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The Kochen-Specker Theorem

First published Mon 11 Sep, 2000

The Kochen-Specker theorem is an important, but subtle, topic in the foundations of quantum mechanics (QM). The theorem provides a powerful argument against the possibility of interpreting QM in terms of hidden variables (HV). We here present the theorem/argument and the foundational discussion surrounding it at different levels. The reader looking for a quick overview should read the following sections and subsections: 1, 2, 3.1, 3.2, 4, and 6. Those who read the whole entry will find proofs of some non-trivial claims in supplementary documents.

§1: Introduction

QM has the peculiar property that quantum-mechanical states imply, in general, only statistical restrictions on the results of measurements. The natural conclusion to be drawn is that these states are incomplete descriptions of quantum systems. QM, thus, would be incomplete in the sense that a typical QM state description of an individual system could be supplemented with a more complete description in terms of an HV theory. In an HV description of the system the QM probabilities would be naturally interpreted as epistemic probabilities of the sort that arise in ordinary statistical mechanics. Such an HV description might not be practically useful, but one is tempted to think that it should at least be possible in principle. There are, however, two powerful theorems to the effect that such description is impossible even in principle: QM, given certain extremely plausible premises, cannot be supplemented by an HV theory. The more famous of these two theorems is Bell's theorem which states that, given a premise of locality, an HV model cannot match the statistical predictions of QM. The second important no-go theorem against HV theories is the theorem of Kochen and Specker (KS) which states that, given a premise of noncontextuality (to be explained presently) certain sets of QM observables cannot consistently be assigned values at all (even before the question of their statistical distributions arises).

Before seeing the workings of the KS theorem in some detail, we must clarify why it is of importance to philosophers of science. The explicit premise of HV interpretations is one of value definiteness:

(VD) All observables defined for a QM system have definite values at all times.
VD, however, is motivated by a more basic principle, an apparently innocuous realism about physical measurement which, initially, seems an indispensable tenet of natural science. This realism consists in the assumption that whatever exists in the physical world is causally independent of our measurements which serve to give us information about it. Now, since measurements of all QM observables, typically, yield more or less precise values, there is good reason to think that such values exist independently of any measurements - which leads us to assume VD. (Note that we do not need to assume here that the values are faithfully revealed by measurement, but only that they exist!) We can concretize our innocuous realism in a second assumption of noncontextuality:
(NC) If a QM system possesses a property (value of an observable), then it does so independently of any measurement context, i.e. independently of how that value is eventually measured.
This means that if a system possesses a given property, it does so independently of possessing other values pertaining to other arrangements. So, both our assumptions incorporate the basic idea of an independence of physical reality from its being measured.

The KS theorem establishes a contradiction between VD + NC and QM; thus, acceptance of QM logically forces us to renounce either VD or NC. However, the situation is more dramatic than it would initially seem. VD is the key motivating assumption of the HV programme in the sense that, if feasible, it would most naturally explain the statistical character of QM and most elegantly explain away the infamous measurement problem haunting all interpreters of QM [see the entries on quantum mechanics and measurement in quantum theory for details]. But, as we just saw, the second assumption NC is motivated by the same innocuous realism which embodies a standard of scientific rationality, and it is far from obvious what an interpretation obeying this standard only partly, i.e. endorsing only VD but rejecting NC, should look like. This complex of issues -- namely, (1) VD + NC contradict QM; (2) the conceptual difficulties of interpreting QM provide a strong motivation for VD; (3) it is not obvious how to come up with a plausible story about QM containing VD, but not NC -- is what fuels philosophical interest in the KS theorem.

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§2: Background to the KS Theorem

In the following, we will presuppose some familiarity with elementary QM notions like ‘state’, ‘observable’, ‘value’ and their mathematical representatives ‘vector’, ‘(self-adjoint) operator’ and ‘eigenvalue’ [see the entry on quantum mechanics for details]. We will usually identify observables and the operators on an appropriate Hilbert space which represent them; if there is a need to distinguish operators and observables, we write the operators underlined and in boldface. (Thus an operator A represents an observable A.)

The present section states some elements of the historical and systematic background of the KS theorem. Most importantly, an argument by von Neumann (1932), a theorem by Gleason (1957), and a critical discussion of both plus a later argument by Bell (1966) have to be considered. Von Neumann, in his famous 1932 book Die mathematischen Grundlagen der Quantenmechanik, disputed the possibility of providing QM with an HV underpinning. He gave an argument which boils down to the following: Consider the mathematical fact that, if A and B are self-adjoint operators, then any linear combination of them (any C = αA + βB, where α, β are arbitrary real numbers) is also a self-adjoint operator. QM further dictates that for any QM state:

(1) If A and B (represented by self-adjoint operators A and B) are observables on a system, then there also is an observable C (represented by self-adjoint operator C defined as before) on the same system.

(2) If the expectation values of A and B are given by <A> and <B>, then C's expectation value is given by <C>=α<A> + β<B>.

Now consider A, B, C, as above, and let their values be v(A), v(B), v(C). Consider a ‘hidden state’ V which determines v(A), v(B), v(C). We can then derive from V trivial ‘expectation values’ which are just the possessed values themselves: <A>V = v(A), and so on.[1] Of course, these ‘expectation values’ do not, in general, equal the QM ones: <A>V ≠ <A> (we would indeed think of the latter as averages over the former for different hidden states V!), but we require that the <A>V, like the <A>, conform to (2). This automatically entails that the values themselves must conform to a condition parallel to (2), i.e.:
(3) v(C) = αv(A) + βv(B).
This, however, is impossible, in general. An example very easily shows how (3) is violated, but because of its simplicity it also shows the argument's inadequacy. (This example is not due to von Neumann himself, but to Bell![2]) Let A = σ and B = σy, then operator C = (σ + σy)/√2 corresponds to the observable of the spin component along the direction bisecting x and y. Now all spin components have (in suitable units) possible values ±1 only, thus, the HV proponent is forced to ascribe ±1 to A, B, C as values, and thus as ‘expectation values’. This, in turn, implies (3) which obviously cannot be fulfilled, since ±1 ≠ (±1 + ±1)/√2.

The example illustrates why von Neumann's argument is unsatisfying. Nobody disputes the move from (2) to (3) for compatible observables, i.e. those which, according to QM, are jointly measurable in one arrangement. The above choice of A, B, C, however, is such that any two of them are incompatible, i.e. are not jointly observable. For these we will not want to require any HV interpretation to meet (3), but only (2). The hidden values need not conform with (3) in general, only the averages of their values in a series of tests must conform with (2). The authority of von Neumann's argument comes from the fact that requirements (1) and (2), for QM states, are consequences of the QM formalism, but this does not in itself justify extending these requirements to the hypothetical hidden states. Indeed, if (3) were unrestrictedly true, this would nicely explain, in the presence of hidden values, why (2) is. Von Neumann apparently thought that the HV proponent is committed to this explanation, but this seems an implausible restriction.

