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Incompatibilist (Nondeterministic) Theories of Free Will

First published Thu Aug 17, 2000; substantive revision Tue Aug 17, 2004

To have free will is to have what it takes to act freely. When an agent acts freely—when she exercises her free will—what she does is up to her. A plurality of alternatives is open to her, and she determines which she pursues. She is an ultimate source or origin of her action. So runs a familiar conception of free will.

Incompatibilists hold that we act freely in this sense only if determinism is false. Many incompatibilists say little more about what, besides the falsehood of determinism, free will requires. And, indeed, the task of providing an incompatibilist account is not an easy one. For, if the truth of determinism would preclude free will, it is far from obvious how indeterminism would help.

Incompatibilist accounts that have been offered are of three main types, differing with respect to which form of indeterminism (uncaused events, nondeterministically caused events, agent- [or substance-] caused events) they require. Further variations among accounts concern where in the processes leading to actions they require indeterminism and what other conditions besides indeterminism they require. The first three sections below examine recent versions of each of the three main types of incompatibilist view. The fourth section considers the evidence regarding whether in fact there does exist what any of these accounts characterizes.

1. Noncausal Accounts

Some nondeterministic accounts require neither that a free action have any internal causal structure nor that it be caused by anything at all. Some views of this sort require that a free action be uncaused; others allow that it may be caused as long as it is not deterministically caused. Since any such account imposes no positive causal requirement on free action, we may call views of this type "noncausal."

Proponents of noncausal accounts generally hold that every action is or begins with a basic mental action. A decision or a choice is typically held to be an example of such a mental action. An overt bodily action, such as raising one's arm, is held to be a nonbasic, complex action that is constituted by a basic mental action's bringing about a certain motion of one's body. The basic action here is often called a volition, which is said to be the agent's willing, trying, or endeavoring to move a certain part of her body in a certain way.

Ginet (1989, 1990, 1997, and 2002) and McCann (1998) have set out the most fully developed recent noncausal views of free will. Other recent accounts of this type are advanced by Goetz (1988, 1997, and 2000) and McCall (1994: ch. 9).

Both Ginet and McCann hold that some event involving an agent is a basic action in virtue of its possessing some intrinsic feature. On Ginet's view, the feature in question is an "actish phenomenal quality," which he describes (1990: 13) as its seeming to the agent as if she is directly producing, making happen, or determining the event that has this quality. McCann holds that basic actions are characterized by intrinsic intentionality. For example, when one makes a decision, he maintains (1998: 163), intrinsic to the decision is one's intending to make that very decision. (E.g., when one decides to A, one intends to decide to A.) One's so intending is not a matter of the content of the intention that is formed in deciding, nor is it a matter of one's having any further intention in addition to that formed in making the decision. Rather, McCann holds, it is a matter of a decision's being, by its very nature, an act that one means to be performing.

As is characteristic of proponents of noncausal accounts, neither Ginet nor McCann places any additional positive requirements on free action; the further requirements are instead that certain conditions be absent. Both require that the action not be causally determined. Ginet requires, further, that in performing the action, the agent not be subject to irresistible compulsion.

Two main problems arise for noncausal accounts of free will; both are problems, in the first instance, for noncausal accounts of action. The first concerns control. Performing an action—even acting unfreely—is exercising some variety of active control over one's behavior. Acting freely is exercising an especially valuable variety of active control. An account of free decision or other free action ought to say what this latter variety of control is or in what it consists. A common objection is that noncausal accounts fail to meet this requirement.

The second (and related) problem concerns acting for reasons. Acting freely is acting with a capacity for rational self-governance and determining, oneself, whether and how one exercises that capacity on a given occasion. Hence it must be possible for a free action to be an action performed for a certain reason, and an action for which there is a true reason-explanation. Again, it is often objected that noncausal views cannot provide adequate accounts of these phenomena.

1.1 Control

An obvious candidate for an account of active control is that an agent's exercising such control consists in her action's being caused, in an appropriate way, by her, or by certain events involving her, such as her having certain beliefs and desires and a certain intention. Noncausal views reject such an account; let us consider some alternatives.

On Ginet's view, the single positive characteristic present in all basic actions is the actish phenomenal quality, its seeming to the agent as if she is directly making happen the event that is her basic action. But it cannot be true, he holds, that we are agent-causes of our actions, nor need it be the case that any events involving us cause them. Ginet stresses that his description of this quality is metaphorical; the experience does not literally represent to the agent that she is bringing about the event in question.

Whatever the correct characterization of this phenomenal quality, it may be objected that the mere feel of a mental event, although it may be a (more or less reliable) sign of an individual's active control over that event, cannot itself constitute such control. The objection is reinforced by the fact that, on Ginet's view, an event with the actish feel could be brought about by direct stimulation of someone's brain, in the absence of any relevant desire or intention on the part of that person. An event produced in this way and in these circumstances would hardly seem to be an exercise of the subject's agency.

