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Joane Petrizi

First published Tue 29 Aug, 2006

Joane Petrizi (12th century) — the most significant Georgian medieval philosopher — devoted intensive work to neo-Platonic philosophy. He translated Nemesius of Emesa's On the Nature of Man into Georgian, a work which in that day attracted considerable attention. Of particular importance is his Georgian translation of Proclus's Elementatio theologica, to which he also wrote a step-by-step commentary. Petrizi's commentary on the Elementatio theologica represents a significant effort at reception inasmuch as the Georgian philosopher interprets the work immanently, that is, on the basis of Proclus's philosophy itself. Therefore, he definitely deserves to receive increased attention in presentations and reconstructions of the philosophy of Proclus, and especially in research on medieval Proclus commentaries. Up to now, the standard editions of the Elementatio theologica only mention Petrizi's Proclus work in passing (if at all), or even criticize it unjustly (Dodds, pp. xli-xlii, 343; cf. in more detail Iremadze, Konzeptionen, pp. 225-231). Research on the Georgian translation and interpretation of the Elementatio theologica in the context of Byzantine and Latin Proclus interpreters — Nicholas of Methone (12th century), Berthold of Moosburg (14th century), Henry Bate of Mechelen (13th century) — will close this gap in Proclus research. Furthermore, the reception by Byzantine philosophers of the 11th and 12th centuries (Psellos, Italos) should not be overlooked.

1. The Person and his Work

To date there is no reliable information on Petrizi's dates and biography. According to older Georgian research, he lived in the second half of the 11th century and the first half of the 12th century. More recent research, however, tends to date him to the second half of the 12th century. The state of research is aggravated by the lack of information on Petrizi. The little personal information that is known about him stems from remarks scattered through his works in which Petrizi briefly speaks about himself. In his Proclus commentary — the Interpretation of the Elementatio theologica of Proclus — and in the Postscript, which is traditionally ascribed to him, the author mentions his own cares and problems.

According to authoritative reports, Petrizi translated Nemesius of Emesa's work On the Nature of Man into Georgian (Petrizi, Opera II, p. 223). According to these accounts, Petrizi encountered numerous difficulties and obstacles put in his way by both Greeks and Georgians because of his work. Based on the current state of research on his work and on his biography, together with a detailed study of his Proclus Commentary, Petrizi can be characterized as a 12th-century thinker. The character of Georgian thought in the 12th century is manifested in his style of philosophizing and in his manner of presenting arguments, in his knowledge of ancient philosophy and in his intellectual interest in maintaining ancient thought in its rightful place.

Petrizi names the philosophers whom he treated in his Interpretation: Orpheus, Parmenides, Zeno, Plato, Aristotle, Alexander of Aphrodisias, Porphyry and the Fathers of the Church (Petrizi, Opera I, pp. XXVI-LII; Alexidse, pp. 148-168). He held Platonic philosophy in particularly high esteem. Its representatives included in his view both Plato's predecessors (Orpheus, Pythagoras, etc.) and the neo-Platonists. He calls Plato ‘the philosopher of the day’ (Petrizi, Opera I, p. XXVII). When Petrizi speaks of the ‘philosopher’, he means Proclus. By contrast, in the Latin middle ages, the designation philosophus was reserved for Aristotle.

Among Plato's works, Petrizi refers to the dialogues Parmenides, the Laws, Phaedrus, Phaedo and Timaeus. Although he does not mention them, he also quotes Theaetetus and the Symposium (Petrizi, Opera II, pp. 34, 84). Petrizi also mentions various works of Aristotle's, but not the pseudo-Aristotelian works used by Scholastic philosophers (Iremadze, Konzeptionen, p. 57). It can be gathered from his Interpretation that in addition to the Elementatio theologica he also knew other works by Proclus (for example the Parmenides and Timaeus commentaries as well as the Platonic Theology) and drew on them as he saw fit in commenting on the Elementatio theologica (Iremadze, Konzeptionen, p. 57).

2. Philosophy

Petrizi's commentary on Proclus's Elementatio theologica consists of a Preface (Introduction) and the commentaries to each chapter of this work. In Seh. Nuzubidse and S. Kauchtschischvili's edition of Petrizi's Proclus Commentary, these commentaries are followed by an epilogue.