The KS theorem remedies this defect, spotted by Bell in von Neumann's argument, and thus strengthens the case against HV theories insofar as KS assume (3) only for sets of observables {A, B, C} which are all mutually compatible. The theorem requires that only for compatible observables assumption (3) must hold, which is something the HV theorist cannot reasonably deny.

A second, independent line of thought leading to the KS theorem is provided by Gleason's theorem (Gleason 1957). The theorem states that on a Hilbert space of dimension greater than or equal to 3, the only possible probability measures are the measures μ (Pα) = Tr(Pα W), where Pα is a projection operator, W is the statistical operator characterizing the system's actual state and Tr is the trace operation. The Pα can be understood as representing yes-no observables, i.e. questions concerning whether a QM system represented by a Hilbert space of dimension greater than or equal to 3 has a property α or not, and every possible property α is associated uniquely with a vector |α> in the Hilbert space -- so, the task is to unambiguously assign probabilities to all vectors in the space. Now, the QM measure μ is continuous, so Gleason's theorem in effect proves that every probability assignment to all the possible properties in a three-dimensional Hilbert space must be continuous, i.e. must map all vectors in the space continuously into the interval [0, 1]. On the other hand, an HV theory (if characterized by VD + NC) would imply that of every property we can say whether the system has it or not. This yields a trivial probability function which maps all the Pi to either 1 or 0, and, provided that values 1 and 0 both occur (which follows trivially from interpreting the numbers as probabilities), this function must clearly be discontinuous (cf. Redhead 1987: 28).

This is the easiest argument against the possibility of an HV interpretation afforded by Gleason's theorem. Bell (1966: 6-8) offers a variant with a particular twist which later is repeated as the crucial step in the KS theorem. (This explains why some authors (like Mermin 1990b) call the KS theorem the Bell-Kochen-Specker theorem; they think that the decisive idea of the KS theorem is due to Bell.[3]) He proves that the mapping μ dictates that two vectors |α> and |α′> mapped into 1 and 0 cannot be arbitrarily close, but must have a minimal angular separation, while the HV mapping, on the other hand, requires that they must be arbitrarily close.

After having offered his variant of the argument against HV theories from Gleason's theorem, Bell proceeds again to criticise it. The strategy parallels the one directed against von Neumann. Bell points out that his own Gleason-type argument against arbitrary closeness of two opposite-valued points presupposes non-trivial relations between values of non-commuting observables, which are only justified, given an assumption of noncontextuality (NC). He proposes as an analysis of what went wrong that his own argument "tacitly assumed that measurement of an observable must yield the same value independently of what other measurements may be made simultaneously" (1966: 9). In opposition to von Neumann, the Gleason-type argument derives restrictions on value assignments like (3) only for sets of compatible observables; but still one and the same observable can be a member of different commuting sets, and it is essential to the arguments that the observable gets assigned the same value in both sets, i.e. that the value assignment is not sensitive to a measurement context.

The KS theorem improves on the argument from Gleason's theorem. First, the authors repeat, in effect, Bell's proof that two vectors in the Hilbert space having values 1 and 0 cannot be arbitrarily close. However, while the Gleason argument and Bell's variant assume value assignments for a continuum of vectors in the Hilbert space, KS are able to explicitly present a discrete, even finite set of observables in the space for which an HV value assignment would lead to inconsistency. Obviously, the assumptions needed for the step of establishing that two opposite-valued points cannot be arbitrarily close are still in play in KS's improvement -- especially NC is! -- so Bell's criticism of his own Gleason-type argument survives that improvement.

Despite Bell's reasoning, the KS argument is of crucial importance in the HV discussions for two reasons: (1) It involves only a finite set of discrete observables. It thus avoids a possible objection to Bell's Gleason-type argument, namely that "it is not meaningful to assume that there are a continuum number of quantum mechanical propositions [viz. experiments]" (Kochen and Specker 1967: 70/307). So the KS theorem closes a loophole which a HV proponent might spot in Bell's argument. (2) KS propose a one-particle system as a physical realization of their argument. Thus, the argument trivially involves no separability or locality assumptions. Indeed, Bell first pointed out the tacit noncontextuality premise, but did so only in passing, and then, in the final section discussed an example of a two-particle system. Here, an eventual contextuality returns as nonseparability of the two particles, but Bell does not state the connection explicitly. Nor does he point out that the issue about the possibility of HV interpretations is, at bottom, not one about (non)separability or (non)locality, but rather one about (non)contextuality.[4] (After all, Bell's own argument against HV interpretations involves separability and/or locality assumptions!) This fact, however, is clearly illustrated by KS-type arguments.

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§3: Statement and Proof of the KS Theorem

§3.1: Statement of the KS Theorem

An explicit statement of the KS theorem runs thus:
Let H be a Hilbert space of QM state vectors of dimension x≥3. Let M be a set containing y observables, defined by operators on H. Then, for specific values of x and y, the following two assumptions are contradictory:

(KS1) All y members of M simultaneously have values, i.e. are unambiguously mapped onto real unique numbers (designated, for observables A, B, C, ... by v(A), v(B), v(C), ...).

(KS2) Values of observables conform to the following constraints:

(a) If A, B, C are all compatible and C = A+B, then v(C) = v(A)+v(B);

(b) if A, B, C are all compatible and C = A·B, then v(C) = v(A)·v(B).

Assumption KS1 of the theorem obviously is an equivalent of VD. Assumptions KS2 (a) and (b) are called the Sum Rule and the Product Rule, respectively, in the literature. (The reader should again note that, in opposition to von Neumann's implicit premise, these rules non-trivially relate the values of compatible observables only.) Both are consequences of a deeper principle called the functional composition principle (FUNC), which in turn is a consequence of (among other assumptions) NC. The connection between NC, FUNC, Sum Rule and Product Rule will be made explicit in §4.

In the original KS proof x=3 and y=117. More recently proofs involving less observables have been given by (among many others) Peres (1991, 1995) for x=3 and y=33 and by Kernaghan (1994) for x=4 and y=20. The KS proof is notoriously complex, and we will only sketch it in §3.4. The Peres proof establishes the KS result in full strength, with great simplicity, and, moreover, in an intuitively accessible way, since it operates in three dimensions; we refer the reader to Peres (1995: 197-99). The Kernaghan proof establishes a contradiction in four dimensions. This is a weaker result, of course, than the KS theorem (since every contradiction in 3 dimensions is also a contradiction in higher dimensions, but not conversely). However, the proof is so much simpler that we present it for starters in §3.2. Finally, in §3.5, we explain an argument by Clifton (1993) where x=3 and y=8 and an additional statistical assumption yields an easy and instructive KS argument.

