroughly into the consciousness of Absolute Nothingness, there is neither I nor God” (NKZ V, 182; see Nishida 1958, 137).

Nishitani affirms Eckhart's intimations of a Godhead of Absolute Nothingness, even though he notes that this is “markedly distant from orthodox Christian faith,” which limits the concept of nothingness to the relative nothingness expressed in the nihilum of creatio ex nihilo, that is, to the absolute privation of being out of which the highest being creates lesser beings (NKC X, 75; Nishitani 1982, 66; also see NKC VII). Yet Nishitani's student and Eckhart scholar Ueda Shizuteru, despite profound appreciation for Eckhart's thought and its nearness to Zen, argues in the end that Eckhart's Nothingness, like that of negative theology in general, still points to an inexpressibly higher being (see USS VIII, 146). Critically adapting Heidegger's expression, we might say that the Nothing is still understood as “the veil” of this inexpressibly higher being. Both Nishitani and Ueda ultimately look to Zen for a Nothingness so absolute that, in thoroughly negating any traces of opposition to beings (i.e., as a higher being transcending worldly beings), it is paradoxically found fully in the concrete facts and activities of the here and now (see USS VIII, 5ff.).

Ôhashi stresses, however, that neither the Buddhist tradition nor the Kyoto School should be thought of as having a patent on the radical “thinking of Nothingness.” In fact, he argues, “this thought slowly came to the fore within Western philosophy itself,” a process that indeed set the stage for Kyoto School contributions to contemporary philosophy (Ôhashi 2004, 12–13). Nishitani had in fact explored a number of resonant notions of Nothingness, not only in the Neoplatonic and Christian mystical traditions, but also in 19th and 20th century Western philosophers such as Nietzsche and Heidegger (see NKC VIII; Nishitani 1990). And yet, here again Nishitani finds residues of an ontological bias, where a kind of “relative nothingness” is posited as either a simple negation of or as a veil for being. Nishitani ultimately concludes that Nietzsche succeeded only in expressing a “standpoint of relative absolute nothingness”; and even in Heidegger, he critically suggests, “traces of the representation of nothingness as some ‘thing’ that is nothingness still remain” (NKC X, 75 and 108; Nishitani 1982, 66 and 96).[7]

In any case, it is fair to say that the Kyoto School thinkers generally consider the purest sources for the idea of Absolute Nothingness to lie in the traditions of the East. Hisamatsu went so far as to speak of Absolute Nothingness as “Oriental Nothingness” (Hisamatsu 1960); though it is important to bear in mind that his claim is that this idea was first clearly discovered in the traditions of East. Absolute Nothingness is by no means only relevant to Eastern cultures, anymore than in 1500 CE the earth was only round in the West. Moreover, if the idea of Absolute Nothingness “came to awareness in the spirituality of the East,” as Nishitani says, the philosophy of Absolute Nothingness is generally considered to be the Kyoto School's own contribution to the contemporary world of thought opened up by the meeting of East and West.

Nishida—who could hardly be accused of underestimating what Japan had to learn from Western philosophy—also spoke at times in very general terms of Eastern Nothingness in contrast with Western being. In his essay, “The Types of Culture of the Classical Periods of East and West Seen from a Metaphysical Perspective,” he wrote: “How then are we to distinguish between the types of culture of the West and East from a metaphysical point of view? I think we can do this by dividing them into that [i.e., the culture of the West] which considers the ground of reality to be being, and that [i.e., the culture of the East] which considers this ground to be Nothingness.” In Greek philosophy, he goes on to say, “that which has form and determination was regarded as the real”; or even, as in Plato, reality, that which has true being, was understood as the Forms. Judeo-Christian culture, however radically different in various ways it was from Greek culture, and despite negative theology's indications of a Deus absconditus as a kind of Nothingness, nevertheless primarily considered the person of God as “the most perfect being” to be the basis of reality. In radical contrast to both the Greek and Judeo-Christian origins of Western culture, Indian culture, like that of China and Japan, took “the profoundest idea of Nothingness as its basis” (NKZ VII, 429–33; see Nishida 1970, 21–23).

In the closing lines of the preface to his 1926 book, From That Which Acts to That Which Sees, a book many scholars view as the beginning of “Nishida Philosophy” proper, we find the following famous and programmatic lines: “It goes without saying that there is much to admire, and much to learn from, in the impressive achievements of Western culture, which thought form as being and the giving of form as good. However, does there not lie hidden at the base of our Eastern culture, preserved and passed down by our ancestors for several thousand years, something which sees the form of the formless and hears the voice of the voiceless? Our hearts and minds endlessly seek this something; and it is my wish to provide this quest with a philosophical foundation” (NKZ IV, 6).

3.2 The Eastern Background for the Idea of Absolute Nothingness

Before looking more specifically at how Nishida and other members of the Kyoto School attempt to give philosophical form to the formless, it will be helpful to look at some of the threads in Eastern traditions on which the Kyoto School thinkers are explicitly and implicitly drawing as they weave their texts on Absolute Nothingness.

Their explicit references are primarily to Mahâyâna Buddhism, especially to the East Asian schools of Zen and/or Pure Land (predominantly Shinran's Shin) Buddhism. The key Sanskrit term in Mahâyâna Buddhism here is śûnyatâ (“Emptiness”; in Japanese). With the noteworthy exception of the later Nishitani, however, the Kyoto School tends to favor the Chinese glyph mu (“Nothingness”; wu in Chinese), which is found predominantly in Zen, and which reflects the early attempt to “match terms” with Daoism in the translation and interpretive development of Buddhism in China. Let us briefly examine both of these Asian sources for the Kyoto School's philosophies of Absolute Nothingness, śûnyatâ and wu/mu.[8]

In Mahâyâna Buddhism śûnyatâ refers first of all to the fact that all things come into being in “interdependent origination” (Sanskrit: pratîtya-samutpâda; Japanese: engi), and they are therefore “empty” of any independent substantial self-nature or “own-being” (Sanskrit: svabhâva). This thought is closely tied to the basic Buddhist thesis of “no-self” or “non-ego” (Sanskrit: anâtman; Japanese: muga). All beings, including the ego, are interconnected and in flux. Psychologically, śûnyatâ refers also to the releasement from all attachment to beings, from all reification and willful appropriation of them. Such attachments are both based on and in turn support the primary attachment to the fabricated ego, since the ego both strives to possess and is unwittingly possessed by its reification of beings. Awakening to the emptiness of all things, to their lack of substantial own-being or egoity (Japanese: shogyômuga), thus frees one both from an ego-centered and reified view of things, and from the illusion of the substantial ego itself.

However, if the movement of negation stops here at a one-sided negation of being (i.e., at negation of the independent substantial reality of things and the ego), and if the idea of “Emptiness” is not itself emptied,[9] then we are left either with a pessimistic nihilism or with an ironically reified view of śûnyatâ. These are what the Buddhist tradition calls “śûnyatâ-sickness” (Japanese: kûbyô). True śûnyatâ must be understood to dynamically negate the very opposition of being and (relative) nothingness (see Nakamura 1975, Vol. 1, 278). Hence, in Mahâyâna we find an explicit return—through a “great negation” of reification and attachment to being—to a “great affirmation” of a non-reified understanding of being. Emptiness thoroughly understood is nothing separate from or opposed to “being” properly understood. As the often chanted lines of the Heart Sutra put it: “[phenomenal] form is emptiness; emptiness is also [phenomenal] form; emptiness is no other than form; form is no other than emptiness” (see Bercholz/Kohn 1993, 155). The famous Mahâyâna Buddhist philosopher of śûnyatâ Nâgârjuna (ca. 150–250 CE) went so far as to provocatively state: “The limits (i.e., realm) of nirvâna are the limits of samsâra. Between the two, also, there is not the slightest difference whatsoever” (Inada 1993, 158). In other words, nirvâna is neither a nihilistic extinction of nor a transcendent escape from the phenomenal world (samsâra); it is rather an enlightened manner of being-in-the-world here and now (see Garfield 1995, 332). This radical reaffirmation of the phenomenal world was particularly stressed in East Asian developments of Mahâyâna Buddhism, where we find such remarkably affirmative phrases as: “true Emptiness, marvelous being” (Japanese: shinkû-myôu).

In his mature writings Nishitani explicitly employs the Mahâyâna term śûnyatâ (even though he never disavows the term Nishida coined, “Absolute Nothingness”) in his attempt to think a way beyond both the exacerbated attachment to being and the reactive nihilism that together plague the modern world. Nishitani writes as follows: On the one hand, śûnyatâ or Emptiness can be termed “an absolute negativity, inasmuch as it is a standpoint that has negated and thereby transcended nihility, which was itself the transcendence-through-negation of all being.” In this sense, “Emptiness can well be described as ‘outside’ of and absolutely ‘other’ than the standpoint shackled to being, provided we avoid the misconception that Emptiness is some ‘thing’ distinct from being and subsisting ‘outside’ it.” On the other hand, then, Emptiness is truly Emptiness “only when it empties itself even of the standpoint that represents it as some ‘thing’ that is Emptiness. … [True Emptiness] is to be realized as something united to and self-identical with being” (NKC X, 109–10; Nishitani 1982, 97). Following in the wake of Nishida's topological thinking of Absolute Nothingness (see section 3.3 below), Nishitani also thinks of śûnyatâ as a “place” or “field” wherein beings can appear as they truly are in their proper basis or “home-ground” (moto).

The idea of a Nothingness that radically transcends, or underlies, both being and its simple negation can also be traced back to pre-Buddhist Chinese thought. A recent Chinese scholar laments the philosophical ambiguity inherent in the Chinese character wu (Nothingness). He writes that “in Chinese ‘wu’ can mean both the contrasting pair of ‘you’ [i.e., ‘being’] and the metaphysical source of both ‘you’ and ‘wu’” (Zhang 2002, 150). In the terminology of the Kyoto School, the former sense of wu (mu in Japanese) is a matter of “relative nothingness,” while the latter sense is akin to what they call “Absolute Nothingness.” The latter sense of wu is expressed in chapter 40 of the Laozi (Daodejing) as follows: “The myriad things under heaven are generated from being. Being is generated from Nothingness (wu).” This unnamable non-dualistic source of all being and relative non-being is also referred to as the Way (dao). Of the latter it is said, in chapter 14 of the Laozi: “It is called the shapeless shape, the image of no-thing” (see Izutsu 2001, 50–51 and 104). It is not hard to link this thought with Nishida's professed intention of giving philosophical foundation to the “form of the formless” that lies at the heart of the traditions of the East.