In his Introduction to the Elementatio theologica, Joane Petrizi reflects on the sense (the intentio) of this book, and sees it in the proof of ‘the much discussed One’ (Petrizi, Commentaries, p. 149). Then he briefly treats the peculiarity of the One, which in his opinion is not identical with any being. The pure and genuine One must be examined and proved in accordance with the rules of syllogisms (Petrizi, Opera II, p. 3). According to Petrizi's exegesis, this One is the crucial concept in the overall process of grounding knowledge. If this principle is not provable, there are no incontrovertible propositions and the goal of gnoseology will not be reached. The One is the principle that makes knowledge possible.

In the first chapter of his Elementatio theologica, Proclus treated the One as the origin of all modes of multiplicity. Petrizi follows this in his commentary to this proposition, presenting the arguments for Proclus's approach in his own way. Petrizi adheres primarily to the basic axiom that the chain of beings requires an origin. Otherwise the universe would have its origin in an Other, which for its part would have to be the One inasmuch as the first principle (= the One) should comprise all entities of the cosmos without exception. The One as the cause and origin of being as such is deemed to be the better, and takes on no qualities from what it causes. This One alone confers selfness to all other entities because, as the generator and principle of everything that follows it, it is in need of nothing.

The essential features of the One (goodness, unity) are visible in each creature. If the one were of the same value as the rest of being, then cosmic harmony and its order would fail; furthermore, it would not be possible to distinguish between the first and the last in the series (Petrizi, Opera II, prop. 1, p. 13). The universe would thus have no first and no last reference point, no origin and no unities following it. It is precisely on the impossibility of such an assumption that Petrizi's ontological reflections were based. In Petrizi's view, the One is identical with the Good. All Being presupposes the first Good because all creatures of nature participate in this good and only possess good qualities by virtue of their participation. Being is not by its own nature the Good, but becomes a Good subsequently, by participation in the One. Therefore, in Petrizi's view a distinction must be made between the Good in itself and good entities inasmuch as the former is above all nature and is a pure good in itself. Therefore, it is also the goal of all Being, which constantly strives for it inasmuch as each caused thing reverts to the cause (Petrizi, Opera II, prop. 8, p. 33).

The Good is the archetype of Being as such, which, as its image, also derives its status in the cosmos through participation in the Good. This is so because of the identity of the Good with the One. Because all entities only appear by virtue of participation in the One, and because the One, taken in itself, is a pure Good, the Good is also deemed to be the ultimate source and the super-simple reference point of the universe. To characterize the Good, Petrizi adduces and uses principles from Plato's Phaedrus, treating the various degrees of goodness. The first Good heads the Good, and thereafter follow the various levels of goodnesses. The good is also deemed to be the principle of order and structuring of Being. That which is first to be linked to it has traces of the Good in itself, and the first monads also have such a nature. It is precisely in these first entities that Beauty and the Good are found (Petrizi, Opera II, prop. 8, p. 34).

In his Proclus Commentary, Joane Petrizi analyses the dialectic hidden in the ‘cause’ and the ‘caused’ more thoroughly and in more detail than does Proclus himself in the corresponding chapters of his Elementatio theologica. In Petrizi's exegesis, the abstract, mathematical style of this work is augmented in content with a wealth of material. Petrizi operates very often with visually illustrative examples, and is careful to illuminate the theorems set forth in the Elementatio theologica by means of human experience. This resulted from the goals of his Interpretation. It primarily addressed a broad public and served the study of this significant work from Greek antiquity.

Petrizi treats the problem of the cause and the caused from various perspectives, for the treatment of this topic proved to be of fundamental importance for the logical structure of his philosophical project. In Proposition 30, he treats the traditional view of the dialectic of causality in detail, examining the etymological meanings of the terms characteristically used in Greek for this relationship (Petrizi, Opera II, prop. 30, pp. 79-81). The dialectic of causality becomes manifest in the process of the descent from the One to the Many and the ascent from the Many to the One. The cause is the phase within the entirety of emanation that generates, that which thus has priority both in ontological and in axiological terms vis-à-vis the caused inasmuch as in the neo-Platonic system of generation the generator is better than the generated.