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§3.2: A Quick KS Argument in Four Dimensions

A particularly easy KS argument proceeds on a four-dimensional Hilbert space H4. In order to get the gist of it quickly, the reader has to accept the following two facts on faith:

(1) From KS2 we can derive a constraint on value assignments to projection operators, namely that for every set of projection operators P1, P2, P3, P4, corresponding to the four distinct eigenvalues q1, q2, q3, q4 of an observable Q on H4 the following holds:

(VC1′)   v(P1) + v(P2) + v(P3) + v(P4) = 1, where v(Pi) = 1 or 0, for i = 1, 2, 3, 4.
((VC1′) is a variant of (VC1) which we prove explicitly in the next section.) This means in effect that of every set of four orthogonal rays in H4 exactly one is assigned the number 1, the others 0.

(2) Although the Hilbert space mentioned in the theorem, in order to be suited for QM, must be complex, it is enough, in order to show the inconsistency of claims KS1 and KS2, to consider a real Hilbert space of the same dimension. So, instead of H4 we consider a real Hilbert space R4 and translate VC1′ into the requirement: Within every set of orthogonal rays in R4, exactly one is assigned the number 1 and the others 0. As usual in the literature, we translate all this into the following colouring problem: Within every set of orthogonal rays in R4, exactly one must be coloured white and the others black. This, however, is impossible, as is shown immediately by the following table (Kernaghan 1994):

1,0,0,0 1,0,0,0 1,0,0,0 1,0,0,0 -1,1,1,1 -1,1,1,1 1,-1,1,1 1,1,-1,1 0,1,-1,0 0,0,1,-1 1,0,1,0
0,1,0,0 0,1,0,0 0,0,1,0 0,0,0,1 1,-1,1,1 1,1,-1,1 1,1,-1,1 1,1,1,-1 1,0,0,-1 1,-1,0,0 0,1,0,1
0,0,1,0 0,0,1,1 0,1,0,1 0,1,1,0 1,1,-1,1 1,0,1,0 0,1,1,0 0,0,1,1 1,1,1,1 1,1,1,1 1,1,-1,-1
0,0,0,1 0,0,1,-1 0,1,0,-1 0,1,-1,0 1,1,1,-1 0,1,0,-1 1,0,0,-1 1,-1,0,0 1,-1,-1,1 1,1,-1,-1 1,-1,-1,1

There are 4 x 11 = 44 entries in this table. These entries are taken from a set of 20 rays (so we allow for repeats). [Recall that to specify a ray or line through the origin in four dimensions, it suffices to give the four coordinates of any single point (apart from the origin) that the line contains. For example, "1,0,0,0" denotes the unique line containing the points with coordinates "0,0,0,0" and "1,0,0,0", which line is, of course, just the "x-axis".] It is easy to verify that every column in the table represents a set of four orthogonal rays (simply calculate the dot products between the vectors within each column --- they are always zero). Since the number of columns is 11, we must end up with an odd number of the table's entries coloured white. On the other hand, it can be checked that each of the 20 rays appears either twice or four times in the table. So any time we designate a particular one of those rays as white, we commit ourselves to colouring an even number of the entries white. It follows that the total number of table entries coloured white must be even, not odd. Thus, a colouring of the 20 ray set in accordance with VC1′ is impossible. (Note for future reference that the first part of the argument -- the argument for ‘odd’ -- uses only VC1′, while the second -- the argument for ‘even’ -- relies essentially on NC, by assuming that occurrences of the same ray in different columns get assigned the same number!)

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§3.3: The Original KS Argument. Technical Preliminaries.

The original KS proof operates on a three-dimensional complex Hilbert space H3. It requires two things: (1) sets of triples of rays which are orthogonal in H3; (2) a constraint to the effect that of every orthogonal triple one ray gets assigned the number 1, the two others 0. Both things are achieved thus:

We consider an arbitrary operator Q on H3 with three distinct eigenvalues q1, q2, q3, its eigenvectors |q1>, |q2>, |q3>, and projection operators P1, P2, P3 projecting on the rays spanned by these vectors. Now, P1, P2, P3 are themselves observables (namely, Pi is a ‘yes-no observable’ corresponding to the question ‘Does the system have value qi for Q?’). Moreover, P1, P2, P3 are mutually compatible, so we can apply the Sum Rule and Product Rule, and thereby derive a constraint on the assignment of values (Proof):

(VC1)   v(P1) + v(P2) + v(P3) = 1, where v(Pi) = 1 or 0, for i = 1, 2, 3.
The arbitrary choice of an observable Q defines new observables P1, P2, P3 which, in turn, select rays in H3. So, to impose that observables P1, P2, P3 all have values means to assign numbers to rays in H3, and VC1, in particular, means that of an arbitrary triple of orthogonal rays, specified by choice of an arbitrary Q (briefly: an orthogonal triple in H3), exactly one of its rays is assigned 1, the others 0. Now, if we introduce different incompatible observables Q, Q′, Q″, ... these observables select different orthogonal triples in H3. Assumption (1) of the KS theorem (which, effectively, is VD) now tells us that every one of these triples has three values, and VC1 tells us that these values must be for every triple, exactly {1, 0, 0}. What KS now shows is that, for a specific set of orthogonal triples in H3, an assignment of numbers {1, 0, 0} to every one of them is impossible. Further reflection yields that while H3 is complex, it is in fact enough to consider a real three-dimensional Hilbert space R3. For, we can show that if an assignment of values according to VC1 is possible on H3, then it is possible on R3. Contrapositively, if the assignment is impossible on R3, then it is impossible on H3. So we can fulfill the conditions necessary to get the KS proof started and at the same time reduce the problem to one on R3. Now, the equivalent in R3, of an arbitrary orthogonal triple in H3, is, again, an arbitrary triple of orthogonal rays (briefly: an orthogonal triple in R3). So, if KS want to show that, for a specific set of n orthogonal triples in H3 (where n is a natural number), an assignment of numbers {1, 0, 0} to every one of them is impossible, it is enough for them to show that, for a specific set of n orthogonal triples in R3, an assignment of numbers {1, 0, 0} to every one of them is impossible. And this is exactly what they do.