In the Daoist tradition we also find an idea of Nothingness used in the context of radically emptying the mind in order to attune the finite self to the in-finite[10] rhythm of the Way. The Zhuangzi speaks in this regard of the practice of “sitting down and forgetting everything” and of “being empty like a mirror” (see Watson 1968, 90 and 97). When Zen talks of returning to one's “original face before one's parents were born,” we find the Daoist ideas of “forgetting the ego” and “returning to the root” linked together with the Mahâyâna Buddhist notion of the “original purity of the mind.” The original brightness and purity of the mind, which lies hidden beneath the clouds of defiling passion, is also frequently expressed in Mahâyâna texts with the analogy of a mirror that is able to spontaneously reflect the world without egoistic discriminations.

Zen presumably inherits this analogy of the original mind as mirror from both Mahâyâna and Daoist sources. In the traditional edition of The Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch, however, all residues of dualistic discrimination—including those that remain even in the notion of a mirror that needs to be continually wiped clean of impurities—are swept away in the famous lines: “Originally there is not a single thing” (Chinese: benlai wu-yi-wu; Japanese: honrai mu-ichi-motsu). In this quintessential Zen expression are wedded together the meontological and psychological senses of wu/mu: a metaphysical assertion of the aboriginality of a non-dualistic Nothingness, and an expression of the non-ego's radical freedom from attachment and freedom for spontaneous creativity and compassion.

In Zen we discover the Mahâyâna Buddhist notion of Emptiness and the Daoist notion of Nothingness fully intertwined and developed into a practice of living both completely unattached and completely engaged in the world of “true Emptiness, marvelous being.” In the famous Wu or Mu kôan that opens the Gateless Barrier, Wumen (Mumon) urges those who wish to reach enlightenment, that is, those who wish to pass through the “barrier of the gate of Nothingness,” to concentrate their entire life force on this Wu (Mu), taking care to understand it neither as “nihilistic nothingness” nor “in terms of being and non-being” (Nishimura 1994, 22; see Cleary 1999, 71). This was the kôan that Nishida finally passed after nearly a decade of intense practice of Zen (see Yusa 2002, 45ff.). And as Nishida confided many years later to Nishitani, it was from early on his “impossible desire” to somehow bring Zen and philosophy together (NKZ XIX, 224–25; see Davis 2004b, 256ff.).

3.3 Nishida's Topology of Absolute Nothingness

Besides contrasting Western Being with Eastern Nothingness, in his later writings Nishida also at times makes a broad distinction between a Western “logic of things” and an Eastern “logic of the heart-mind (kokoro).” While Western thought tends to begin with an objective logic of substances (be these physical or mental), he claims that in Buddhism one can find the germ of a logic of the heart-mind, even if traditionally this remained largely at the level of an expression of personal experience rather than being fully developed into a genuinely philosophical logic (see Nishida 1964, 356). (Scholars of Buddhism may want to argue that it was Nishida's own knowledge of Buddhism that remained too much at the level of personal experience, rather than the sophisticated teachings of the Mâdhyamaka, Yogâchâra, Tiantai, and Huayan traditions of Mahâyâna philosophy.)

In any case, in the development of Nishida's logic of Nothingness, “being” is thought of in terms of the objectivity of determinate things, “relative nothingness” is understood as a mere privation or simple negation of being, and an enveloping sense of “Nothingness” is initially associated with a kind of transcendental subjectivity of consciousness or the heart-mind. Ultimately, however, Nishida comes to posit Absolute Nothingness as the “place” (basho) that embraces both subjective (noetic) and objective (noematic) polarities of reality. Thus, in the end he thus relegates not only privation of being but also subjective nothingness, in the sense of the “field of consciousness,” to a type of “relative nothingness.”[11]

In 1934 Nishida writes: “Reality is being and at the same time nothingness; it is being-and-nothingness [u-soku-mu], nothingness-and-being; it is both subjective and objective, noetic and noematic. Reality is the unity of subjectivity and objectivity, and thus the self-identity of what is absolutely contradictory. Or rather, it is not that [the separate spheres of] subjectivity and objectivity come to unite, and then we first have reality. [The opposition of] subjectivity and objectivity must instead be thought from out of a dynamically dialectical reality that is self-determining” (NKZ VII, 441; see Nishida 1970, 29). Reality, as the dialectical “self-determination of Absolute Nothingness,” is in Nishida's later works understood as a dynamic “identity of the absolute contradiction” between subjective (relative) nothingness and objective being. Absolute Nothingness is the temporal and spatial “place” wherein individual persons and things determine one another in their mutual interactions.

The “place of Absolute Nothingess” (zettai-mu no basho) first became the central concept of Nishida's thought in the mid-1920s, though he continued to develop and rethink the idea up until his last completed essay in 1945, “The Logic of Place and the Religious World-View.” Nishida first explicitly worked out an idea of Absolute Nothingness in his 1926 book, From That Which Acts to That Which Sees (NKZ IV), a book which inaugurated his middle-period of thought. In this work, which includes an important essay entitled “Place” (“Basho”), Nishida's topological reasoning develops in rough outline as follows12]:

Just as all events must “take place” somewhere, all beings must be situated in some place. Beings always exist in relation to other beings, and any relation requires a third term, namely, the place wherein they are related. In other words, for A and B to be related, there must be some place, C, in which their relation is situated. To begin with, we can understand this C as the spatial “context” in which objects are situated in relation to one another. But the context in which things are defined is more than spatial; a thing is not only here as opposed to there. Things are determined according to a number of criteria, each of which operates within its own field of judgment. Hence, the place C can be further understood as a “category” of judgment, such as “color.” Red and blue are revealed, and contrasted with one another, as colors within the category field of color.

In order to let concrete things reveal themselves yet more fully, however, we should think of C as “consciousness.” Our minds are able to correlate various categories of judgment, such as color, size, shape, location, etc., and therefore to perceive individual things as composed of unique combinations of various qualities. For example, we are conscious of a certain thing as a round, soft, red, sweet, apple sitting on a table. The field of consciousness is the field in which these different categories are unified in the perception and judgment of a particular thing in relation to other particular things and their qualities.

Ultimately, however, there is a crucial limit to the subjective “field of consciousness.” As Kant demonstrated, subjective consciousness cannot reflect things as they are in themselves, but only as they appear under the projection of subjective categories. What, then, is the ultimate place wherein not only objects but subjects too exist? According to Nishida, this must be the place where persons and things not only undergo changes in accidental categorical qualities, but essentially and existentially “come to be and pass away.” It is the place, not just of intellectual judgments, but of birth and death. This ultimate “groundless ground,” which “envelopes” all beings, yet which does so in such a way that lets them contain their own principle of self-determination, Nishida calls “the place of true Nothingness.” Although in no sense a determinate being, neither is this place of true or absolute Nothingness a mere static vacuity. In some sense, it must be thought of as both the source of consciousness, and as the metaphysically creative origin of beings.

Although Nishida comes to the idea of the place of Absolute Nothingness most directly through his confrontations with Kant and Neo-Kantianism, he does not shy from thinking this place in metaphysical as well as epistemological terms: Nothingness is not merely a reflective, but is also a creative principle (NKZ IV, 238–39). As he writes much later, “Absolute Nothingness at once transcends everything and is that by which everything is constituted” (NKZ IX, 6). And yet, Nishida repeatedly tells us that, as no-thing outside of or other than the place of the coming to be and passing away of truly individual beings, Absolute Nothingness is not to be thought of as a “transcendent being.” Nor is it to be understood as the processional unfolding of a “potential being,” that is to say, as a kind of Hegelian “world Spirit” with its own cunning reason at work behind the scenes of its historical march toward self-realization. The Absolute, according to Nishida, must be thought of as Nothingness in order to distinguish it from all ontologies that would reduce the uniqueness and autonomy of truly individual beings either to a transcendent being or to an underlying teleological process.

One of the driving concerns behind Nishida's repeated insistence that the Absolute be thought of in the meontological terms of a formless, indeterminate place of Absolute Nothingness, is that only therein can the irreducible and self-determining singular individual be given its due. All ontologies of universal being fail to allow for the existence of the true individual, or for the genuine encounter between individuals. Since “there is no universal [of being] whatsoever that subsumes the I and the thou” (NKZ VI, 381), the locus of genuine interpersonal encounter must be thought of in terms of the place of Absolute Nothingness.

It should be pointed out that the Japanese term for “absolute,” zettai, literally means a “severing of opposition,” which implies the sense of “without an opposing other.” The contrasting term is sôtai, which indicates “relativity” in the sense of “mutual opposition.” The true Absolute must embrace, rather than stand over against, the relative. The Absolute, therefore, must not oppose itself to relative beings; rather, its self-determination must be such as to allow their mutual autonomous relations to take place. According to Nishida, it is only a philosophy of the place of Absolute Nothingness that can do justice to the notion of the Absolute as well as account for both the autonomy and the mutual relativity of individuals.

While on the one hand Nishida becomes increasingly concerned with allowing for radical interpersonal alterity within the place of Absolute Nothingness, on the other hand he also consistently argues from early on that “consciousness” should not be thought to necessarily entail an unbridgeable epistemological subject-object split. Although he initially adopted, and adapted, the notion of “pure experience” from William James and others to express this non-dual basis of knowledge, Nishida later drops this expression in favor of the notion of “self-awareness” (jikaku). According to Nishida, self-awareness can be defined as a “self reflecting itself within itself” (NKZ IV, 215).[13] Since Absolute Nothingness is not a “self” in the sense of a subject standing over against an object, any more than it is an ego with its own interested categories of perception, the self-awareness of Absolute Nothingness must be that of a “seeing without a seer” or a “knowing without a knower.” “Since there is no-thing that reflects, it is like a mirror reflecting the mirror itself” (ibid., 181).