With regard to the problem of causality, Petrizi applied the criticism of the Peripatetic doctrine of principles in critical discussion of the Aristotelian concept of causes. In the realm of theoretical philosophy, the system of four causes proved to be inadequate and flawed. In this context, it seemed to Petrizi to be necessary to work out a new conception of causality. He studied Proclus's philosophy on the basis of Greek sources, and regarded it as appropriate to his research goals to adopt the existing structure of the system of causes. In this point, he worked in the same way as Byzantine philosophers of the time such as Psellos and Italos, who recognized the priority of Platonic philosophy on this issue.

In Proposition 75 of his commentary, Petrizi distinguishes five different modes of causa, characterizing them in nuce. He adds a fifth kind of causa to the traditional system of causes. In addition to the material, formal, final and efficient causes he conceives a creative cause (Petrizi, Opera II, prop. 75, p. 136). It was, he claims, neglected in the Aristotelians’ theoretical work, who, in contrast to Proclus, had underestimated the relevance of the creative cause. This applies both to Aristotle and to his interpreters, above all Alexander of Aphrodisias, whom Petrizi criticizes in this connection (Petrizi, Opera II, prop. 11, p. 38).

One of the most important aspects of Petrizi's philosophy is his epistemology. It has only recently been reconstructed and systematically researched in the light of the medieval discussion of the essence of thought (cf. Iremadze, Konzeptionen, pp. 161-241). In his epistemology, Petrizi emphasizes the productive power of (human) reason, which is capable of the real positing of being as such and is thus a determinative principle of being.

3. Historical Reception and Influence

Joane Petrizi is the most widely read Georgian philosopher. Petrizi's Proclus Commentary with his Georgian translation of the Elementatio theologica had a major influence not only on Georgian philosophy and culture, but also outside of Georgia. In 1248, the Armenian monk Svimeon translated Petrizi's Proclus work into Armenian, thus contributing to the dissemination of the philosophy of Proclus there. In the 17th century, Armenian philosophers devoted intensive work to Proclus's thought, to which they attributed contemporary relevance; in 1651, the Armenian bishop Svimeon Dshughaezi wrote commentaries to facilitate the understanding of the Elementatio theologica. The basis for his commentary was the 13th-century Armenian translation by the monk Svimeon of Petrizi's Georgian translation.

In 1757, these commentaries, together with the Armenian version of the Elementatio theologica, were translated into Georgian; they have made a clear mark on Georgian culture. Thus, in the 18th century there were at least two different commentaries on the Elementatio theologica in Georgian.

It must be emphasized that the thinkers of the Georgian Enlightenment in the 17th and 18th centuries reacted to these traditions in diverse ways. Some trenchantly criticized the Armenian version with reference to its contents (see below on Anton Bagrationi). But one point is certain: in the modern era in Georgia, Proclus's philosophy was the subject of intensive consideration and interest by virtue of Petrizi's works.

Let us here have a look at three important stages of the Georgian reception of Proclus and Petrizi.

(1) Sulchan-Saba Orbeliani (1658-1726) integrates numerous theorems from Petrizi's Proclus work into his Georgian Dictionary. In the definition and discussion of the problem of knowledge, he refers to the 20th proposition of the Interpretation and determines reason as the simple, bodiless knowledge of the known (Orbeliani, vol. I, p. 166, col. 1-2). Other important philosophical definitions — for example the determination of real being (Orbeliani, vol. I, p. 574, col. 1), of production (Orbeliani, vol. II, p. 366, col. 2; p. 367, col. 1), of causality (Orbeliani, vol. I, p. 480, col. 1-2), of motion (Orbeliani, vol. I, p. 479, col. 2) — are taken from Petrizi's Proclus Commentary. In his Georgian Dictionary, Sulchan-Saba Orbeliani made equally intensive reference to Petrizi's Georgian translation of the work On the Nature of Man by Nemesius of Emesa.

(2) In his philosophical work Spekali (1752), the philosopher and theologian Anton Bagrationi (1720-1788) refers to Petrizi's Interpretation, adopting numerous theorems of neo-Platonic origin from him. Anton Bagrationi took some chapters devoted to Proclus's problem of knowledge almost verbatim from Petrizi's work (Anton I., Spekali, pp. 327-331).