It should be stressed, however, that at this point there is no direct connection between R3 and physical space. KS wish to show that for an arbitrary QM system requiring a representation in a Hilbert space of at least three dimensions, the ascription of values in conjunction with condition (KS2) (Sum Rule and Product Rule) is impossible, and in order to do this it is sufficient to consider the space R3. This space R3, however, does not represent physical space for the quantum system at issue. In particular, orthogonality in R3 is not to be confused with orthogonality in physical space. This becomes obvious, if we move to an example of a QM system sitting in physical space and at the same time requiring a QM representation in H3, e.g. a one particle spin-1 system measured for spin. Given one arbitrary direction α in physical space and an operator Sα representing the observable of a spin component in direction α, H3 is spanned by the eigenvectors of Sα, namely |Sα=1>, |Sα=0>, |Sα=-1>, which are mutually orthogonal in H3. The fact that these three vectors corresponding to three possible results of measurement in one spatial direction are mutually orthogonal illustrates the different senses of orthogonality in H3 and in physical space. (The reason lies, of course, in the structure of QM which represents different values of an observable by different directions in H3.) Now, if orthogonality in H3 differs from orthogonality in physical space, and we just use R3 to prove a result about H3, then certainly orthogonality in R3 bears no direct connection with physical space.

KS themselves, in the abstract, proceed in exactly the same way, but they illustrate with an example that does establish a direct connection with physical space. It is important to see this connection, but also to be clear that it is produced by KS's example and is not inherent in their mathematical result. KS propose to consider a one-particle spin 1 system and the measurement of the squared components of orthogonal directions of spin in physical space Sx2, Sy2, Sz2 which are compatible (while Sx, Sy, Sz themselves are not).[5] Measurement of a squared component of spin determines its absolute magnitude, but not its direction. Here, we derive a slightly different constraint on value assignments, again using the Sum Rule and the Product Rule (Proof):

(VC2)   v(Sx2) + v(Sy2) + v(Sz2) = 2, where v(Sα2) = 1 or 0, for α = x, y, z.
Now, since Sx2, Sy2, Sz2 are compatible, there is an observable O such that Sx2, Sy2, Sz2 are all functions of O. So, the choice of an arbitrary O fixes Sx2, Sy2, Sz2 and, since these latter can be directly associated with mutually orthogonal rays in H3, again fixes the choice of an orthogonal triple in H3. The resulting problem here is to assign numbers {1, 1, 0} to an orthogonal triple in H3 specified by the choice of O or, more directly, Sx2, Sy2, Sz2. This is, of course, the mirror-image of our previous problem of assigning numbers {1, 0, 0} to such a triple, and we need not consider it separately.

However, the choice of a specific O which selects observables Sx2, Sy2, Sz2 at the same time selects three orthogonal rays in physical space, namely by fixing a coordinate system ±x, ±y, ±z (which defines along which orthogonal rays the squared spin components are to be measured) in physical space. So now, by choice of an observable O, there is a direct connection of with directions in H3: orthogonality in H3 now does correspond to orthogonality in physical space. The same holds for R3, if, in order to give an argument for H3, we consider R3. Orthogonality in R3 now corresponds to orthogonality in physical space. It is important to notice that this correspondence is not necessary to give the argument, even if we insist that the pure mathematical facts should be supplemented by a physical interpretation - since we have, just before, seen an example without any correspondence. The point is only that we can devise an example such that there is a correspondence. In particular, we can now follow the proof in R3 and all along imagine a system sitting in physical space, namely a spin 1 particle, returning three values upon measurement of three physical magnitudes, associated directly with orthogonal directions in physical space, namely v(Sx2), v(Sy2), v(Sz2), for arbitrary choices of x, y, z. The KS proof then shows that it is impossible (given its premises, of course) to assign to the spin 1 particle values for all these arbitrary choices. That is, the KS argument shows that (given the premises) a spin 1 particle cannot possess all the properties at once which it displays in different measurement arrangements.

Three further features which have become customary in KS arguments need to be mentioned:

(1) Obviously, we can unambiguously specify any ray in R3 through the origin by just giving one point contained in it. KS thus identify rays with points on the unit sphere E. KS do not need to refer to concrete coordinates of a certain point, since their argument is ‘coordinate-free’. We will, however, for illustration sometimes mention concrete points and then (a) use Cartesian coordinates to check orthogonality relations and (b) specify rays by points not lying on E. (Thus, e.g., the triple of points (0, 0, 1), (4, 1, 0), (1, -4, 0) is used to specify a triple of orthogonal rays.) Both usages conform with the recent literature (see e.g. Peres (1991) and Clifton (1993)).

(2) We translate the constraints (VC1) and (VC2) on value ascriptions into constraints for colouring the points. We can, operating under (VC1) colour the points white (for "1") and black (for "0"), or, operating under (VC2) colour the points white (for "0") and black (for "1"). In either case the constraints translate into the same colouring problem.

(3) KS illustrate orthogonality relations of rays by graphs which have come to be called KS diagrams. In such a diagram each ray (or point specifying a ray) is represented by a vertex. Vertices joined by a straight line represent orthogonal rays. The colouring problem then translates into the problem of colouring the vertices of the diagram white or black such that joined vertices cannot be both white and triangles have exactly one white vertex.

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§3.4: The Original KS Argument. Sketch of the Proof.

KS proceed in two steps.

(1) In the first (and decisive) step they show that two rays with opposite colours cannot be arbitrarily close. They show that the diagram Γ1 depicted in Fig. 1 which consists of ten vertices including a0 and a9 is constructible, if a0 and a9 are separated by an angle θ with 0 ≤ θ ≤ sin-1(1/3) (Proof).

Figure 1: Ten-point KS graph Γ1 with inconsistent colouring.
What this step shows is the following: It is possible to construct this KS diagram, i.e. to specify ten rays in R3 with orthogonality relations as specified in the diagram, but only if rays a0 and a9 are closer than sin-1(1/3). Consider now (for a reductio ad absurdum) that a0 and a9 have different colours. We arbitrarily colour a0 white and a9 black. The colouring constraints then force us to colour the rest of the diagram as is done in fig.1, but this forces that a5 and a6 are orthogonal and both white -- which is forbidden. Hence, two points closer than sin-1(1/3) cannot have different colour. Contrapositively, two points of different colour cannot be closer than sin-1(1/3).

(2) KS now construct another quite complicated KS diagram Γ2 in the following way. They consider a realization of Γ1 for an angle θ=18° < sin-1(1/3). Now they choose three orthogonal points p0, q0, r0 and space interlocking copies of Γ1 between them such that every instance of point a9 of one copy of Γ1 is identified with the instance of a0 of the next copy. In this way five interlocking copies of Γ1 are spaced between p0 and q0 and all five instances of a8 are identified with r0 (likewise for q0, r0, and p0, and for r0, p0, and q0). That Γ2 is constructible is borne out directly by the construction itself. Spacing out five copies of with angles θ=18° between instances of a0 will space out an angle of 5x18° = 90° which is exactly what is required. Moreover, wandering from one copy of Γ1 to the next between, say, p0 and q0 is equivalent to a rotation of the copy about the axis through the origin and r0 of 18° which evidently conserves the orthogonality between the points a0 and a9 of the copy and r0.