In Nishida's middle period, the paradigm for knowing is a “pure seeing” (tada miru) beyond all acting and volition. Nishida claims that as finite individuals we can approach this ideal by way of thoroughly negating or emptying the ego. “By truly emptying the self, the field of consciousness can reflect an object just as it is” (NKZ IV, 221). The self reaches the place of Absolute Nothingness, and therefore first truly comes into contact with other beings, by way of thoroughly emptying itself in a movement of “immanent transcendence” that takes it back through the depths of the field of consciousness.

In his last completed text, “The Logic of Place and the Religious Worldview,” Nishida most fully developed the religious implications of the idea of Absolute Nothingness. There he thinks Absolute Nothingness as the best way to understand God or the Absolute, which he defines as that which “contains its own absolute self-negation within itself” (NKZ XI, 397). As Absolute Nothingness, God is the dynamic principle of affirmation by way of absolute self-negation. The true Absolute essentially negates its transcendent divinity and expresses itself in the forms of the relative.[14]

Yet Nishida insists that this idea of God can be understood no more in terms of an immanent pantheism than in terms of a transcendent theism. It may perhaps best be called “panentheism”; but for Nishida this too remains a static term of “objective logic” and fails to capture the necessity of thinking God as both irreducibly transcendent and thoroughly immanent. As Nishida is fond of saying, God or the Buddha is “immanently transcendent.” It is the paradoxical logic one finds in the Prajñâpâramitâ Sutras of Mahâyâna Buddhism (i.e., what D. T. Suzuki called the “logic of soku-hi,” a logic of “is and is not”) that Nishida thinks most profoundly expresses the “absolute dialectic” of the divine as the dynamic principle of Absolute Nothingness (NKZ XI, 399; see Nishida 1987, 69–71).

If we as finite relative beings can and do touch the Infinite Absolute, it is only by way of a mutual self-negation. Nishida calls this mutual self-negation “inverse correspondence” (gyakutaiô). By way of radically emptying ourselves, we can touch that which is the radical origin of self-emptying, the Absolute as an essentially self-negating Absolute Nothingness. According to Nishida, an immanent principle of self-negation is, in fact, the very essence of life. “True life (seimei) must contain within itself an Absolute Nothingness, a [principle of] absolute negation” (NKZ VIII, 341). It is such a life that can truly be self-determining as a “creative element of a creative world.”

In his middle period, inaugurated by the first formulations of the idea of “the place of Absolute Nothingness” in From That Which Acts to That Which Sees, Nishida's thought was characterized by a shift from his earlier voluntarism to a kind of intuitionism of pure seeing without a seer (see NKZ IV, 3–6). In his later period, however, Nishida's epistemology became much more dynamic and dialectical; rather than “pure seeing,” his key epistemological phrase then becomes “active-intuition.” Although self-emptying still plays a vital role, this is understood not as preparation for a passive intuition, but rather as an active process of “seeing a thing by becoming it.” In other words, intuition happens only in the process of acting upon and in turn being acted upon by things.

In his later period, the place of Absolute Nothingness is accordingly reconceived much more dynamically as the “self-determination of the dialectical world,” a world which continually moves according to the principle of “from created to creating.” The Absolute finds expression now only in the midst of the mutual interaction of individuals and things, and true individuals are both determined by and “counter-determine” (gyaku-gentei suru) the movement of the dialectical world (see NKZ VII, 305ff.; VIII, 313–14). Although one can to some extent trace an immanent unfolding of Nishida's thought in this direction, it is also undeniable that a major impetus for his dialectical development of the idea of Absolute Nothingness can be found in the criticism he received from his junior colleague, Tanabe Hajime.

3.4 Tanabe's Absolute Nothingness as the Other-Power of Absolute Mediation

It is Tanabe's declaration of partial independence from Nishida's thought in an essay written in 1930, “Looking up to Professor Nishida” (THZ IV, 305–328), that many see as the origin of the Kyoto School as more than a group of disciples of “Nishida Philosophy.” In this essay Tanabe sharply criticizes Nishida's middle-period philosophy of the “place of Absolute Nothingness,” claiming that it falls into kind of Plotinian “emanationism” that ultimately rests on a religious or mystical intuition. For Tanabe, this posed two serious problems for a genuine philosophy of Absolute Nothingness.

To begin with, in crossing the line between philosophical reason, based on ordinary experience, and supra-rational intuition, based on extra-ordinary religious experience, Nishida had purportedly committed a methodological transgression. Here Tanabe poses a question that still resounds in (some would say haunts) the halls of Kyoto School studies to this day. As James Heisig puts it, the Kyoto School thinkers in general do not share an important assumption of Western philosophy as a whole, namely, a “clear delineation between philosophy and religion” (Heisig 2001, 13–14). This is a complex issue, since the Western concept of “religion” was just as much an import to Japan as was “philosophy.” The problems faced and the possibilities opened up by a Zen Buddhist “philosophy of religion” in particular differ in significant ways from a Judeo-Christian one, insofar as the former calls for extending rational thought in the direction of a “practice of awakening,” rather than in the direction of a leap of faith.

I have addressed the provocative methodological ambivalences involved in Nishida's and Nishitani's philosophies of Zen in detail elsewhere (Davis 2004b; and Davis 2006). Let it suffice to say in this context that Tanabe too later crisscrosses the line between philosophy and religion as much as any Kyoto School thinker, although his Shin Buddhist inclinations took him in the direction of “faith” rather than “intuition.”[15] After this religious turn in his thinking, Tanabe claimed that philosophy and faith must be mediated by a personal act of metanoesis (Tanabe 2000, 34; Tanabe 1986, 29), and that, in order to develop a genuine philosophy of religion, “in the end one must have faith and become self-aware by means of religious faith” (Tanabe 2003, 27).

For his part, Nishida responded to Tanabe's early critique by affirming that his idea of the self-awareness of Absolute Nothingness does indeed entail the profound significance of religious experience. Yet he claims that this is neither mystical in the sense of “religious ecstasy” nor “is it thought in the direction of substance, as is Plotinus' One.” He denied the charge of emanationism, claiming that in his thought “it is not a matter of the self-determination of being, but rather the self-determination of Nothingness” (NKZ VI, 154). For Nishida, only if the Absolute is thought in terms of a self-negating Nothingness, rather than in terms of a transcendent plenum of the One, is it possible to truly affirm the world of the many. The Absolute is found in the very midst of beings, not beyond them. It is “because this is Absolute Nothingness,” Nishida writes in the parlance of Zen, “that the mountain is mountain, the river is river, and all beings are just as they are” (NKZ V, 182; see Nishida 1958, 137).

But the other major concern of Tanabe's critique of Nishida was that, insofar as Absolute Nothingness is made into an unchanging basis or enveloping “place” of a system of reality, and insofar as it is seen as transcending the dialectical interactions among beings, then such a philosophy ends up falling back into a metaphysics of being after all. In order to radically think the idea of Absolute Nothingness, Tanabe argues, we must conceive of it rather in terms of “absolute mediation” or “absolute dialectic.” Absolute Nothingness must be thought, not as an enveloping place, but as the very movement of “absolute negation,” a movement which originates in the self-negation of Absolute Nothingness itself. Tanabe writes: “Since the Absolute, as Nothingness, must act as an absolute mediating force, it presupposes relative being as its medium. In contrast with the doctrine of the creation of the world maintained by the theist, or the theory of emanation propounded by the pantheist, [for] historical thinking the Absolute and the relative, Nothingness and being, are interrelated each with the other as indispensable elements of absolute mediation” (Tanabe 2000, 27; Tanabe 1986, 23).

In this later text, Philosophy as Metanoetics, written around the same time as Nishida was elaborating his own kenotic idea of a self-negating Absolute Nothingness, Tanabe, in a putative critique of Nishida, also writes: “Because the absolute subject of Other-power is Absolute Nothingness … it must be thoroughly mediated by the relative self. In contrast to a mere ‘self-identity of absolute contradictories’, only that which entails the absolute existential mediation of the death and resurrection of the self can be called Absolute Nothingness” (Tanabe 2000, 13; Tanabe 1986, 8). Tanabe's passing dismissal of Nishida's terminology here is hardly convincing, since in fact Nishida too speaks of the absolute self-negation of Absolute Nothingness and of the existential death and resurrection of the finite self. In any case, Tanabe's philosophy as the “way of metanoetics” (zangedô) entails the ceaseless movement of what he calls “absolute critique,” where the self-power of finite reason again and again runs up against antinomies, and is reborn only by way of Absolute Nothingness as what he calls, in the parlance of Shinran's Shin Buddhism, the workings of Other-power (tariki).

As Nishitani and others have pointed out (see NKC IX, 212ff.; Nishitani 1991, 161ff.), Tanabe's criticisms often fail to do justice to Nishida's thought, and we should not forget the impetuses Tanabe acknowledges having received from his erstwhile mentor. Yet, on the other hand, his criticisms were frequently not without their point, and his provocations certainly did serve as counter-impetuses that spurred Nishida on, not just to clarify, but also to further develop his philosophy of Absolute Nothingness (see Sugimoto 2004; Kopf 2004). No doubt in large part due to the persistent attention given by Tanabe to the historical world, to the irrational element of the specific through which the individual and the universal must be mediated, and to the dialectical relations between finite beings, Nishida gradually moved away from an at times static and individualistic conception of an artistic or religious intuition of the place of Absolute Nothingness, and toward a much more dynamic conception of Absolute Nothingness as the self-determination of the dialectical world, a self-determination which takes place only by way of the mutual interactions between individual persons and things.

3.5 Nishitani's Fields of Nihility and Śûnyatâ, and Ueda's Two-Layered-World

In the tradition of the Kyoto School, Tanabe's role has often been seen, justly or unjustly, as a less significant if albeit highly original counterpoint to Nishida. While such thinkers as Takeuchi Yoshinori and Hase Shôtô have been profoundly influenced by Tanabe's approach to Absolute Nothingness in Shin Buddhist terms of the absolute mediation of Other-power, on the other hand Nishitani, Ueda and others have drawn their primary inspiration for thinking Absolute Nothingness from Nishida's more topological approach, as well as from his primary orientation to and from Zen Buddhism. Following the lead of Nishida's own creative appropriation of Tanabe's critique of his middle-period philosophy of place, subsequent Kyoto School figures have often tended to incorporate Tanabe's dialectical thinking into, rather than seeing it as a replacement for, Nishida's topological thinking of Absolute Nothingness.