McCann (1998: 180) holds that an agent's exercise of active control has two aspects: any basic action is a spontaneous, creative undertaking on the part of the agent, and it is intrinsically intentional. Again, the intentionality of a basic action is said to be a matter of its being intrinsically an occurrence that is meant, by the individual undergoing it, to be her doing. However, where intentionality is divorced from an appropriate causal production, it does not seem that it can, by itself, even partly constitute the exercise of active control. If intrinsic intentionality is at all possible, then it would seem to be possible for an event with this intrinsic feature to be brought about in the manner and in roughly the circumstances (in the absence of any relevant desire or prior intention) just considered in discussing Ginet's view. Again, such an occurrence, even if intrinsically something the individual undergoing which means to be an exercise of agency, hardly seems to be that.

The other aspect of the control that is said to be exercised in basic action—the spontaneity or activeness of such an occurrence—thus appears to be the crucial one. This aspect, too, McCann holds, is intrinsic to basic actions, and he maintains that "it has a certain sui generis character that renders it incapable of being reduced to anything else" (1998: 185). Reducible or not, however, activeness is a phenomenon that stands in need of explication. McCann rejects both agent-causal and event-causal construals of it, but because he offers no substantive alternative, the exercise of active control is left a mystery. The resulting view falls short as an account of action (and hence of free action) because it provides no positive account of the crucial phenomenon.

1.2 Reason-Explanation

Turning now to acting for certain reasons and to reason-explanation, again obvious candidates for accounts of the phenomena invoke causation: an agent acts for a certain reason only if the agent's having that reason causes, in an appropriate way, the agent's behavior, and citing a reason contributes to a (true) reason-explanation of an action only if the agent's having that reason caused, in an appropriate way, the action. Let us consider alternatives offered by noncausalists.

Suppose that S wants her glasses, which she has left in her friend R's room, where he is now sleeping. S also wants to wake R, because she desires his company, but she know that R needs some sleep, and hence she desires, too, not to wake him. S decides to enter R's room and does so, believing as she does that her action will contribute to the satisfaction of both the desire to get her glasses and the desire to wake R. (The example is adapted from Ginet [1990: 145].) What further facts about the situation could make it the case that, in entering the room, S acts on her desire to get her glasses, and that citing that desire provides a true reason-explanation of her action, while she does not act on her desire to wake R, and citing this latter desire does not give us a true reason-explanation of what she is doing?

Ginet's account of reason-explanations that cite antecedent desires (1990: 143) implies that the following conditions suffice for the truth of the explanation that cites S's desire to get her glasses:

(a) prior to entering the room, S had a desire to get her glasses, and

(b) concurrently with entering the room, S remembers that prior desire and intends of her entering the room that it satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire.

Given the indicated circumstances, citing S's desire to wake R will fail to give us a true reason-explanation, Ginet holds, just in case S does not intend of her action that it satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire.

Several objections may be raised against this account. Suppose that, although conditions (a) and (b) are fulfilled as S enters the room, her desire to get her glasses plays no role at all in bringing about (causing) her entry, while her desire to wake R, of which she is fully aware when she acts, does play such a role. Causalists (e.g., Mele [1992: ch. 13]) will then deny that S really acts on her desire to get her glasses and that citing it truly explains her action. Indeed, even some noncausalists deny that having a concurrent intention of the sort required by Ginet (together with awareness of the antecedent desire) suffices for acting for the reason in question. As McCann (1998: 163) suggests, one might have such an intention but fail to carry it out. An account that requires a concurrent intention of this sort, then, will need to provide for its implementation.

Further problems attend the concurrent intention that is required. First, the required intention is a second-order attitude, an attitude about (among other things) another of the agent's own attitudes (a certain desire of hers). But it seems that S might act on her desire to get her glasses even if her only intention when she enters the room is to retrieve her glasses. Second, intention-acquisitions themselves can be explained by citing reasons. Since Ginet's account of the reason-explanation of an action appeals to an intention, the question arises what can be said about the reason-explanation of the acquisition of that intention. Repeating the same sort of account here would generate a regress, and Ginet offers no alternative.

McCann takes a different approach. (See especially his 1998: ch. 8.) On his view, an agent decides for a certain reason, and citing that reason explains the decision, just in case, in cognizance of that reason, and in an intrinsically intentional act of intention formation, the agent forms an intention the content of which reflects the very goals presented in that reason. When S decides to enter R's room, for example, she decides for the reason of getting her glasses only if the intention that she forms in making that decision is an intention to enter for the sake of getting her glasses.

Here, again, there will be a clash of intuitions between causalists and noncausalists, with the former maintaining that if S's desire to get her glasses plays no role at all in bringing about her decision, then even if the content of her decision is to enter for the sake of getting her glasses, she does not really decide for that reason and citing it does not truly explain her decision. One does not, the objection goes, make it so just by intending it to be so, not even by intrinsically intentionally intending it to be so.

Moreover, the required correspondence between the reasons for which one decides and the content of one's decision is unnecessary. Sometimes prior to making a decision, an agent considers a large number and variety of factors. Her decision may then be made for many different reasons. It is implausible that each and every one of the reasons for which she makes her decision must enter into the content of the intention that she forms in making that decision. (For the same objection to a similar account of reason-explanation, see Mele [2003: 42-43].)

We have considered problems for noncausal accounts of action. However, since the noncausal views examined here place no positive requirements on free action beyond those that are placed on action, if they fail as adequate accounts of action, then a fortiori they fail as adequate accounts of free action.