Figure 2: 117-point KS graph Γ2
(From Kochen and Specker 1967, 69; by permission of the Indiana University Mathematics Journal)
However, although Γ2 is constructible it is not consistently colourable. From the first step we know that a copy of Γ1 with θ=18° forces that points a0 and a9 have equal colour. Now, since a9 in one copy of Γ1 is identical to a0 in the next copy, a9 in the second copy must have the same colour as a0 in the first. Indeed, by repetition of this argument all instances of a0 must have the same colour. Now, p0, q0, r0 are identified with points a0, so they must be either all white or all black - both of which are inconsistent with the colouring constraint that exactly one of them be white.

If from the 15 copies of Γ1 used in the process of constructing Γ2 we subtract those points that were identified with each other, we end up with 117 different points. So what KS have shown is that a set of 117 observables cannot consistently be assigned values in accordance with VC1 (or, equivalently, VC2).

Note that in the construction of Γ1, i.e. the set of 10 points forming 22 interlocking triples, all points except a9 appear in more than one triple. In Γ2 every point appears in a multiplicity of triples. It is here that the noncontextuality premise is crucial to the argument: We assume that an arbitrary point keeps its value 1 or 0 as we move from one orthogonal triple to the next (i.e. from one maximal set of compatible observables to another).

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§3.5: A Statistical KS Argument in Three Dimensions (Clifton)

Finally, we return to R3. Recall KS's first step which establishes that two points with opposite colour cannot be arbitrarily close. It is this first step which carries the whole force of the argument. Bell had established it in a different way and had then argued that in a noncontextual HV interpretation points with opposite colour must be arbitrarily close. It is this first step which Clifton exploits in an argument that combines Bell's and KS's ideas.
Figure 3: 8-point KS-Clifton graph Γ3 with inconsistent colouring.
Consider the KS diagram Γ3 shown in Figure 3 which obviously is a part of KS's Γ1, but which has additional concrete assignments of eight points satisfying the orthogonality relations (and thus proving directly that Γ3 is constructible). From our previous colouring constraints (joined points are not both white and a triangle has exactly one white point) we see immediately that Γ3 is colourable only if the outermost points are not both white (which would force, as shown in fig. 3, that two joined points are white - contrary to the constraints). Moreover, we easily calculate the angle between the two outermost points to be cos-1(1/3).[6] So we conclude that if one wants to colour all eight points and wants to colour white one of the outer ones, then the other must be black. Taking into account that we can insert a diagram between any two points in R3 which are separated by exactly the angle cos-1(1/3) and translating our problem back from a colouring problem into KS's example (constraint VC2), we end with a constraint VC2′:
(VC2′)   If, for a spin-1 system, a certain direction x of spin in space is assigned value 0, then any other direction x′ which lies away from x by an angle cos-1(1/3) must be assigned value 1, or, in symbols: If v(Sx)=0, then v(Sx)=1.
The argument so far has made use of the original KS conditions KS1 and KS2. We now assume, in addition, that any constraint on value assignments will show up in the measurement statistics. In particular: A value assignment dictated by a constraint entails that this assigned value with certainty is the result of any measurement respecting the constraint. Or in symbols:
(3) If prob[v(A)=a] = 1, and v(A)=a implies v(B)=b, then prob[v(B)=b] = 1.
Despite the use of statistics, this reasoning crucially differs from von Neumann's argument. Von Neumann had argued that algebraic relations between values should transfer into the statistics of the measured values, therefore the QM constraints on these statistics should have value constraints as their exact mirror images - which reasoning leads us to derive value constraints from statistical constraints (for arbitrary observables). Here, on the contrary, we derive a value constraint independently from any statistical reasoning, and then conclude that this constraint should transfer into the measurement statistics.[7]

Now, VC2′ and the statistical condition (3) entail: If prob[v(Sx)=0]=1, then prob[v(Sx)=1]=1. This, however, contradicts the statistics derived from QM for a state where prob[v(Sx)=0] = 1.[8] In fact, there is a probability of 1/17 that v(Sx=0). So, in a long-run test 1/17 of the spin-1 particles will violate the constraint.

1/17 may not seem a terribly impressive number, but if we accept Clifton's statistical reasoning, we have an entirely valid KS argument establishing a contradiction between an HV interpretation of QM and the very predictions of QM. Moreover, Clifton presents a slightly more complex set of 13 observables yielding, along the same lines, a statistical contradiction of 1/3.

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§4: The Functional Composition Principle

The key ingredients of the KS theorem are the constraints on value assignments spelled out in (2): the Sum Rule and Product Rule. They derive from a more general principle, called the Functional Composition Principle (FUNC).[9] The principle trades on the mathematical fact that for a self-adjoint operator A operating on a Hilbert space, and an arbitrary function f: RR (where R is the set of the real numbers), we can define f(A) and show that it also is a self-adjoint operator (hence, we write f(A)). If we further assume that to every self-adjoint operator there corresponds a QM observable, then the principle can be formulated thus:
FUNC:  Let A be a self-adjoint operator associated with observable A, let f: RR be an arbitrary function, such that f(A) is another self-adjoint operator, and let |φ> be an arbitrary state; then f(A) is associated uniquely with an observable f(A) such that:
v(f(A))|φ> = f(v(A))|φ>
(We introduced the state superscript above to allow for a possible dependence of values on the particular quantum state the system is prepared in.) The Sum Rule and the Product Rule are straightforward consequences of FUNC (Proof). FUNC itself is not derivable from the formalism of QM, but a statistical version of it (called STAT FUNC) is [Proof]:
STAT FUNC:  Given A, f, |φ> as defined in FUNC, then, for an arbitrary real number b:
prob[v(f(A))|φ>=b] = prob[f(v(A))|φ>=b]
But STAT FUNC cannot only be derived from the QM formalism, it also follows from FUNC [Proof]. This can be seen as providing "a plausibility argument for FUNC" (Redhead 1987: 132): STAT FUNC is true, as a matter of the mathematics of QM. Now, if FUNC were true, we could derive STAT FUNC, and thus understand part of the QM mathematics as a consequence of FUNC.

But how can we derive FUNC itself, if not from STAT FUNC? It is a direct consequence of STAT FUNC and three assumptions (two of which are familiar from the introduction):

Value Realism (VR): If there is an operationally defined real number α, associated with a self-adjoint operator A and distributed probabilistically according to the statistical algorithm of QM for A, i.e. if there exists a real number β with β = prob(v(A)=α), then there exists an observable A with value α.

Value Definiteness (VD): All observables defined for a QM system have definite values at all times.

Noncontextuality (NC): If a QM system possesses a property (value of an observable), then it does so independently of any measurement context.