Tanabe's method of thinking was intensely dialectical, a method he developed through his prolonged study of Hegel. Nishitani, on the other hand, began his study of Western thought by focusing on Bergson, Schelling, Nietzsche and the German Mystics. Between 1937 and 1939, Nishitani studied with Heidegger, who was at the time beginning to grapple with the question of nihilism, and whose phenomenology had developed into a thinking of the “clearing of being” or what he would later characterize as a “topology of being” (Heidegger 1975, Vol. 15, 335). Influenced no doubt in part by his contact with Heidegger (and perhaps in turn influencing Heidegger, who frequently invited him to his house to learn about Zen), Nishitani developed, in his own highly original manner, existential and phenomenological aspects of Nishida's topology of Absolute Nothingness.

The problem of nihilism gradually became the major focus of Nishitani's personal and scholarly attention. The historical phenomenon of nihilism was understood by Nishitani in terms of a vacuous nothingness that assaults the modern world, a world bereft of its ethical and religious moorings. Despite the profundity of his mentor Nishida's philosophy, it failed to adequately address this crucial modern problem. According to Nishitani, Nishida's philosophy, whether it be his early thought of “pure experience” or the later notion of “active-intuition,” begins already from a standpoint where the dualistic consciousness of the ego has already been broken though (see NKC IX 247–48; Nishitani 1991, 184–85). For his part, Nishitani was concerned with the question of how to think the topological pathway leading to such a breakthrough to non-duality.

The question of how to open up an existential pathway to the place of Absolute Nothingness was particularly acute given the prevalence of the pendulum swing between two extremes endemic to modernity: on the one hand, an extreme reification of the subjective ego together with a corresponding objectification and technological manipulation of things; and, on the other hand, a reactive nihilism which threatens to nullify the very reality of both the self and things. For Nishitani, humanism and science were incapable of overcoming this dilemma of reification/nullification; in fact, they had helped create it. In an age of secular egoism and nihilism, how could an experience of the place of Absolute Nothingness take place?

To begin with, we must heed the call of Nietzsche's madman and cease fleeing from the experience of nihilism. God as the highest being is dead, and it remains an open question whether he can be reborn as Absolute Nothingness. In any case, the venture of Nishitani's philosophy of Zen is more concerned with the existential imperative of letting go of attachments than it is with immediately grasping hold of a new concept for God. In order to finally free humans from their egoistic obsessions and manipulative objectifications in the experiential “field of being and consciousness,” Nishitani argued for the necessity of first boldly stepping back into the “field of nihility.”

Yet the real breakthrough to a non-dualistic reaffirmation of the self and the world only occurs when the relative nothingness of nihility is in turn broken through to a genuine experience of Absolute Nothingness or true Emptiness on the “field of śûnyatâ.” Nishitani thus explained the personal encounter with nihilism as an experience of the extreme relative nothingness of “nihility” or “vacuous nothingness” (kyomu), and for him the central task of “overcoming nihilism by passing through nihilism” entailed transgressing beneath (i.e., “trans-descending”) the “field of nihility” to the “field of śûnyatâ” (see NKC X, 109 and 122ff.; Nishitani 1986, 97 and 108ff.).[16] As mentioned earlier (section 3.2), the “field of śûnyatâ” is not a vacuum of relative nothingness that assaults beings from without; it is an open clearing wherein beings are neither nullified nor reified, but rather let be in the mutual freedom of their coming to be and passing away.

While Nishitani's “field of śûnyatâ” (kû no ba) corresponds in many respects to what Nishida calls the “place of Absolute Nothingness” (zettai-mu no basho), Nishitani takes the peculiar problems that beset the modern secular and technological world, as well as postmodern critiques of metaphysics and subjectivity (especially those of Nietzsche and Heidegger), far more seriously than did Nishida. Nishitani also connects his thought much more closely with the tradition of Mahâyâna Buddhism than did Nishida, explicitly writing on, and writing from, what he calls the “standpoint of Zen” (see NKC XI).

Ueda Shizuteru—a student of Nishitani who has since the 1980s been at the center of the revival of Nishida studies—also takes a topological, phenomenological, and existential approach to the idea of Absolute Nothingness; and he too explicitly orients himself to and from the standpoint of Zen. Following in the tradition of the Kyoto School's dialogue with Western philosophers, in one of his influential works Ueda engages the work of Husserl, Heidegger and other phenomenologists to articulate a religiously charged philosophy of what he calls “twofold being-in-the-world” (nijûsekainaisonzai).

While the first layer in which the self is located is the historical horizon of the everyday life-world, this horizon itself is ultimately found to rest in an absolutely “empty-expanse,” a place of Absolute Nothingness that both enfolds the everyday world as well as grounds the radical freedom of the individual “self-negating self” (see USS IX, 22–24 and 324ff.). Ueda finds this idea of returning, by way of absolute self-negation, to a primordial wellspring of existence that is “empty and free” (ledig und frei) in Meister Eckhart, and, in an even more rarified form, in Zen Buddhism. It is from the latter that he borrows the term “empty-expanse” (kokû) as a topological expression for śûnyatâ.

For Ueda, then, the two-layered-world is inhabited by a two-layered-self, or, more precisely, by a “self that is not a self.” The self, as being-in-the-world, ultimately realizes itself in a moment of absolute self-negation where it dies to itself and stands as a “non-ego” or “empty-being” in the “empty-expanse” which envelopes the horizonal life-world. The true self, as a self that becomes itself by passing through the absolute negation of its ego, is a two-layered being-in-and-beyond-the-world; it stands in the horizon of the world which, in turn, rests in the empty-expanse of Absolute Nothingness.

3.6 The “Self that is not a Self” and the Nothingness of Radical Subjectivity

Ueda argues that both the ego of the Cartesian cogito, as well as the non-ego (Sanskrit: anâtman; Japanese: muga) of Buddhism, must ultimately be comprehended on the basis of an understanding of the self as a repeated movement through a radical self-negation to a genuine self-affirmation. Ueda's formula for this movement is: “I, not being I, am I.” Even when one says “I am I,” if we listen closely there is a pause, a breath, between the first and the second “I.” Precisely that opening—which necessarily occurs as a moment in the ceaseless movement by which the identity of the self is constituted—is the “ecstatic space” wherein an open encounter with another person is possible.

Such a genuine encounter with another person no longer takes place simply within my, or your, or even our world-horizon. Ueda uses the greeting of the bow as a concrete example to illustrate how mutual self-negation—the emptying of all ego-centered presumptions and agendas—returns us to a communal place where we, paradoxically, share Nothing in common. “There, by way of making oneself into a Nothingness, one returns into the infinite depths of that ‘between’ where there is neither an I nor a you. … Then, when we rise again so as to come back to life anew and face one another, this becomes a matter of, as Dôgen puts it: thus am I; thus are you” (Ueda 1991, 67; see USS X, 107ff.). Open to the other, and to the empty-expanse in which together we dwell, I am I (USS X, 23–24).

Nishitani had earlier used the expression, “the self that is not a self,” to characterize the shared endeavor of Nishida and Tanabe to think “a ‘self that is not a self’ turning on the axis of Absolute Nothingness” (NKC IX, 238; Nishitani 1991, 175). The idea of the true self as a “self that is not a self” expresses an essential aspect of what Nishida and other Kyoto School thinkers call—following D. T. Suzuki, who in turn gleaned the idea from the Diamond Sutra—the “logic of soku-hi,” a logic of “is and is not” or affirmation by way of negation (see Akizuki 1996, 109–152; NKZ XI, 398–99; Nishida 1987, 70). The self finds its most originary freedom, and its most open engagement with others, through a radical self-negation which returns it, not to a higher Will or encompassing Being, but to an essentially self-negating Absolute Nothingness that, in turn, finds expression only in the interaction of truly self-determining individuals. For Nishida, the true individual is an interpersonal self-determining focal point of the self-determination of Absolute Nothingness, in other words, an interactive and creative element in a creative world (see NKZ VIII, 343ff.).

Nishitani's first book, The Philosophy of Radical Subjectivity, sought a more originary conception of the human subject than had been developed in modern Western philosophy. In general, for Nishitani, modern “subjectivity” remains bound by a reifying attachment to things and ultimately to the ego. Nishitani did recognized certain advances in the direction of a truly “radical subjectivity” in modern ideas such as that of individual “autonomy.” For example, the Kantian idea of the ethical “person,” which opens itself to a universal standpoint by way of a negation of the self-will of the ego, suggested for Nishitani a “kind of standpoint of ‘non-ego’” (see NKC I, 60). However, the autonomy of the Kantian ethical subject can also be seen as asserting a sublated form of self-will, namely in its will to form as well as to conform to the universal. Nishitani finds profounder intimations of a truly radical subjectivity in both Meister Eckhart's mystical theology and Nietzsche's radical atheism, which each in their own way go beyond, or dig beneath, attachments to and sublations of egoity. Ultimately Nishitani returns to the language of Zen Buddhism to express his conception of the “radical subjectivity of non-ego [muga]” as a “subjective Nothingness” (shutai-teki mu) (NKC I, 88).

This radical subjective Nothingness is not to be confused with the relative nothingness of a “subjective consciousness” which sets itself over against, and objectifies, the world. As with Zen's kôan of Nothingness (mu), a realization of the radical subjectivity of non-ego (mu-ga) entails breaking through the dualistic barrier that artificially separates self and world. For Nishitani, this breakthrough is expressed as “the self-awareness of the bottom dropping out” (NKC I, iii). It is a radical return, or “trans-descendence,” to “the background of our own selves,” to the Ungrund on which we originally possess “not a single thing” (mu-ichi-motsu) (NKC XI, 243).