2. Event-Causal Accounts

Compatibilist accounts of free action are typically event-causal views, invoking event-causal accounts of action. The simplest event-causal incompatibilist view takes the requirements of a good compatibilist account and adds that certain agent-involving events that cause the action must nondeterministically cause it. When these conditions are satisfied, it is held, the agent exercises in performing her action a certain variety of active control (which is said to consist in the action's being caused, in an appropriate way, by those agent-involving events), the action is performed for reasons, and there was a chance of the agent's not performing that action. It is thus said to have been open to the agent to do otherwise, even given that (it is claimed) its being so open is incompatible with the truth of determinism.

One common objection against such a view is that the indeterminism that it requires is destructive, that it would diminish the control with which an agent acts. A second common objection is that the required indeterminism is superfluous, that it adds nothing of value. We shall examine these objections below. First, let us consider a type of event-causal nondeterministic account that is advocated by writers who accept a qualified version of the first of these objections.

2.1 Deliberative Indeterminism

Some writers accept that indeterminism located in the immediate causation of a decision or other action would diminish control but hold that indeterminism confined to earlier stages in the processes leading to decision need not do so. Ekstrom (2000: ch. 4 and 2003) and Mele (1995: ch. 12, 1996, and 1999b) have advanced the most fully developed recent nondeterministic accounts of this sort. Such views have also been sketched by Dennett (1978) and Fischer (1995).

Overt action is sometimes preceded by a decision, and decision is sometimes preceded by a deliberative process in which the agent considers reasons for and against alternatives and makes an evaluative judgment concerning which alternative is best (or better or good enough). Focusing on decisions that follow such deliberation, Mele advances a view that allows (but does not require) the deterministic causation of the decision by the making of the judgment, and of the overt action by the decision. Indeterminism is required only at an earlier stage of the deliberative process. For example, the account is satisfied when it is undetermined which of a certain subset of the agent's nonoccurrent beliefs come to mind in the process of deliberation, where their coming to mind combines with other events to bring about the agent's evaluative judgment. (The subset in question consists of "beliefs whose coming or not coming to mind is not something that one would control even if determinism were true" [1995: 216].)

Mele argues that indeterminism of the sort required here does not diminish, at least not to any significant extent, "proximal control," a variety of control that is compatible with determinism. The required indeterminism nevertheless suffices, he holds, to provide the agent with "ultimate control" over her decision, which an agent has only if at no time prior to the decision is there any minimally causally sufficient condition for the agent's making that decision that includes no event or state internal to the agent.

In Ekstrom's account, the notion of preference, rather than that of evaluative judgment, plays a prominent role. A preference, as she understands it, is a desire "formed by a process of critical evaluation with respect to one's conception of the good" (2000: 106). The formation of a preference, she maintains, is an action. She requires indeterminism only in the production of these preferences. A decision or subsequent action is free, on her view, just in case it is brought about, in an appropriate way, by an active formation of a preference (favoring that decision or action), which preference-formation is in turn the result of an uncoerced exercise of the agent's evaluative faculty, the inputs to which (the considerations taken up in deliberation) nondeterministically cause the preference-formation.

Ekstrom holds that an agent is her preferences and acceptances (reflectively held beliefs), together with her faculty of forming these by reflective evaluation. When the formation of a preference is nondeterministically caused and it deterministically causes a decision and subsequent action, then, a preference that partly constitutes the agent, that is generated by an evaluative faculty that partly constitutes the agent, and that the agent could have prevented (by not forming that preference) causally determines the decision and subsequent action. What the agent does is then, Ekstrom holds, up to her.

Both Mele's and Ekstrom's views allow that a free decision or other free action may be causally determined by events none of which are free actions. Indeed, given the basic features of these accounts, both must (on pain of regress) allow that a free decision or other free action may be causally determined by events none of which are free actions and to none of which has the agent contributed by her performance of any free action. Incompatibilists typically do not allow such a thing.

One consideration that, combined with incompatibilism, counts against allowing such deterministic causation of free actions is the idea that, in acting freely, we make a difference to the way the world goes. As this idea has it, there are some things that happen that might not have, and there are some things that do not happen that might have, and in performing free actions, we make the difference. (I say more about such difference-making in section 2.3 below.) We can make a difference in this way in the performance of our actions only if, at least sometimes when we act, we are able, until the time of the action, to do other than what we actually do then. If, as incompatibilists hold, being able until time t to do other than what one does at t requires that nothing prior to t causally determines one's action at t, then we cannot make a difference to how things go in performing actions that are determined in the way allowed for free actions in these deliberative accounts.

2.2 Efforts of Will

Event-causal accounts of a more typical sort require that, for at least some free actions, there be nondeterministic causation of the free actions themselves. The most sophisticated recent account of this sort is that advanced by Kane (1985, 1989, 1994, 1996a, 1996b, 1999a, 1999b, 2000a, 2000b, 2000c, and 2002). Other views of this type are sketched by Nozick (1981: 294-316), Sorabji (1980: chs. 2 and 14), van Inwagen (1983: 137-50), and Wiggins (1973). Searle (2001: ch. 9) endorses an account of this sort as best capturing our experience of acting.