Some comments on these conditions are in order. First, we need to explain the content of VR. The statistical algorithm of QM tells us how to calculate a probability from a given state, a given observable and its value. Here we understand it as a mere mathematical device without any physical interpretation: Given a Hilbert space vector, an operator and its eigenvalues, the algorithm tells us how to calculate new numbers (which have the properties of probabilities). In addition, by ‘operationally defined’ we here simply mean ‘made up from a number which we know to denote a real property’. So, VR, in effect, says that, if we have a real property Γ (value Γ of an observable G), and we are able to construct from Γ a new number α and find an operator A such that α is an eigenvalue of A, then (we have fulfilled everything necessary to apply the statistical algorithm; thus) A represents an observable A and its value α is a real property.

Secondly, concerning NC: A failure of NC could be understood in two ways. Either, the value of an observable might be context-dependent, although the observable itself is not; or, the value of an observable might be context-dependent, because the observable itself is. There are, however, good grounds to think that both options are equivalent. We will indeed assume that, if NC holds, this means that the observable -- and thereby also its value -- is independent of the measurement context, i.e. is independent of how it is measured. In particular, the independence from context of an observable implies that there is a 1:1 correspondence of observables and operators. This implication of NC is what we will use presently in the derivation of FUNC. Conversely, failure of NC will be construed solely as failure of the 1:1 correspondence.

From VR, VD, NC and STAT FUNC, we can derive FUNC as follows. Consider an arbitrary state of a system and an arbitrary observable Q. By VD, Q possesses a value v(Q)=a. Thus, we can form the number f(v(Q))=b for an arbitrary function f. For this number, by STAT FUNC, prob[f(v(Q))=b] = prob[v(f(Q))=b]. Hence, we have, by transforming probabilities according to STAT FUNC, created a new self-adjoint operator f(Q), and associated it with the two real numbers b and prob[f(v(Q))=b]. Thus, by VR, there is an observable corresponding to f(Q) with value b, hence f(v(Q))=v(f(Q)). By NC, that observable is unique, hence FUNC follows.

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§5: Escaping the KS Argument

The previous section clarifies which possibilities the HV theorist has to escape the KS argument: denying one of the three premises which together entail FUNC (hence the Sum Rule and Product Rule).

§5.1: No General Value Definiteness

VD, we recall, was the fundamental presupposition of HV interpretations. So, if, in order to escape a powerful argument against the possibility of HV interpretations, these interpretations drop their fundamental motivation, this seems not to make much sense. But some interpreters point out that, between holding that only those observables which QM prescribes to have values[10] and holding that all of them have values, there is some leeway, namely, to propose that more observables, than prescribed in QM, but not all, have values (‘partial value definiteness’). This option of partial value definiteness has been taken by various modal interpretations and also has been explored by John Bell in his ‘beable approach’ to QM (1987: ch.7).

The rocks and shoals of modal interpretations are beyond the scope of this article (see the entry on modal interpretations). We just note that it is by no means clear how these interpretations can manage to always pick out the right set of observables assumed to have values. ‘Right set’ here means that the observable actually measured must always be included (in order to avoid the measurement problem) and must always recover the QM statistics. We also mention two important results which cast doubt on the feasibility of modal interpretations: First, it can be shown that either partial value definiteness collapses into total value definiteness (i.e., VD) or classical reasoning about physical properties must be abandoned. (Clifton 1995). Second, it is possible to derive a kind of KS theorem even in certain modal interpretations (Bacciagaluppi 1995, Clifton 1996).

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§5.2: Denial of Value Realism

The derivation of FUNC basically consists in the construction of an observable (i.e. f(Q)) via an operator (i.e. f(Q)) from the probability distribution of a number (i.e. f(v(Q)) which number in turn is constructed from another number, (i.e. v(Q)). Now, instead of denying that v(Q) exists in all cases (like the first option would have it), we can reject that the existence of a number α and the construction of f(Q) automatically lead to an observable, i.e. we reject VR. This amounts to rejecting that for every self-adjoint operator, there is a well-defined observable.

Now, in order to formulate VR we had to give a very reduced reading to the statistical algorithm, i.e. that it is a mere mathematical device for calculating numbers from vectors, operators and numbers. (What if we had done otherwise? Well, if we say: ‘Whatever fulfills the statistical algorithm is an observable’, we cannot very well suppose that an operator, in order to fulfill the algorithm, must be understood as an observable, since this would make the condition a trivial consequence of the algorithm.) This reading is very artificial and presupposes that a minimal interpretational apparatus required to make physical sense of some operators (like Q) can be withheld for others (like f(Q)).

Moreover, it seems entirely implausible to assume that some operators - sums and products of operators that are associated with well-defined observables - are themselves not associated with well-defined observables, even if they mathematically inherit exact values from their summands or factors. Put in a crude example, this would amount to saying that to ask for a system's energy is a well-defined question, while to ask for the square of the system's energy is not, even if, from our answer to the first question and trivial mathematics, we have a well-defined answer at hand. There seems no good a priori reason to justify this restriction. So, to make rejecting VR plausible at all, an additional proposal is made: It is crucial to the KS argument that one and the same operator is constructed from different maximal ones which are incompatible: f(Q) is identical to g(P), where PQQP ≠ 0. We now assume that only the construction of f(Q) via Q, but not the one via P, leads to a well-defined observable.[11]

This move however, automatically makes some observables context-sensitive. So, this way of motivating the denial of VR amounts to a kind of contextualism, which we might come by cheaper, by directly rejecting NC, and without any tampering with the statistical algorithm. (This fact explains why we did not mention denial of VR as a separate option in the introduction.).

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§5.3: Contextuality

Finally, we might accept VD and VR, but deny that our construction of an observable f(Q) is unambiguous. Thus, we accept that f(Q) and g(P) are mathematically identical, but physically they correspond to different observables, since an actual determination of v(f(Q)) must proceed via measuring Q, but the determination of v(g(P)) involves measuring P which is incompatible with Q. Since v(f(Q)) and v(g(P)) are outcomes of different measurement situations, there is no reason to assume that v(f(Q)) = v(g(P)). This way to block the KS proof comes to understanding f(Q) and g(P) as different observables (because of sensitivity to context), thus it amounts to rejecting NC. There are mainly two ways, in the literature, to further motivate this step. Accordingly, there are two important brands of contextuality to be discussed -- causal and ontological contextuality.