With Nishitani's conception of a radical “subjective Nothingness,” understood as a “standpoint of śûnyatâ” realized on the “field of śûnyatâ,” we find an explicit appropriation of both the psychological and the meontological (or mu-logical) paradigms of Nothingness found in the traditions of East Asian. The notions of non-ego (muga) and “no-mind” or “mind of Nothingness” (mushin) are thought in terms of the spontaneous openness of the heart-mind which stands within the field of Emptiness, an open place which grants beings the free space for their unobstructed (muge) interactivity.

As we have seen, Nishida, Nishitani, and Ueda each conceived of Absolute Nothingness in both an existential and a topological sense. Although Tanabe eschewed the topological conception of Absolute Nothingness, by understanding both the relative self and the Absolute in terms of a ceaseless movement of affirmation by way of radical negation, he too, in his own way, philosophically appropriated the East Asian paradigms of psychological and meontological Nothingness.

4. Political Ventures and Misadventures

As we have seen, the philosophical stakes involved in the Kyoto School's thought are high—indeed they invite us to rethink some of our most basic concepts and ways of experiencing the world and ourselves. For this very reason Kyoto School thinkers promise to be especially valuable partners in any post-Eurocentric forum of philosophical dialogue. Genuine philosophy, after all, thrives on the opportunity to call its fundamental presuppositions into question. Unfortunately, however, the world of politics tends to be a far less “dialogical” forum of intercultural relations. The history of Western imperial domination of Asia is well documented (see Panikkar 1969). Yet, in the field of Kyoto School studies, just as often criticized are the purported contributions of these thinkers in the 1930s and early 1940s to the political ideology of the Japanese Empire. However, we need to carefully examine whether and to what extent the political thought of the Kyoto School is deserving of its tainted reputation in this regard.

4.1 The Razor's Edge of “Cooperative Resistance”

The political ventures and misadventures of philosophers—from Socrates and Plato to Marx and Heidegger in the West, and from Confucius and Hanfeizi to Gandhi and Nishida in the East—represent an enduring and frequently problematic aspect of the histories of thought. Relating the “ideal” world of philosophy to the “real” world of political action is a perilous, if arguably obligatory, undertaking.

The pitfalls of political intervention are particularly deep when philosophers find themselves in a nation headed down a road toward injustice and disaster. What is a philosopher to do in such a situation? Barring straightforward complicity, there appear to be three choices: withdraw into reclusion, stand up in overt resistance, or negotiate a reorientation by means of immanent critique or cooperative correction. While many intellectuals in wartime Japan took the first course, a number of courageous Leftists braved the second course. Both Tosaka Jun and Miki Kiyoshi, the central members of the so-called “left wing of the Kyoto School,” died in prison in 1945 as a result of their intellectual resistance. The majority of the Kyoto School thinkers, however, including Nishida, Tanabe, and Nishitani, took the third course of action.

In retrospect Nishitani wrote: “My attempt was, on the one hand, to explain where Japan was situated within the world to those intellectuals remaining on the sidelines [of politics]; and, on the other hand, with respect to the extremely nationalistic thought that was becoming increasingly prevalent at the time, I attempted from within to open up a path for overcoming this extreme nationalism” (NKC IV, 384). Rather than either stand up and die, or sit out and wait, Nishitani and other members of the Kyoto School attempted to walk the razor's edge of what Ôhashi Ryôsuke has called “anti-establishment cooperation” or “cooperative resistance” (hantaiseiteki kyôryoku) (see Ôhashi 2001, 20ff.).

To be sure, the question of how successfully the Kyoto School managed to carry out this “cooperative resistance” (and the question of whether they cooperated more than resisted, or vice versa) is debatable, especially given the fact that they hardly succeeded in altering the disastrous orientation of the regime. Their intentions of cooperative resistance notwithstanding, the fact is that their political writings were more successfully co-opted by the very extreme nationalism that they were trying to reorient or overcome from within. Nevertheless, we must take care to separate their ideals from the reality they were attempting to influence, and bear in mind the constraints of their chosen path of critique from within.

Whatever their failings, it is clear that certain crudely one-sided condemnations are at least as simplistic and misleading as are the occasional attempts of overzealous acolytes to whitewash everything that was ever said and done by a Kyoto School forefather. It is, for example, highly misleading to refer to the Kyoto School's philosophy of history as “a thinly disguised justification … for Japanese aggression and continuing imperialism,” or to claim that “no group helped defend the state more consistently and enthusiastically … and none came closer … to defining the philosophic contours of Japanese fascism” (Najita/Harootunian 1998, 238–39; for a severe critique of such polemical claims, see Parkes 1997). The latter dishonor, namely that of attempting to give quasi-philosophical expression to Japanese fascism, surely goes to the proponents of “Imperial Way Philosophy,” who in fact harshly attacked the “world-historical philosophy” of the Kyoto School for being insufficiently Japan-centric (see Ôhashi 2001, 71–72).

Judicious critics of the wartime political writings of the Kyoto School must surely try to steer a middle course between and beyond what James Heisig aptly calls the “side-steppers and the side-swipers” (see Heisig 1990, 14). With this balance in mind, in the following sections let me highlight some of the key points and episodes of the Kyoto School's wartime political ventures and misadventures.

4.2 Nishida's Reluctant “War over Words” and his Ambivalent Universalism

In 1943 Yatsugi Kazuo, a member of the Center for National Strategy, approached Nishida and asked him to contribute a scholarly account of Japan's role in East Asia, that is, to help provide a rationale for the creation of the so-called “Greater East Asia Co-Prosperity Sphere.” Nishida is said to have burst out in anger, shouting something like: “What on earth do government officials and militarists think these days, that scholars are like artisans from whom they can order something to be tailor made?” And yet Yatsugi apparently countered to the effect that not only prominent Japanese scholars, such as Fukuzawa Yukichi, but also Western philosophers, such as Kant and Adam Smith, did not neglect to apply their theoretical insights to practical social and political circumstances (see Ôhashi 2001, 47). In the end Nishida did agree to write an essay, “Principles for a New World Order” (NKZ XII, 426–434; see Arisaka 1996), though his original text had to be edited and “simplified” by a sociologist serving as a go-between. Nishida was even then disappointed that his attempt to “bring out the dimension of universality present in the Japanese spirit” seemed to have had no effect on Prime Minister Tôjô Hideki and his bellicose regime (see Yusa 1994, 124).

From today's vantage point, Nishida's political writings appear highly ambivalent. On the one hand, his resistance to fascism and totalitarianism is unmistakable. Indeed it comes as no surprise that he was in danger of being arrested—and apparently only his public stature and the fact that he had influential sympathizers within the moderate ranks of the government kept this from happening—when one reads the warning given in his 1941 speech directly to the emperor: “Any totalitarian system that negates outright the role of the individual is but an anachronism” (NKZ XII, 271; see Yusa 1994, 111). Even in his most compromised text, “Principles for a New World Order,” Nishida urgently claims that the “co-prosperity sphere” must not entail either ethnocentrism, expansionism, imperialism, colonialism, or totalitarianism (see NKZ XII, 432–33). Elsewhere Nishida made clear that his vision was of a multicultural world where neither the West would subsume the East, nor vice versa (NKZ XIV, 404–5), where “various cultures, while maintaining their own individual standpoints, would develop themselves through the mediation of the world” (NKZ VII, 452–53).

On the other hand, Nishida did see a special role for the nation—and in particular for the Japanese nation with the emperor at its spiritual center—in the historical formation of this truly “worldly world” (sekai-teki sekai). Moreover, in his writings he did affirmatively employ such problematic phrases as “all the world under one roof” (hakkô-ichiu) and the “imperial way” (kôdô). While there is certainly room for criticism here in light (and hindsight) of the historical record of Japan's political and cultural “leadership” in Asia at this time, the issue of how to critically evaluate Nishida's theoretical interventions is complicated by the hermeneutical fact that today we read such catchwords and phrases through the semantic lenses of the right wing ideologues who in the end succeeded in carving their definitions into the annals of history. It must be kept in mind that, at the time, the precise meaning of these phrases was still in dispute. Ueda Shizuteru has aptly spoken of Nishida's “tug-of-war over meaning,” a struggle which he ultimately lost (Ueda 1994, 97; also see Goto-Jones 2005). Yusa Michiko writes in this regard: “Rather than invent a new vocabulary that would rise above the fray, [Nishida] took up the jargon and slogans of the day and sought to redeem them from their petty provincialism by opening them up to a more universal perspective” (Yusa 1994, 131).

Nevertheless, even after we have carried out a hermeneutically sensitive reconstruction of the context, and after we have finished reading between and behind the lines of his political texts, there no doubt remain a number of controversial aspects of Nishida's political thought. Affirming the central place of the emperor in Japan as “an identity of contradictions,” Nishida cryptically writes: “Our [i.e., Japan's] national polity is not simply a totalitarianism. The Imperial House is the beginning and the end of our world, as the absolute present that embraces past and future” (NKZ XII, 430).[17] And with regard to the central role of Japan in Asia, he claims that “in order to build a particular world, a central figure that carries the burden of the project is necessary. In East Asia today there is no other but Japan” (NKZ XII, 429; Arisaka 1996, 102).

Critics may argue that Nishida's universalism is still plagued by an exemplary particularism,[18] and that he succeeds in questioning Eurocentrism only by way of shifting the locus of the concrete universal to Japan. Yoko Arisaka argues that “the chief claim of the defenders—that Nishida's philosophical ‘universalism’ is incompatible with nationalist ideology—fails because universalist discourse was used both as a tool of liberation and oppression in Japan's case” (Arisaka 1999, 242). Arisaka critically adds, however, that “the idea that a particular nation may be the bearer of a universal principle, such as freedom or democracy, and that, therefore, its actions in history serve a higher end, should be familiar from recent American experience” (ibid., 244; also see Maraldo 1994, 355).

To be fair to Nishida, we should confess that we today have yet to solve the post-Enlightenment aporia of how to reconcile universal humanism with cultural particularity (a debate we inherit in part from the Kant-Herder controversy). In other words, the question remains of how to configure a multicultural world of dialogue instead of either an imperialistic monoculture or a clash of civilizations. In our search for an answer to this urgent question, we may indeed have much yet to learn from a critical appropriation of Nishida's thought (see Feenberg 1995; Maraldo 1995; Dallmayr 1996; Davis 2001; and Goto-Jones 2005).