A free decision or other free action, Kane holds, is one for which the agent is "ultimately responsible" (1996b: 35). Ultimate responsibility for an action requires either that the action not be causally determined or, if the action is causally determined, that any determining cause of it either be or result (at least in part) from some action by that agent that was not causally determined (and for which the agent was ultimately responsible). Thus, on Kane's view, an agent may be ultimately responsible for a decision that is causally determined by her possessing certain character traits. But somewhere among the events that contributed (however indirectly) to her having those traits, and thus to her decision, there must have been some free actions by her that were not causally determined. Kane calls such "regress-stopping" actions "self-forming actions" (74). All self-forming actions, he argues, are acts of will; they are mental actions. He thus calls them "self-forming willings" (125), or SFWs.

Kane identifies six different types of SFWs, giving the most detailed treatment to what he calls moral choices or decisions and prudential choices or decisions. We shall focus here on the former; the two are sufficiently similar that the points made can be easily transferred to the latter.

In a case of moral choice, there is a motivational conflict within the agent. She believes that a certain type of thing morally ought to be done (and she is motivated to do that), but she also has a self-interested desire to perform an action of a type that is, in the circumstances, incompatible with her doing what she believes she ought to do. Given her commitment to her moral belief, she makes an effort of will to resist temptation, an effort "to get [her] ends or purposes sorted out" (1996b: 126). If the choice is to be an SFW, then it is required that the strength of this effort be indeterminate; Kane likens its indeterminacy to that of the position or momentum of a microphysical particle. And the effort's indeterminacy is held to be the source of the required indeterminism in the causal production of the choice. Again an analogy is drawn with an indeterministic understanding of microphysics. Just as whether a particle will penetrate a barrier may be undetermined because the particle's position and momentum are not both determinate, so "[t]he choice one way or the other is undetermined because the process preceding and potentially terminating in it (i.e., the effort of will to overcome temptation) is indeterminate" (128).

Kane further requires that any choice that is an SFW satisfy three plurality conditions. These require that the choice be made for reasons (which Kane takes to consist partly in the choice's being caused by the agent's having those reasons) and that it not be a result of coercion or compulsion. Each plurality condition also requires that, when the agent makes the choice, she wants more to act on the reasons for which she makes that choice than she wants to act on any competing reasons. An agent wants more to act on certain reasons, he holds, when her desire to act on those reasons has greater motivational strength than have any desires she has to act on competing reasons, and when it is settled in the agent's mind that those reasons, rather than her reasons for doing otherwise, are the ones that she will now and in the future act on. This wanting more to act on certain reasons is, on Kane's view, brought about by the choice in question. Finally, the plurality conditions require that, whichever choice is made, there have been at least one alternative choice that the agent was able to make such that, had she made it, it too would have satisfied the previously stated conditions.

In a situation of moral conflict, Kane maintains, the requirements for being an SFW may be satisfied by either choice that is made—the choice to do what one believes one ought to do or the choice to do what one is tempted to do. Where this is so, whichever choice the agent makes, she has chosen for the reasons that she wants more to act on, free from coercion and compulsion. If she has chosen to do what she believes she ought to do, then her choice is the result of her effort. If she has chosen to do what she was tempted to do, then she has not allowed her effort to succeed. Whichever choice she has made, she could have made the other. She is then ultimately responsible for the choice she has made.

Kane's requirement that the causation of a choice that is an SFW be nondeterministic has drawn the objection that indeterminism located here would diminish the agent's control over the making of the choice. The objection is often couched in terms of luck. (It is so developed by Almeida and Bernstein [2003], Ekstrom [2000: 105], Haji [1999a, 1999b, 2000a, 2000b, 2000c, and 2001], Mele [1998, 1999a, 1999b, and forthcoming], and Strawson [1994].) If the agent's effort of will nondeterministically causes her choice, then, whichever choice the agent makes, there was, until the occurrence of that choice, a chance that it would not occur. If the agent's effort to chose in accord with her moral judgment happens to succeed, the objection goes, then her choice is at least partly due to good luck. In another possible world with exactly the same laws of nature and exactly the same history up until the occurrence of the choice, the agent's (or her counterpart's) effort fails; there, but for good luck, goes she. And analogously, if, in the actual world, the agent's effort fails, then her choice is at least partly due to bad luck. Either way, the choice is to some degree due to luck. And to that degree, the objection concludes, the control that the agent exercises in making the choice is diminished.

Kane offers a complex reply to this objection. First (1996b: 171-72), he counters that with indeterminate events, exact sameness is not defined. If an agent's effort of will was indeterminate, then it cannot be that she and her counterpart made exactly the same effort, and one got lucky while the other did not. An objection that assumes that such exact sameness is possible, he holds, does not apply to his view. Kane infers from this point that free will requires a form of indeterminism in which there is chance as well as indeterminacy, with the former stemming from the latter. (He calls worlds with such indeterminism "non-Epicurean.") The chance in an Epicurean world (an indeterministic world without indeterminacy), he implies, would constitute control-diminishing luck.

Kane's claim that indeterminacy precludes exact sameness has been contested (see Clarke [1999 and 2003b: 86-87] and O'Connor [1996]). And Haji (1999a) and Mele (1999a and 1999b) contend that the argument from luck is just as effective if we consider an agent and her counterpart who are as similar as can be, given the indeterminacy of their efforts. Indeed, the argument might be advanced without any appeal to other worlds or counterparts: given that there is a chance that the effort will fail, the agent is lucky, it may be said, if it succeeds.