The last chapters of Spekali are devoted to Petrizi. In chapters 148 and 149, Anton Bagrationi treats the topic of knowledge on the basis of the propositions on nous in the Interpretation. Following Petrizi, it is here claimed that reasoned knowledge is different from the soul's mode of knowledge. In its essence, the activity and the substance of reason are a unity, whereas the nature of the soul shows itself to be differentiated. The essence and the activity of the soul can be distinguished inasmuch as knowledge is not the primary quality of the soul. In its knowledge, the soul proceeds from one being to another, that is, the acquired insights are deemed to be the bases for the progress of knowledge. The knowledge of reason has to be characterized differently, for its activity is grounded in eternal knowing and can be seen as nothing other than this activity. At this point it must be remarked that Anton Bagrationi made intensive use of the noetic terminology of Petrizi's Proclus Commentary to characterize his concept of knowledge. His significant philosophical determinations of noetics were worked out exclusively with reference to Petrizi.

Anton Bagrationi was trenchantly critical of the Armenian version of the Elementatio theologica inasmuch as it did not represent Proclus's or Petrizi's genuine doctrine. In his work Theology, of which a critical edition has not yet been published, he claims that true metaphysics was there combined with false theories and thus disfigured. In his opinion, the old version (that is, Petrizi's version) of the Elementatio theologica should be studied rather than the new (Armenian) version. Admittedly, he sided with Petrizi in this point: Petrizi's interpretation of Proclus's philosophy should be accepted rather than its arbitrary transformation by modern Armenian and Georgian interpreters.

(3) In contrast to Anton Bagrationi, Joane Bagrationi (1768-1830) mainly relied on the Armenian commentaries on the Elementatio theologica in his main work, Kalmasoba, which is written in dialogue form. In the determination of the One and its dialectics, he quotes the first chapters of Proclus's work. Furthermore, the chapters on nous (for example prop. 20) are given adequate consideration in Kalmasoba. In this work, Joane Bagrationi does not comment on all the chapters of the Elementatio theologica; a total of 86 chapters were commented on. It is remarkable that the author interprets or transforms some passages of Proclus's and Petrizi's work in an original manner; in the discussion of the problem of cause, he begins by distinguishing three main kinds — God, nature and skill — and emphasizes God's superiority to all other causes. Joane Bagrationi made use of Svimeon Dshughaezi's commentaries, attempting to interpret Proclus and Petrizi with their help. Furthermore, Joane Bagrationi brought clarity to the noetics of the Elementatio theologica, characterizing the various kinds and functions of knowledge and designating the knowing soul as specific to man.

Although Joane Petrizi's work received increasing attention in the course of time and Georgian thinkers always emphasized his intellectual heritage, a thorough-going scholarly treatment of Petrizi's works only really began in the 20th century. Without a doubt, the most important stage in Petrizi research is represented by the publication of a scholarly edition of Petrizi's philosophical works. The edition began in 1937 with the publication of the second volume of Petrizi's Proclus work — the Interpretation of the “Elementatio theologica” of Proclus. This volume was edited by Seh. Nuzubidse and S. Kauchtschischvili; it includes a comprehensive and valuable study of Petrizi's philosophy in which the teaching of the Georgian philosopher is viewed as reflected by his contemporaries and analysed with reference to Byzantine and Georgian medieval thought.

The first volume of Petrizi's Proclus work (The Elementatio theologica of the Platonic Philosopher Proclus) was published in 1940. This volume contains the Georgian translation of the Elementatio theologica from the Greek. The editor was S. Kauchtschischvili; M. Gogiberidse wrote an introduction to the volume. It also contains a comprehensive vocabulary for both volumes, also compiled by S. Kauchtschischvili. In the 20th century, Petrizi's Interpretation was translated into Russian. The Russian translation of 1984 with an introduction and annotations by G. Tewsadse is of particular importance. After the publication of scholarly editions of Petrizi's works, both philosophical and philological problems of the Proclus commentary have been subject to thorough-going research (for a detailed account of the state of Petrizi research, cf. Iremadze, Konzeptionen, pp. 13-27).


A. Primary Literature

1. Petrizi's Works

2. Other Authors

B. Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

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