4.3 Two Controversial Wartime Symposia, and Nishitani's Nation of Non-Ego

Nishida's ambivalent political stance—between a post-imperialistic cosmopolitan vision on the one hand, and an affirmation of Japan's destined world-historical role in realizing this vision on the other—was taken up into even more entangled political engagements by his students Nishitani Keiji, Kôyama Iwao, Kôsaka Masaaki, Suzuki Shigetaka, and to a lesser extent Shimomura Toratarô. As mentioned above, a significant, if stigmatizing, stage in the formation of the identity of the Kyoto School involved the participation of several of its members in two wartime symposia, the Literary World's 1942 symposium on “Overcoming Modernity” (reprinted in Kawakami/Takeuchi 1979) and the 1941–43 roundtable discussions published in the pages of Chûôkôron and later as a monograph, The World-Historical Standpoint and Japan (Kôsaka et al 1943).

The Overcoming Modernity symposium has been aptly characterized as “a premature challenge to the questions that have yet to be answered today” (Minamoto 1994, 200). Even one of the most critical recent accounts of this symposium—an account which argues that the “only destination reached by the symposium on overcoming modernity was the place where Japan itself had been overcome by modernity”—concedes that: “It is, nevertheless, important to point out that the very critique mounted by Japanese against modernity prefigured precisely all of those doubts and obsessions concerning subjectivity, cultural difference, and even racism that have become the signatures of a Western and putatively global discourse that marks our own historical conjuncture today” (Harootunian 2000, 94).

As discussed above (section 2.2), the Kyoto School participants spoke of an overcoming of modernity that can take place only by way of passing through modernity, a stance that represented a countertendency to the simple rejection of modern Western rationality by the Japanese Romantic School and other participants in the symposium. In other words, the Kyoto School participants did not lament the modernization/Westernization of Japan, nor did they nostalgically plea for a return to a pre-modern age; rather, they called for a further step forward, but one that would involve creatively recovering viable elements of Japanese tradition at the same time as building on the best of what could be learned from the West. This stance shows up clearly in Nishitani's debate with Kobayashi Hideo, who argued for a rejection of modernity and a return to the pre-modern Japanese classics (see Kawakami/Takeuchi 1979, 217ff.). Throughout his career Nishitani consistently spoke of overcoming of modernity only by way of passing through it, and in this process tradition was to be creatively appropriated, not conservatively retreated to. As he later wrote: “There is no turning back to the way things were. … Our tradition must be appropriated from the direction in which we are heading, as a new possibility” (NKC VIII, 183; Nishitani 1990, 179); and: “Simply put, the backward looking return to tradition is straightaway to be forward looking” (NKC XIX, 104; see Davis 2004a, 144ff.).

In the Chûôkôron discussions as well the Kyoto School resolutely attempted to think from the “standpoint of world history.” Problematically, however, they asserted a leadership role for Japan in the present moment, which they viewed as a turning point in world history. If the standpoint of world history had indeed been first opened up by both Western universalism and imperialism, it was the non-Western nation of Japan that was purportedly in a unique position to free the world from the chains of the latter in order to realize the true potential of the former.

In his book written around the same time, View of the World and the Nation, Nishitani went so far as to claim that this was the moment in time where the “focal point of world history” was to become the Japanese nation, just as previously world history had centered on the Roman Empire and then later on the British Empire. However, Nishitani argued that unlike the former two empires, Japan's historical mission was to bring about a world that has “no specific center” but rather consists of various “politically and culturally unified spheres” (NKC IV, 298–300). The Japanese nation would be able to carry out this mission, he crucially adds, only if it incorporates a religious moment of self-negation, thus becoming what he calls a “nation of non-ego” rather than a self-centered aggressive empire (NKC IV, 285–86). In this idealistic vision, which unfortunately had little to do with the cruel realities of Japanese expansionism, Japan was to be an altogether new kind of empire, a self-negating and compassionate one that would help other nations to cooperatively form their own identities, rather than an aggressive and “imperialistic” one that would remold others into inferior replicas of itself. (It remains for us to ask how best to characterize today's political superpowers and economic empires, and how to relate their ideologies to their realities.)

If there is a lasting merit to Nishitani's wartime political writings and the Chûôkôron discussions, it might be found in part in their critique of the contradictions and hypocrisies of Western imperialism (see, for example, Kôsaka et al. 1943, 348ff.), together with their insistence that Japan's “leading role” in Asia not become that of an imperialist or colonizer (see ibid., 204–5; also see Nishitani's “My View of ‘Overcoming Modernity’,” reprinted in Kawakami/Takeuchi 1979, 32). The lasting infamy of the Chûôkôron discussions, on the other hand, can be found not only in their general political naïveté, but also in their idealization and even “whitewashing” of political realities, as well as in such disturbing specific suggestion as that of “Japanizing” or “half-Japanizing” some of the “more superior” ethnic groups in Asia in order to assist in instituting the Japanese led “Co-Prosperity Sphere” (Kôsaka et al. 1943, 262–63, 337).

4.4 The “Ôshima Memos”: Record of a Think Tank for Navy Moderates

It has recently been made evident that the political activities of the Kyoto School during the war were even more involved—and even more filled with ambiguity—than was previously thought. Ôhashi Ryôsuke discovered and published in 2001 some wartime notebooks of Ôshima Yasuma, a student of Tanabe. These notebooks document in detail secret meetings regularly held by Kyoto School members at the bequest of the Japanese navy between February 1942 and just before the end of the war (Ôhashi 2001). While on the one hand the existence of these secret meetings demonstrates the existence of an even more intimate connection between the Kyoto School and the military than was previously known, on the other hand it is crucially significant that they were in cooperation with a certain moderate faction of the navy, a faction that was opposed to the extremists that dominated the army. There had long existed a significant tension between the bellicose arrogance of the army and the comparatively more moderate and worldly stance of the navy. As the politically more powerful army was setting a war-bound course for Pearl Harbor, some reticent navy officials evidently petitioned the Kyoto School to shed light on the political situation from their “world-historical standpoint,” presumably in order to sway public sentiment in a more prudent direction.

In short, the “Ôshima Memos” help reveal how the Kyoto School found themselves in a position where they were called on to fight a “war of thought” on two fronts: against Western imperialism, they felt themselves called on to determine a world-historical role for Japan in freeing itself and other Asian peoples from colonization and exploitation by the Western empires; and, against Japanese ultra-nationalism, they felt that it was up to them to convince the public and the military of the illegitimacy of an imperialistic response to the problem of imperialism.

Ôshima Yasuma had in fact previously published, in 1965, an often overlooked account of these meetings under the title, “The Pacific War and the Kyoto School: On the Political Participation of Intellectuals” (Ôshima 2000, 274–304; also see Horio 1994, 301ff.). In this article Ôshima summarized the purpose of the secret Kyoto School meetings in three stages: In the very first meetings (which apparently took place prior to those documented in the recovered notebooks), the main theme was “how to avoid the outbreak of war.” Since war in fact broke out very soon thereafter, the theme quickly switched to “how to bring the war to a favorable end as soon as possible, by way of rationally convincing the army.” To do this the Kyoto School reportedly agreed that it would be necessary to overthrow the cabinet of Tôjô Hideki. However, according to Ôshima, all criticism of Tôjô and the army had to be expurgated in the discussions published in the pages of Chûôkôron, and the expressions of the Kyoto School had to be “veiled in two or three layers of cloth” in order to avoid censorship and persecution. Towards the end of the war, the theme of the secret meetings is said to have changed to that of “how to handle the postwar situation.”

Among these three themes only the second is recorded in any detail in the notebooks that were recently discovered and published by Ôhashi as the “Ôshima Memos.” Although there may well have been preliminary discussions on how to avoid war, more explicit references to overthrowing Tôjô Hideki, and more lengthy discussions about postwar issues, these do not in fact show up in the recovered notebooks. Nevertheless, the “Ôshima Memos” do show us a more detailed and uncensored account of the “war of thought” on two fronts during a tumultuous and tragic time of what was, in fact, Japan's imperialistic response to the threat of imperialism.

4.5 After the War: Tanabe's Metanoetic Turn and Nishitani's Other Cheek

Their ambivalent wartime stance between supporting the nationalistic ideology and subjecting it to a cosmopolitan critique—in other words, their attempt to walk a razor's edge of “cooperative resistance”—ironically earned the Kyoto School a suspect reputation in Japan both before and after the end of the war. As Nishitani confided later to a student: “During the war we were struck on the cheek from the right; after the war we were struck on the cheek from the left.”

During the war, the stance of the Kyoto School was considered too cosmopolitan and insufficiently nationalistic, even anti-war. The discussions published in The World-Historical Standpoint and Japan were branded by the “Imperial Way” ideologues as “ivory-tower speculations that risked reducing the Empire to simply one more category of world history,” and further printings of the book were reportedly stopped by the government censors (see Horio 1994, 291). After the war, the Kyoto School's idealistic attempts to impart meaning and direction to Japan's “world historical mission” were seen—especially by the emerging Left that had at long last been freed from repression and persecution—as support for its de facto militaristic fascism. Nishitani and others were purged for several years from their university positions. Even when they were later reinstated, the stigma of the Kyoto School as having “cooperated in the war” was hardly lifted. Their political thought in particular was dismissed in toto, and it was not until decades later that the topic of “overcoming modernity” was once again given serious critical attention (see Kawakami/Takeuchi 1979; Hiromatsu 1989; and Ôhashi 1992, 143ff.).

The Kyoto School thinkers rarely directly responded to their critics after the war; and we can only speculate on the reasons for this (see Horio 1994, 300). They accepted suspension from their posts without comment or complaint, and continued on with their philosophizing, albeit without the overtly political element of their thought. Nishitani, for example, came into his own as a philosopher of religion in the postwar era. He continued to philosophically develop Eastern ideas, those of Zen Buddhism in particular, in dialogue with medieval Christian mysticism and postmodern existentialism and phenomenology, and in response to what he saw as the central problem of modernity, namely, nihilism. In his mature attempts to “overcome nihilism by way of passing through nihilism” (NKC XX, 192), we find a marked thread of continuity with his pre-war and wartime attempts to overcome (Western) modernity by way of passing through it. But it is nevertheless possible to mark a crucial and self-critical “turn” in his thinking with regard to the question of the political role—or, as it turns out, the lack of one—to be played by the Japanese state in this overcoming of modernity and nihilism by way of passing through them (see Davis 2003).