A further reply from Kane to the argument from luck appeals to the active nature of efforts of will. When an agent makes an effort to choose to do what she believes she ought to do, she actively tries to bring about a certain choice. When the agent makes that choice, she succeeds, despite the indeterminism, at doing what she was (actively) trying to do. And Kane points out that typically, when this is so, the indeterminism does not undermine responsibility (and hence it does not so diminish active control that there is not enough for responsibility). He describes a case (1999b: 227) in which a man hits a glass tabletop attempting to shatter it. Even though it is undetermined whether his effort will succeed, Kane notes, if the man does succeed, he may well be responsible for breaking the tabletop.

If left here, the reply would fail to address the problem of luck in a case where the agent chooses to do what she is tempted to do rather than what she believes she ought to do. In response to this shortcoming, Kane (1999a, 1999b, 2000b, 2000c, and 2002) has recently proposed a "doubling" of effort in cases of moral conflict. In such a case, he now holds, the agent makes two, simultaneous efforts of will, both indeterminate in strength. The agent tries to make the moral choice, and at the same time she tries to make the self-interested choice. Whichever choice she makes, then, she succeeds, despite the indeterminism, at doing something that she was actively trying to do.

This doubling of efforts of will introduces a troubling incoherence into cases of moral conflict. If an agent is actively trying, at one time, to make each of two obviously incompatible choices, that fact raises a serious question about the agent's rationality.

A further question concerns the efficacy of the appeal to the active nature of these efforts. In the case of the man who breaks the tabletop, his breaking the tabletop is free (if it is) not just because it results from an active effort to break the tabletop, but because it results (we are to presume) from a free effort to break the tabletop. A successful effort to make a certain choice can contribute in an analogous way to the choice's being free, then, only if the effort itself is free. What is needed, then, is an account of the freedom-level active control with which the agent acts in making these efforts of will.

Kane (2002: note 29) maintains that, although the effort of will that precedes a choice that is an SFW might be an action for which the agent is ultimately responsible, such an effort need not itself be an SFW. However, if the agent is ultimately responsible for the effort and it is not itself an SFW, then the agent must, on Kane's view, have contributed (however indirectly), by her performance of at least one earlier SFW, to the effort in question. Since, on Kane's account, all SFWs either are efforts of one sort or another or must be preceded by efforts, the task of providing an account of the freedom of an effort cannot be avoided.

Kane faces the following dilemma in providing such an account. If the account of the freedom of an effort of will requires that the effort itself result from a prior free effort, then a vicious regress looms. On the other hand, if the account of the freedom of an effort of will need not appeal to any prior free efforts of will, then it would seem that the account of a regress-stopping free choice could likewise dispense with such an appeal.

2.3 A Simpler View

Kane's appeal to indeterminate efforts of will, and the appeal thereby to non-Epicurean indeterminism, do not appear to help meet the objection that indeterminism located in the causation of decisions or other actions themselves diminishes control. (Neither does it appear that help comes from his requirement that, in making a choice that is an SFW, the agent come to want more to act on the reasons for which she makes that choice. For, on Kane's view, this wanting more is brought about by the choice. And, if an event-causal view is on the right track, the agent's control over the making of the choice is a matter of the production of the choice, not of what the choice produces.) A simpler event-causal incompatibilist account, then, may fare as well against the problem of control. How badly would it fare?

Suppose that Elena is considering whether to A or to B. She recognizes what she regards as a fairly strong reason to A, and she recognizes what she regards as a somewhat weaker reason to B. At a certain time, t, she decides to A. Consider a view on which the prior deliberative events nondeterministically cause that decision. The view need not require, though it may allow, that there was a chance that at t Elena would decide to B. Incompatibilism requires here that something other than deciding at t to A have been causally open, and that requirement will be met if there was a chance that at t Elena would continue deliberating, seeking further reasons for or against the two alternatives she is considering.

It certainly is not clear that the chance required here constitutes control-diminishing luck. However, the open alternatives required may not be sufficiently robust to satisfy many incompatibilists, who may want to require that, at least sometimes, when an agent makes a decision, there was a chance that at that time she would instead make an alternative decision, even if any such alternative would have been contrary to the agent's assessment of the reasons that she had recognized. Suppose the view requires that, in Elena's case, there have been a chance that she would at t decide to B. Does this sort of chanciness constitute control-diminishing luck?

Note that Elena's case still differs from the following sort. Suppose that Lucas throws a dart, attempting to hit a target, which he succeeds in doing. Due to certain properties of the dart and the air, the process leading from his releasing the dart and ending in the dart's hitting the target was nondeterministic, and there was a chance of the dart's missing the target. Lucas exercises (indirect) active control over the dart's hitting the target only by way of his prior action of throwing the dart. The indeterminism in this case (in comparison with a case in which his throwing the dart causally determines its hitting the target) diminishes the chance of his succeeding at bringing about a nonactive result that he is actively trying to bring about. It is for this reason that indeterminism here constitutes control-diminishing luck.