The KS argument has been presented for possessed values of a QM system - independently of considerations about measurement. Indeed, in the argument measurement was mentioned only once and in the negative - in NC. However, since now we consider the rejection of NC, we must also take into account measurement and its complications. An additional manifestation of our innocuous realism (see the introduction above) is a principle of faithful measurement (FM): QM measurement of an observable faithfully delivers the value which that observable had immediately prior to the measurement interaction. FM also is an extremely plausible presupposition of natural science. Moreover, FM entails VD (therefore we could have, using the stronger principle, given a KS argument for possible measurement results). Consider now the motivation, for the HV proponent, to reject NC. Obviously, the aim is to save other presuppositions, especially VD. Now, VD and NC are independent realist convictions, but NC and FM are not quite so independent. Indeed, we will see that rejection of NC entails the rejection of FM in one version of contextuality, and strongly suggests it in the other. (This makes more precise the somewhat cryptical remark from the introduction that it is not obvious what an interpretation endorsing the realist principle VD, but rejecting the realist principle NC, should look like. Such an interpretation would have to violate a third realist principle, i.e. FM.)

Causal Contextuality

An observable might be causally context-dependent in the sense that it is causally sensitive to how it is measured. The basic idea is that the observed value comes about as the effect of the system-apparatus interaction. Hence, measuring a system via interaction with a P-measuring apparatus might yield a value v(g(P)), measuring the same system via interaction with a Q-measuring apparatus a different value v(f(Q)), although both observables are represented by the same operator f(Q) = g(P). The difference in values is explained in terms of a context-dependence of the observables: The latter are context-dependent, since the different ways to physically realize them causally influence the system in different ways and thereby change the observed values.

If an interpreter wanted to defend causal contextuality, this would entail abandoning FM, at least for observables of the type f(Q) (non-maximal observables): Since their values causally depend on the presence of certain measurement arrangements, these arrangements are causally necessary for the values to come about, thus the values cannot be present before the system-apparatus interaction, and FM is violated. As an advantage of causal contextualism the following might be pointed out. It does not imply that the ontological status of the physical properties involved must change, i.e. does not imply that they become relational. If the property in an object is brought about via interaction with another one, it can still be one which the object has for itself after the interaction. However, the idea of causal contextuality is sometimes discussed critically, since there is reason to think that it may be empirically inadequate (see Shimony 1984, Stairs 1992).

Ontological Contextuality

An observable might be ontologically context-dependent in the sense that in order for it to be well-defined the specification of the observable it ‘comes from’ is necessary. Thus, in order to construct a well-defined observable from operator f(Q) = g(P), we need to know whether it is physically realized via observable P or observable Q. This way out of the KS problem, was first proposed (but not advocated) by van Fraassen (1973). There are, then, as many observables and kinds of physical properties for an operator f(Q) as there are ways to construct f(Q) from maximal operators. Without further explanation, however, this idea just amounts to an ad hoc proliferation of physical magnitudes. A defender of ontological contextuality certainly owes us a more explicit story about the dependence of observable f(Q) on observable Q. Two possibilities come to mind:

(a) We might think that v(f(Q)) just is not a self-sustained physical property, but one which ontologically depends on the presence of another property v(Q). (Recall that in the proof of FUNC v(f(Q)) is constructed from v(Q).) But, since the position does not reject questions about values of f(Q) in a P-measurement situation as illegitimate (because it does not trade on a notion of an observable being well-defined in one context only!), this seems to lead to new and pressing questions, to say the least. As an attempt to defend a contextualist hidden variables interpretation, this position must concede that not only does the system have, in the Q-measurement situation, a value v(Q), but also, in a P-measurement situation, it has a value v′(Q), although perhaps v′(Q) ≠ v(Q). Now, questions for values of f(Q) in this situation at least are legitimate. Does v′(Q) install another v′(f(Q)) ≠ v(f(Q))? Or does v′(Q), in opposition to v(Q), not lead to a value of f(Q), at all? Neither option seems plausible, for couldn't we, just by switching for a certain prepared system between a P- and Q-measurement situation either switch v(f(Q)) in and out of existence or switch between v(f(Q)) and v′(f(Q))? (b) We might think that, in order for f(Q) to be well-defined, one measurement arrangement rather than the other is necessary. The idea is strongly reminiscent of Bohr's 1935 argument against EPR, and indeed may be viewed as the appropriate extension of Bohr's views on QM to the modern HV discussion (see Held 1998, ch.7). In this version of ontological contextualism the property v(f(Q)), rather than depending on the presence of another property v(Q), is dependent on the presence of a Q-measuring apparatus. This amounts to a holistic position: For some properties it only makes sense to speak of them as pertaining to the system, if that system is part of a certain system-apparatus whole. Here, the question for values of f(Q) in a P-measurement situation does become illegitimate, since f(Q)'s being well-defined is tied to a Q-measurement situation. But again reservations apply. Does the position hold that, in opposition to f(Q), Q itself is well-defined in a P-measurement situation? If it does not, Q hardly can have a value (since not being well-defined was the reason to deny f(Q) a value) which means that we are not considering an HV interpretation any longer, and that there is no need to block the KS argument, at all. If it does, what explains that, in the P-measurement situation, Q remains well-defined, but f(Q) loses this status?

What becomes of FM in both versions of ontological contextualism? Well, if we remain agnostic about how the position could be made plausible, we can save FM, while, if we choose version (a) or (b) to make it plausible, we lose it. Consider first an agnostic denial of NC. FM said that every QM observable is faithfully measured. Now, contextualism splits an operator which can be constructed from two different noncommuting operators into two observables, and ontological contextualism does not try to give us a causal story which would ruin the causal independence of the measured value from the measurement interaction embodied in FM. We simply introduce a more fine-grained conception of observables, but for these new contextual observables still can impose FM.

However, the concrete versions of ontological contextualism, by attempting to motivate the contextual feature, ruin FM. Version (a) allows f(Q) to switch ‘on and off’ or to switch between different values upon the change between P- and Q-measurement situations - which is a flagrant violation of FM. Version (b) fares no better. It introduces the ontological dependence on the measuring arrangement. It is hard to see what else this should be, but the same causal dependence pushed to a higher, ‘ontological’ key. Again, couldn't we, just by flipping back and forth the measurement arrangement, change back and forth that f(Q) is well-defined, thus flip in and out of existence v(f(Q))?

Finally, we note that both types of ontological contextualism, in opposition to the causal version, do entail that system properties which we earlier thought to be intrinsic, become relational in the sense that a system can only have these properties either if it has certain others, or if it is related to a certain measurement arrangement.

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§6: The Question of Empirical Testing

Famously, the violation of Bell's inequalities, prescribed by QM, has been confirmed experimentally. Is something similar possible for the KS theorem? We distinguish three questions: (1) Is it possible to realize the experiment proposed by KS as a motivation of their theorem? (2) Is it possible to test the principles leading to the theorem: the Sum Rule and Product Rule, FUNC, or NC? (3) Is it possible to test the theorem itself?