Tanabe got a head start on the postwar critics, and towards the end of the war began thinking his way through a radical crisis of self-critique. Hardly less controversial than the roundtable discussions of the younger members of the Kyoto School have been Tanabe's application—or misapplication—of his “logic of the specific” to a discourse on the legitimacy of the self-assertion of the Japanese nation as an archetype for others. The “logic of the specific” had originally been conceived, in critique of Bergson and Nishida, as a reappraisal of the logical and ethical role that ethnic specificity plays in mediating the particular individual and universal humanity. Adapting Hegel's political philosophy, Tanabe thought that the nation state could both embody the ethnic specificity of the people and raise it out of its inherent irrationality. As a concrete universal, the nation was, if not the Absolute itself, in some sense the dialectical manifestation of the
Absolute on earth.

The critical lapse came when Tanabe irrationally proposed that the “relative absolute” of the Japanese nation could serve as a kind of “supreme archetype” for other nations (see THZ VI, 232–33). James Heisig writes that, in so doing, Tanabe “took a step that was fatal but really unnecessary, if not outright inconsistent with the principles of his logic…. According to his own logic, the community of the human race is to be made up of a community of nations that have found a way to transcend their specificity without transcending time and culture. Each nation may come about as an instance of the generic universal, but nothing in the logic of the specific allows any one instance to become an archetype for the others. It is as if Tanabe were quoting himself out of context” (Heisig 2001, 136–37; also see Heisig 1994).

Tanabe finally came to his senses and, in a striking metanoetic turn, renounced these political assertions and dove into the philosophy of religion. Philosophy as Metanoetics, the first parts of which were delivered as lectures before the end of the war in 1944, was composed not only as a personal self-critique, but also as a call to self-critique on the part of the entire nation, and indeed ultimately as a call for an “absolute critique” of human rationality as such (see the Preface to THZ X; Tanabe 1986). It is the last of these that is the central theme of the book: the idea that the human reason is inevitably driven to antinomies through which it must repeatedly die to its own self-power in order to be reborn again through the workings of an Other-power. It is nevertheless true that “one looks through that work in vain for any admission of guilt for particular actions or statements that he had made” (Heisig 2001, 151). In any case, Tanabe's open (if vague) repentance was no more successful than the silence of other Kyoto School thinkers in convincing the majority of postwar Japanese academics to refrain from throwing out the baby of their philosophical insights with the bathwater of their political misadventures.

Only in the past two or three decades has the reputation of the Kyoto School begun to be significantly rehabilitated in Japan, due in part to a general recovery of the nation from immersion in the march of postwar economic progress and evasion of unresolved cultural aporias, in part to a general reaffirmation of cultural identity (including all too often a pendulum swing back to reassertion of “Japanese uniqueness”), and in part to the positive attention the School has received from the West. It is worthwhile noting, as Fujita Masakatsu does in his preface to The Philosophy of the Kyoto School, that prior to 2001 surprisingly few articles or books had appeared in Japan with a thematic focus on the “Kyoto School” as such, even though hundreds of studies had treated “Nishida Philosophy.” Yet there are promising signs that we are standing on the brink of a new academic era in which critical yet appreciative work on the Kyoto School can be cooperatively undertaken in Japan, in the West, and recently even in other parts of East Asia (see Fujita et al. 2003; Heisig 2004; Synthesis Philosophica 2004; and Fujita/Davis 2005).

Despite the persistence of a faction of polemical intellectual historians, perhaps we are reaching a point where philosophers worldwide are beginning to see the political misadventures of the Kyoto School as questionable footnotes to their central philosophical endeavors, rather than the other way around. While research into their political thought—regarding what it tried to say then and regarding what it can or cannot help us to think today—remains necessary and important, at the end of the day many are likely to agree with James Heisig when he emphatically writes: “One has…to ignore the greatest bulk of the writings of these thinkers to arrive at the conclusion that anything approaching or supporting the imperialistic ideology of wartime Japan belongs to the fundamental inspiration of their thought” (Heisig 2001, 6). The philosophical and cross-cultural legacy of the Kyoto School lies elsewhere.

5. The Cross-Cultural Legacy of the Kyoto School

5.1 Between or Beyond East and West?

In this concluding section, let us return to the question of the legacy of the Kyoto School with regard to comparative or cross-cultural philosophy. As mentioned at the outset, the Kyoto School thinkers were all dedicated scholars of various fields and figures of Western philosophy; and yet, at the same time they kept one foot firmly in touch with their native East Asian traditions, those of Mahâyâna Buddhism in particular. This bipedal stance placed them in an extraordinary position “between East and West.”

However, their philosophies do not simply drift impartially on the seas of academic comparison, nor do they see themselves as primarily mediators of inter-religious dialogue. As existentially engaged philosophers, they are above all seekers after truth, and they argue passionately for the validity of seeing the self and the world in certain ways. As we have seen, while each member of the Kyoto School has his own vision of the truth, they share certain fundamental ideas, such as one or another version of the core notion of Absolute Nothingness and the idea of coming to a genuine self-awareness by way of emptying the ego. And however much the methods and contents of their texts do indeed reflect their intimate dialogue with, and critical appropriation of Western philosophy, one could well argue that many of their fundamental theses nevertheless reflect a predominantly Eastern influence.

To be sure, this does not mean that they merely gave modern expression to traditional East Asian Buddhist thought. It would be less inaccurate to say that their philosophies are critical and creative developments of that tradition. But even this way of putting it would not do justice to the substantial (i.e., not just formal) influence on their thought by the Western philosophies with which they grappled so intensely. Although Hisamatsu, Nishitani, and Ueda do explicitly philosophize from the standpoint of Zen, and although Takeuchi, Hase, and others do so from the standpoint of Shin Buddhism, it would be misleading to simply and without qualification characterize either Nishida's or Tanabe's multifaceted philosophies as “Eastern” or “Buddhist.”

For example, Tanabe's early “logic of the specific,” with its concern for the manner in which irrational ethnic specificity mediates the particular individual and universal humanity, can be read more as a critical appropriation of Hegelian dialectical logic and political philosophy than as a straightforward development of Eastern or Buddhist thought. And in his various later writings on the philosophy of religion, Tanabe wavers between a preference for Shin Buddhism, Christianity, and finally Zen Buddhism (see Himi 1990, 129–341). With regard to Nishida, an acute concern with questions of epistemology, logic, individual autonomy, creativity, and the historicity of the world are essential to his thought in ways that are more “modern Western” than “traditional Eastern”; and Nishida at times explicitly indicates his dissatisfaction with what he sees as related weaknesses in traditional Buddhist thought.

Nevertheless, one might respond: even if Nishida methodologically takes his questions from Western philosophy, his responses to these questions reflect his East Asian roots at least as much as his Western studies. To the Western ontological question of being, his answer is a meontology of Absolute Nothingness. And even if his systematic philosophical articulations of the idea of Absolute Nothingness owe more to Western than Eastern texts, he nevertheless understands himself to have autonomously (i.e., in the process of engaging in a nonsectarian philosophical search for truth) given expression to the Formless that is harbored in the traditions of the East. In retrospect Nishida wrote: “It is not that I conceived of my way of thinking in dependence on Mahâyâna Buddhism; and yet it has come into accord with it” (NKZ XIV, 408). Nishitani might say something similar of his career through the study of Western philosophy and mysticism and “back” to the standpoint of Zen. Other Kyoto School thinkers took even less of an Occidental excursion before making what Hölderlin called a “homecoming though the foreign.” And some, like Hisamatsu and Takeuchi, began their scholarly pursuits with a self-understanding as a Zen or Shin Buddhist thinker.

What is perhaps most provocative, and questionable, from a cross-cultural politics point of view, is Nishida's and other Kyoto School thinkers' suggestion that it is modern Japanese culture and philosophy that, to some extent uniquely, has the potential to be developed so as to make room for the cooperative meeting of the strengths of East and West (see NKZ XIV, 416–17; also Nishida 1964, 365). What are we to make of such bold claims? There appear to be two problematic assertions involved: first, an overly generalized, if not at times hypostatized, split of cultural spheres into “East” and “West”; and second, a claim that an idea with deeper roots in the East, namely Absolute Nothingness, can be developed so as to provide the philosophical meeting place of both East and West.[19]

The Kyoto School's occasionally sweeping division of cultures spheres into “East” and “West” no doubt both reveals and conceals as much as does, for example, Heidegger's claim that the entire Western tradition is uniquely founded on philosophy as onto-theology, and that the expression “Western philosophy” is therefore a tautology (Heidegger 1956, 6).[20] Even sympathetic readers of the Kyoto School are often highly critical of this type of comparative thinking in terms of “East” and “West.” Although he affirms that “the Kyoto-school philosophers give the west a way into the east like none other,” James Heisig complains that “the East” which the Kyoto School sets up over against “the West” was something of an invention: “At best, it is one constellation of a heritage too long and too plural to be represented fairly by Japan” (Heisig 2001, 271–72). John Maraldo goes further and claims that “the problems Nishida deals with are universal, and his way of dealing with them contrasts as much with other Asian philosophers as with philosophers of the so-called West” (Maraldo 1995, 196). Is it necessary and are we ready to do as Maraldo suggests, and “put ‘East’ and ‘West’ to rest”?

I myself am highly ambivalent regarding this complex issue. While I certainly agree with the wish to avoid overgeneralizations and politically charged polarizations, and while I think the writings of the Kyoto School do need to be read critically in this regard, I am equally wary of a “globalization of thought” that amounts to a colonization of “non-Western” traditions by “Western” methods and categories of thinking. I also continue to believe that the threads of the Greco-Roman-Judeo-Christian-Euro-American tradition are woven tightly enough to warrant provisionally and in certain contexts speaking of “the West.” It is true that “the East” may be a less tightly woven tradition or set of traditions, especially from the perspective of India (which, of course, did not appropriate Chinese traditions the way China appropriated Buddhism). From Japan's perspective, however, especially from a Japanese Buddhist perspective which intimately weaves together Indo-Sino-Japanese threads, it may indeed make sense provisionally and in certain contexts to speak in terms of “the East.”