But the indeterminism in Elena's case is located differently; it is located in the causal connection between certain nonactive events—Elena's recognizing and assessing certain reasons—and her performance of a basic action—her making a decision. She exercises active control over the making of the decision not by performing any prior action, but by making the decision. If indeterminism—in the form of nondeterministic causation—located here diminishes control, the explanation of why it does so will have to be different from the explanation of why the indeterminism in Lucas' case diminishes control. It is not obvious what this alternative explanation would be.

Even if the indeterminism required by an event-causal incompatibilist account does not diminish control, it does not appear to increase it, and a second objection may be raised, charging that the requirement is then superfluous. In order to assess this second objection, it may prove helpful to reflect on why free will is important to us.

We value a freedom in acting that grounds dignity and responsibility, in the exercise of which we make a difference to the way the world goes, and one that accords with the appearance of openness that we find in deliberating. We can distinguish two aspects of this freedom: a kind of leeway or openness of alternatives, and a type of control that is exercised in action. The freedom in which we are interested for some of the above things may involve one but not the other of these aspects. (For example, Frankfurt [1969] has argued that an agent may be responsible for what she has done even if she could not have done otherwise.) In a similar fashion, it may be that what is gained with the indeterminism required by an event-causal incompatibilist account has to do with one but not the other of these aspects.

An agent's exercise of control in acting is her exercise of a positive power to determine what she does. If event-causal views are correct, this is a matter of the action's being caused, in an appropriate way, by certain events involving the agent, such has her having certain reasons and a certain intention. An event-causal incompatibilist account adds no new causes to those that can be required by a standard compatibilist account, and hence the former appears to add nothing to the agent's positive power to determine what she does. As far as this aspect of freedom is concerned, the requirement of indeterminism may well be (at best) superfluous.

But not so when it comes to the other aspect, the openness of more than one course of action. If incompatibilists are correct, there is never any such openness if the world is deterministic. The indeterminism required by an event-causal incompatibilist account suffices to secure this leeway or openness, and this may be important to us for several reasons. Some individuals, at least, may find that when they deliberate, they cannot help but presume that more than one course of action is genuinely open to them. If the world is in fact deterministic (and if incompatibilism is true), these individuals are subject to an unavoidable illusion (since we cannot avoid deliberating). And they may reasonably judge that it would be, for this reason, better if things are as presented in an event-causal incompatibilist view. Similarly, some individuals may reasonably judge that if things are as presented in this view, that is better with regard to our decisions' and other actions' making a difference to how the world goes. Of course, even if the world is deterministic, there is a way in which our decisions and other actions generally make a difference: had we not made those decisions and performed those actions, things would have gone differently. If things are as presented in an event-causal incompatibilist account, our decisions and other actions still generally make a difference in this way. But they may make a difference in a second way as well: they may be branch points in a probabilistic unfolding of history, branch points over which we exercise active control. There may have been a real chance of things' not going a certain way, and these decisions and other actions may be the events that set things going that way. One may reasonably judge that it is better to be making a difference in this second as well as in the first way with one's decisions and other actions. Since we cannot be making a difference in this second way if the world is deterministic, some individuals may have reason to find that the indeterminism required by an event-causal incompatibilist view is not superfluous but adds something of value.

It is less clear that anything is to be gained with respect to responsibility. As was suggested above, it does not appear that on an event-causal incompatibilist account, agents exercise any greater positive powers of control than they could in a deterministic world. If Frankfurt is right, and the openness provided by such an account is not required for responsibility, then whether the account secures responsibility would appear to depend just on what positive powers of control it offers. Hence, if responsibility is not compatible with the truth of determinism, it may not be compatible with the truth of an event-causal incompatibilist account, either.

3. Agent-Causal Accounts

If, on an event-causal incompatibilist view, agents do not exercise any greater positive powers of control than they can on a compatibilist account, what type of incompatibilist view would secure greater control? A number of incompatibilists have maintained that such a view must hold that a free decision or other free action (or some component of it), while not causally determined by events, is caused by the agent, and that this causation by the agent is itself not causally determined. Further, causation by an agent is held, on such an account, not to consist in causation by events (such as the agent's having certain reasons). An agent, it is said, is a continuant, an enduring substance. An agent is thus not the kind of thing that can itself be an effect (though various events in its life can be). On these agent-causal accounts, then, an agent is in a strict and literal sense an originator of her free actions, an uncaused cause of her behavior. This combination of indeterminism and origination is thought to capture best the kind of freedom we desire with respect to dignity, responsibility, difference-making, and the appearance of openness.

An early advocate of this type of view was Reid ([1788] 1969). In recent years, agent-causal accounts have been advanced by Chisholm (1966, 1971, 1976a, 1976b, and 1978), Clarke (1993 and 1996), Donagan (1987), O'Connor (1995, 1996, 2000a, 2000b, and 2002), Rowe (1991 and 2000), Taylor (1966 and 1992), Thorp (1980), and Zimmerman (1984). Clarke (2003b) sets out an agent-causal account but ultimately rejects it.

Any view of this type faces three main problems. One concerns acting freely for reasons and the reason-explanation of free actions; a second concerns the intelligibility of the notion of agent causation and whether causation by an agent (where this is understood to be causation by a substance) is possible; the third is our old friend, the problem of luck.