(1) KS themselves describe a concrete experimental arrangement to measure Sx2, Sy2, Sz2 on a one-particle spin 1 system as functions of one maximal observable. An orthohelium atom in the lowest triplet state is placed in a small electric field E of rhombic symmetry. The three observables in question then can be measured as functions of one single observable, the perturbation Hamiltonian Hs. Hs, by the geometry of E, has three distinct possible values measurement of which reveals which two observables of Sx2, Sy2, Sz2 have value 1, which one has value 0 (see Kochen and Specker 1967: 72/311). This is, of course, a proposal to realize an experiment exemplifying our above value constraint (VC2). Could we also realize a (VC1) experiment, i.e. measure a set of commuting projectors projecting on eigenstates of one maximal observable? Peres (1995: 200) answers the question in the affirmative, discusses such an experiment, and refers to Swift and Wright (1980) for details about the technical feasibility. It seems, however, that, despite being possible in principle, no such experiment has been actually carried out (see Cabello and Garcìa-Alcaine (1998) for more discussion and another experimental proposal).

(2) In conjunction with manifestations of FUNC, i.e. the Sum Rule and the Product Rule, QM yields constraints like VC1 or VC2 that contradict VD. So providing concrete physical examples that could, given the Sum Rule and the Product Rule, instantiate VC1 or VC2, as just outlined, is not enough. We must ask whether these rules themselves can be empirically supported. There was considerable discussion in the early 80s about this question --- explicitly about whether the Sum Rule is empirically testable --- and there was general agreement that it is not.[12]

The reason is the following: Recall that the derivation of FUNC established uniqueness of the new observable f(Q) only in its final step (via NC). It is this uniqueness which guarantees that one operator represents exactly one observable such that observables (and thereby their values) in different contexts can be equated. This allows to establish indirect connections between different incompatible observables. Without this final step, FUNC must be viewed as holding relative to different contexts, the connection is broken and FUNC is restricted to one set of observables which are all mutually compatible. Then indeed FUNC, the Sum Rule and the Product Rule become trivial, and empirical testing in these cases would be a pointless question.[13] It is NC which does all the work and which deserves to be tested via checking whether for incompatible P, Q such that f(Q)=g(P) it is true that v(f(Q))=v(g(P)). Testing this, however, is impossible, due to the impossibility of simultaneously measuring P and Q.

(3) Very recently, it has been argued that the (physically reasonable) assumption of finitely precise measurement creates a decisive loophole in the KS argument (see Meyer 1999, Kent 1999, Clifton and Kent 1999; briefly MKC).[14] Indeed, if we consider a KS argument for measured values, infinite precision is crucial to the argument in two different ways: (1) It is necessary to the argument that the measured components of one triple (or quadruple) are exactly orthogonal. (2) It is necessary (to install NC) that two measurements intended to pick out the same observable as member of two different maximal sets, pick out exactly the same direction. If we relax this assumption of infinite precision, noncontextual HV models can be constructed. In these models, it is not exactly the sets of observables specified in the KS argument (or related arguments) by points in R3, but sets specified by points with rational components (which approximate the former arbitrarily closely) that are colourable, i.e. that can consistently be assigned noncontextual values. So the argument ultimately trades on the fact that we cannot empirically distinguish between a ‘real point’ and its ‘rational’ approximation.

The MKC argument is hotly debated and the question whether it is relevant or even destructive to the KS argument is unsettled, so we shall just record part of the discussion. One quite obvious objection is that the original KS argument works for possessed values, not measured values, so the MKC argument, which turns on the finite precision of measurements, misses the mark. We might not be able to test observables which are exactly orthogonal or exactly alike in different tests, but it would be a strange HV interpretation that asserts that such components do not exist (see Cabello 1999). Of course, such a noncontextual HV proposal would be immune to the KS argument, but it would be forced to either deny that for every one of the continuously many directions in physical space there is an observable, or else deny that there are continuously many directions -- and neither denial seems very attractive.

In addition, the MKC argument is dissatisfying, since it exploits the finite precision of real measurements only in one of the above senses, but presupposes infinite precision in the other. MKC assume, for measured observables, that there is finite precision in the choice of different orthogonal triples, such that we cannot, in general, have exactly the same observable twice, as a member of two different triples. However, MKC still assume infinite precision, i.e. exact orthogonality, within the triple (otherwise the colouring constraints could find no application, at all). It has been claimed that this feature can be exploited to rebut the argument and to re-install contextualism (see Mermin 1999, Appleby 2000).

Finally, it can be shown that quantum probabilities vary continuously as we change directions in R3, so small imperfections of selection of observables that block the argument (but only for measured values!) in the single case will wash out in the long run (see Mermin 1999). This in itself does not constitute an argument, since in the colourable sets of observables in MKC's constructions probabilities also vary (in a sense) continuously.[15] We might, however, exploit Mermin's reasoning in the following way. Reconsider Clifton's set of eight directions (in Figure 3) leading to a colouring constraint for the outermost points which statistically contradicts the QM statistics by a fraction of 1/17. Now, starting from the colourable subset of directions constructed by MKC, we are unable to derive the constraint for the eight points, since these eight points do not lie in that set; i.e., as we move, in the colourable subset, from one mutually orthogonal triple of rays to the next, we never hit upon exactly the same ray again, but only to one approximating it arbitrarily closely. However, consider the following response. Assume that observables corresponding to the eight directions, though not lying in the colourable subset, exist and, according to the HV premise, all have values. Then we can derive Clifton's constraint for the outermost points. For these outermost points it is irrelevant whether, in an eventual empirical test we hit them exactly, for the Mermin argument says that, even if, in every single imperfect measurement, we only measure points nearby, we will, in the long-run better and better approximate the QM statistics for exactly the points in question - which means that we will better and better approach 1/17, while the HV assumption requires that we will better and better approach 0. (Recall also that this number can be pushed up to 1/3 by choosing a set of 13 directions!)

So, in sum it seems that, as long as we assume that there are continuously many QM observables (corresponding to the continuum of directions in physical space), statistical tests building, e.g., on the Clifton 1993 or the Cabello/Alcaìne 1998 proposal remain entirely valid as empirical confirmations of the KS theorem. Since these statistical violations of the HV programme come about as contradictions of results of QM, VD, VR, and NC on the one hand, and QM and experiment on the other, the experimental data still force upon us the trilemma of giving up either VD or VR or NC. As we have seen, denial of value realism in the end becomes identical to a kind of contextualism, hence we really have only two options: (1) Giving up VD, either for all observables forbidden to have values in the orthodox interpretation (thus giving up the HV programme), or for a subset of these observables (as modal interpretations do). (2) Endorse a kind of contextualism. Moreover, as things presently stand, the choice between these two options seems not to be a matter of empirical testing, but one of pure philosophical argument.

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I am grateful to the editor, Rob Clifton, for many helpful comments and to Richard Sembera for technically formatting this entry in HTML.