We cannot think without abstractions, and it is no doubt a matter of “practical wisdom” (phronesis) to know when to construct and when to deconstruct generalizations. Thus, even though we must be careful to discern the appropriate contexts in which it makes sense to speak in such vast categories, it is no more advisable to unequivocally annihilate the categories of “West” and “East” than it is to narrowly define or absolutize their respective coherences and mutual differences.

With regard to the hermeneutics of modern cross-cultural thinking, in general I believe that the attempt to completely flatten out the borders that separate cultural differences is as pernicious as the attempt to hermetically seal them up. Of course, this goes for intra- as well as inter-traditional differences. Needless to say, defining, comparing, contrasting, and above all evaluating the relative worth of various traditions, remain undertakings fraught with theoretical, ethical and political pitfalls. The theoretical and cultural legacies of colonialism and Orientalism remain with us long after the political Empires have receded. Moreover, in these postcolonial times we all too often see reactive fabrications of identity and assertions of counter-superiority, reactions which ironically reinforce the same kind of colonial divisions and obsessions with unadulterated self-identity that were imposed by, or imported from, the worst of the West.

In Japan, certain retroactive constructions of identity and reactive counter-assertions of superiority have taken the form of what is called nihonjin-ron or theories of “Japaneseness” or “Japanese uniqueness” (see Dale 1986). In modern Japanese history, such reactive cultural assertion has taken either the form of denying Japan's deep-rooted traditional connections with its East Asian neighbors, or the form of claiming that Japan has uniquely embodied and perfected “the essence of the East.” If the former type of claim is most in evidence in postwar and contemporary Japan, the latter is found, for example, in the Meiji thinker Okakura Tenshin's declaration that, while “Asia is one,” Japan alone is “the real repository of the trust of Asiatic thought and culture” (Okakura 2000, 1 and 5).

Where do the Kyoto School thinkers stand with respect to such culture wars? To be sure, the Chûôkôron discussions in particular often asserted that modern Japan was uniquely suited to institute and represent the “Greater East Asia Co-Prosperity Sphere,” and this undoubtedly reflected a widespread post-Meiji Japanese conflation of political, industrial, and military development with cultural superiority. Nishida also felt that modern Japan was in a rather unique political and cultural position to host a fruitful marriage of East and West, and Tanabe went so far as to set the nation of Japan up as an archetype for others. In the Kyoto School's wartime political writings, there indeed remains much grist for the mills of contemporary cultural critics, especially for those with hermeneutical blindfolds or allegedly perfect hindsight vision. Yet a critique of their political misadventures, as necessary as it is, may in fact reveal something more peripheral than central to the cross-cultural thinking of the Kyoto School. It is at least necessary to keep both eyes open: one ready to criticize and one willing to learn.

We should note that even when Nishida broadly contrasts “Western Being” with “Eastern Nothingness,” he in fact immediately goes on to explore finer distinctions between the Greek, Roman, and Judeo-Christian threads of the Western tradition, and between the Indian, Chinese, and Japanese threads of the Eastern tradition. If his essentializing or overgeneralizing of these threads does remain in various respects problematic, it is nevertheless hardly the case that he and the other Kyoto School thinkers never questioned the homogeneity of either “the East” or “the West.” Secondly, although they have been accused both of contributing to the “myth of Japanese uniqueness” and of “reverse Orientalism” (see Faure 1995), the case is far from this simple. In a time of uncritical cultural self-adulation by the Japanese ultranationalists in power, Nishida boldly urged that “both the strong points and weaknesses of our culture should be openly and honestly pointed out,” for “we cannot take any one culture and call it the culture” (Nishida 1964, 351 and 353).

Fighting a conceptual war simultaneously on two fronts, against Western and Japanese ethnocentrisms, Nishida wrote that “until now Westerners have thought that their own culture is the most superior human culture that exists, and that human culture inevitably develops in the direction of their own culture—hence, as Easterners and other peoples who are lagging behind advance forward, they must become the same as [Westerners].” Even some Japanese, he regrets, think this way. And yet, he objects, “there is something radically different in [the culture of] the East.” According to Nishida, the development of the West will subsume this difference no more than the East will subsume the West. Even if humanity does share a common root (what he calls, adapting an expression from Goethe, an “ur-culture” of multiple possibilities), the development of its branches and leaves is a matter of diversification, not homogenization. Globalization should thus be thought of, in Nishida's vision, as many branches of the same tree supplementing one other on the basis of both their deep-rooted commonality and their irreducible diversity (NKZ XIV, 402–6 and 417).

To be sure, there inevitably remains for us the question of the “place” in which this global communication between cultures should take place. But without a “view from nowhere,” can we not only ever attempt to critically and creatively take up ideas that have particular genealogies and dialogically develop them into what are provisionally more universally viable forms? Just as democracy, hermeneutics, and indeed philosophia itself have particular cultural lineages, so do the ideas of śûnyatâ, mu, and the true self as a non-ego that opens itself to an encounter with others by radically emptying itself. Nevertheless, all of these ideas may very well contribute something to an intercultural dialogue concerning the very place in which a genuine encounter between cultures and individuals can and should take place.

5.2 Japanese Philosophy in the World

It is not, then, necessarily ethnocentric for Japanese thinkers to suggest the potential efficacy of Japanese and Eastern originated ideas in a global dialogue of philosophy. The “Japanese philosophy” of the Kyoto School is best understood as a contribution to such a global dialogue, and not as a reactive opposition to philosophical Eurocentrism. We must be careful, therefore, how we understand the noun “philosophy” and the modifier “Japanese” when we speak of “Japanese philosophy.”

The Kyoto School never doubted that “philosophy,” in the narrow sense, was a cultural product of the West. But they also recognized that it, like Western science and technology, had universal implications. This does not mean that they thought Western philosophy was free of unrecognized cultural biases and limitations, or that traditional Eastern thought had nothing essential to offer the development of philosophy in a post-Eurocentric world. They recognized the difference between the potentiality and the actuality of philosophy, and their Japanese contributions aimed to make philosophy more, not less, worldly.

In an illuminating study of the debate surrounding the concept of “philosophy” in Japan since the Meiji period (1868–1912), John Maraldo has isolated four senses in which the notion of “Japanese philosophy” has been used: (1) Western philosophy as it happens to be practiced by Japanese scholars; (2) traditional Japanese thought (Confucian, Nativist, Buddhist, etc.) as it was formulated prior to the introduction of Western philosophy; (3) a form of inquiry which has methods and themes that are Western in origin, but that can be applied to pre-modern, pre-Westernized, Japanese thinking; and (4) a kind of reverse Orientalism that asserts the superiority of specifically Japanese ways of thinking.

Maraldo argues for the superior viability of the third of these conceptions, in part because it pays due hermeneutical attention to the Greek origins of the heretofore methods and themes of “philosophy.” And yet, crucially, he also stresses that the very methods and themes of philosophy are essentially always “in the making,” and that the production of “Japanese philosophy” will have to “strike a balance between reading (pre-defined) philosophy into [Japan's traditional] texts and reading alternatives out of them, constructing contrasts to that [pre-defined] philosophy [of the West]” (Maraldo 2004, 238–44). The Kyoto School in particular can be understood to have taken up the challenge of critically and creatively appropriating philosophy so as to free up for questioning many of its pre-defined Western conceptions.

A text by Ueda on Nishitani's philosophy insightfully addresses the question of the adjective, “Japanese,” as follows: “If we are to use the characterization ‘Japanese’, this does not signify merely a particularity of Japan, but rather must be understood in the sense that a certain area of universal primal human possibility has been historically realized particularly in Japan. Hence, ‘European’ does not straightaway mean ‘global’, but rather that a certain area of universal primal human possibility has been historically realized particularly in Europe. … If we understand ourselves as the particularization of something universal, this means, at the same time, that we can understand others as different particularizations of something universal. Only then, within the communication between particular and particular, can something universal come to be realized” (Ueda 1996, 309).

In this passage, which recalls Nishida's vision of communication between diversely determined branches of a shared yet indeterminate root ur-culture, Ueda gives us a clue as to how we might best understand the cross-cultural contributions of the Kyoto School. They are philosophers who strive to express something universal from a particular standpoint. But this does not at all mean that they attempt to reduce universality to their own particularity; for the latter is in turn understood as one particular expression of the formless ur-culture, the indeterminate source of possibilities for individual and cultural determination, that is to say, the originary Nothingness that we all share. The Kyoto School thus presents us with a unique set of attempts to give philosophical form to this formless wellspring of both commonality and uniqueness.

The degree to which the Kyoto School thinkers were successful in their boldly paradoxical quest to give philosophical form to the Formless can be debated. It is less easy to deny the exigency of the quest itself. If philosophy today is to mature beyond its Eurocentric pubescence, then it is necessary to deepen its quest for universality by way of radically opening it up to a diversity of cultural perspectives. If cultural pluralism, for its part, is to avoid falling into a relativistic perspectivism, it must call for a metamorphosis rather than an abandonment of the philosophical quest for universality. In any case, we should understand the thought of the Kyoto School, not as Japanese versions of philosophy, but rather as Japanese contributions to the content of—and indeed to the very formation of the forum of—a global dialogue of philosophy in the making.


Works Cited

Abbreviations Used in this Article

Other Sources Cited in this Article

Selected Kyoto School Works available in English and other Western languages

Anthologies containing works by more than one Kyoto School author. The texts contained in these anthologies are not listed here separately. (For a complete list of Western language translations of works by Nishida, Tanabe, Nishitani, Takeuchi, and Ueda, see the Nanzan Institute for Religion and Culture website listed below.)

Other Kyoto School Works

Further Reading

Special Issue Journals

Other Works

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

existentialism | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | Heidegger, Martin | Japanese Philosophy | Japanese Philosophy: Pure Land | Japanese Philosophy: Zen Buddhism | mysticism | Nishida Kitarô | phenomenology | Taoism | Watsuji Tetsurô