3.1 Agent Causation and Reason-Explanation

We saw in section 1.2 that serious difficulties confront accounts of acting for reasons and of reason-explanation that do not appeal to the causation of action by the agent's having certain reasons. Standard agent-causal views deny that events such as the agent's having certain reasons cause any free action (or whatever event the agent directly causes when she acts freely). Such views must, then, offer some alternative account of the phenomena in question.

The most sophisticated such proposal is that advanced by O'Connor (2000b: ch. 5). At the core of the proposal is O'Connor's account of the reason-explanation of free decisions. As he sees it, agents do not cause free decisions; rather, a free decision is a causally complex event, consisting of the agent's causing her coming to have a certain intention. Such a causally complex event is, in turn, a component of any free overt action, such as one's freely raising one's arm. Suppose, now, that an agent freely decides to A right away and does so. The free decision to A can be explained by citing an antecedent desire, O'Connor maintains, if

(a) prior to making that decision, the agent had the desire in question and believed that A-ing would satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire; and

(b) the intention to A that the agent comes to have in making the decision is caused by the agent and is an intention to A here and now in order to satisfy the desire in question (adapted from O'Connor [2000b: 86]).

One objection to such a view is that it appeals to something that is not necessary for the truth of the kind of explanation we are considering (cf. Feldman and Buckareff [2003]). One may decide on the basis of a certain desire, and citing that desire may yield a true reason-explanation of one's decision, even if the intention that one forms in deciding is not a second-order attitude, an attitude that is about (in part) another of one's attitudes (a certain desire). O'Connor might accept this point and propose that we will have a true reason-explanation as well if the intention that is acquired represents, not the desire in question, but rather the object of that desire. The proposal would then resemble McCann's account of reason-explanation. However, one can decide on the basis of a desire even if the intention that one forms in making that decision does not represent, in its content, the object of that desire. As was observed in examining McCann's view, an agent sometimes makes a decision for many reasons, and it is implausible that each and every one of the reasons for which a decision is made must be enter into the content of that decision.

A further objection is that O'Connor's account of reason-explanation commits him to an implausible view of the explanation of causally complex events. As he has it, whether an explanation citing a persisting state of an agent truly explains the agent's causing her acquisition of a certain intention depends crucially on whether the effect component of this causally complex event has a certain feature, and the truth of the explanation does not require that the agent's being in the cited state cause either the causally complex event, the cause component of that event, or the effect component of that event. But we do not find this sort of thing to be so in cases of the explanation of any other sorts of causally complex event.

Consider a case that is in important respects analogous to what we are examining here. Suppose that a flash of lightning has caused a brush fire. A drought, let us say, had left the brush dry, and had this not been so, the lightning flash would not have caused the fire, or at least would have been less likely to do so. Now suppose that the dryness of the brush is cited as an explanation of the flash's causing the fire. Does the truth of this alleged explanation hinge on whether the fire has a certain feature, and can the explanation be true even if the brush's being dry does not cause either the flash, the fire, or the flash's causing the fire? Surely not.

The difficulty here arises from O'Connor's requirement, like that imposed by most proponents of agent-causal views, that only the agent cause what is directly agent-caused in a free action. But agent causalists need not impose such a requirement. Clarke (1993, 1996, and 2003b) proposes an agent-causal account on which a free action is caused by the agent and nondeterministically caused by certain agent-involving events, such as the agent's having certain reasons and a certain intention. Given this appeal to event causation, the view can provide the same accounts of acting for reasons and of reason-explanation as can event-causal views. And since the event causation that is posited is required to be nondeterministic, the view secures the openness of alternatives, even on the assumption that this openness is incompatible with determinism. Finally, the agent causation itself is still held to be distinct from causation by any events, and so this view secures the origination of free actions that seemed an appealing feature of standard agent-causal accounts.

Here is a brief illustration of a freely made decision, as this type of view would have it. Suppose that on some occasion a certain individual, Leo, is deliberating about whether to tell the truth or to lie. He has reasons favoring each alternative and an intention to make up his mind now. Suppose that there is a nonzero probability that Leo's having the reasons favoring telling the truth (together with his having the indicated intention) will nondeterministically cause his deciding to tell the truth; and suppose that there is, as well, a nonzero probability that his having the reasons favoring lying (together with his having the intention) will instead nondeterministically cause his deciding to lie. Then, given all prior conditions, it is open to Leo to make the former decision and open to him to make the latter instead. Now suppose that, as a matter of nomological necessity, in the circumstances, whichever of the open decisions Leo makes, that decision will be made, and it will be caused by his having the reasons that favor it, only if Leo–the agent—causes that decision. Finally, suppose that, in fact, Leo decides to tell the truth. His decision is caused by him, and it is nondeterministically caused by his having reasons favoring the action decided upon (and his having the intention to make up his mind). He would make that decision only if he caused it. On this view, Leo's exercising control over which decision he makes–his determining which of the open decisions he makes–consists in his decision's being (appropriately) caused by him and by these mental events involving him.

3.2 Causation by a Substance

Turning to the second main problem for agent-causal views, all theorists who accept a causal construal of agents' control over what they do—and this includes most compatibilists as well as many incompatibilists—hold that, in a sense, agents cause their free actions. However, most hold that causation by an agent is just causation by certain events involving the agent, such as the agent's having certain reasons and a certain intention. But, as we have seen, the agent causation posited by agent-causal accounts is held not to be this at all. It is said by most agent-causal theorists to be fundamentally different from event causation. And this raises the question whether any intelligible account of it can be given. Even some proponents of agent-causal views (e.g., Taylor [1992: 53]) seem doubtful about this, declaring agent causation to be strange or even mysterious.

In contrast, O'Connor (1995, 1996, 2000a, 2000b, and 2002) and Clarke (1993, 1996, and 2003b), though differing on details, have both suggested that agent causation might be characterized along the same lines as event causation, if the latter is given a nonreductive account. Familiar reductive accounts characterize event causation in terms of constant conjunction or counterfactual dependence or probability increase, and if event causation is so characterizable, then agent causation would have to be fundamentally different. But if causation is a basic, irreducible feature of the world, then we might with equal intelligibility be able to think of substances as well as events as causes.

Even if we can intelligibly think of such a thing, there remains the objection that it is impossible for a substance to cause  anything. Enduring substances, like events, are particulars. Physical substances and events the constituent objects of which are physical are both concrete (spatiotemporal) particulars. However, substances are not in time—they are not dated entities—in the same respect as are events. The latter are directly temporal: they occur at times (usually during some interval of time). An enduring substance is in time only in that events involving it (e.g., its creation, development, and extinction) are directly in time. (For discussion of this difference, see Donagan [1987: 33-34], Hacker [1982], and Lombard [1986: 69-71].)

Two objections to the possibility of substance causation can be based on such a difference. The first is a development of an objection raised by Broad (1952: 215). Effects, it is observed, are caused to occur at times. This can be so, it is claimed, only if their causes likewise occur at times—only, that is, if their causes are directly in time in the way in which events are but substances are not.

If a substance causes an event, it does so in virtue of having some causally relevant property. The substance causes the effect to occur at a certain time at least partly in virtue of having that property at a certain time. A view on which some causes are substances may seek to acommodate, in this indirect manner, the temporality of causaton. But the accomodation comes perilously close to acknowledging that it is the substance's having the property at the time in question—that is, an event—that is the cause. At least, this is the more straightforward way of accounting for the temporality of causation.

Second, undetermined event causes, with their occurrence, generally have some influence on the single-case, objective probabilities (chances) of the events that they eventually bring about. They generally have this influence because they have tendencies, of various degrees, to produce these later events. Anything with a tendency to cause some event should, it seems, be the sort of thing that can influence probabilities in this way. Events are the sort of thing that can so influence probabilities, and this is due, it seems, to the fact that they occur at times. With its occurrence, an event may raise the chance of a subsequent event that it has some tendency to cause. Since substances do not occur, they do not appear to be the sort of thing that can influence probabilities in the indicated way. Substances thus do not seem fit to be causes.

3.3 Luck, Again

A final difficulty for agent-causal views accepts that all they require might be possible. The objection may still be raised that actions produced as required by such an account would be too subject to luck to be free actions. Van Inwagen has raised a similar objection to agent-causal accounts—though without referring to luck—on several occasions (see his 1983: 145 and 2000). Haji (2004) and Mele (forthcoming) present the objection in terms of luck as follows. Recall Leo's decision (section 3.1) to tell the truth. Until he makes the decision, there remains a chance that he will not decide to tell the truth, but will instead decide to lie. Likewise, until he makes the decision, there remains a chance that he will not cause a decision to tell the truth, but will instead cause a decision to lie. Then, in some possible world W with the same laws as those in the actual world, and with the same history up to the time of the decision, Leo decides at that time to lie, and he causes that decision to lie. The actual world, where Leo decides to tell the truth (and causes that decision), and world W, where he decides to lie (and causes that decision), do not differ in any respect until the time at which Leo makes the decision (which is also the time at which Leo causes the decision). There is, then, no difference between these two worlds to account for the difference in the decision, and likewise no difference to account for the difference in Leo's agent causings. Hence the difference between these two worlds is just a matter of luck. But if the difference between these two worlds is just a matter of luck, then Leo does not freely make his decision in the actual world.

Perhaps the best reply available to a defender of an agent-causal account is to argue that the difference between the two worlds in question is a matter of Leo's exercising his free will differently in them. As the familiar conception has it, when one exercises free will in acting, a plurality of alternatives is open to one, and one determines, oneself, which alternative one pursues. When one does, one is an ultimate source or origin of one's action. An agent-causal account may be said to realize this basic conception quite well. On the assumption that incompatibilism is correct, the account's requirement of indeterminism is needed to secure the openness of alternatives. And its requirement of agent causation may be thought to secure the agent's determining, herself, which alternative she pursues, as well as her originating her action. (Unlike what we have with any event-causal view, with an agent-causal account, the agent is quite literally an ultimate source or origin of her action.) If the account satisfactorily realizes this basic conception, then it may be credibly claimed that the difference in question between worlds is a matter of  Leo's exercising his free will differently.

No reply of this sort is going to be decisive; but then, neither is the objection. We seem to have here a conflict of intuitions.

4. The Evidence

Our assessment of incompatibilist accounts so far has primarily focused on whether they satisfactorily characterize what free will would be, if there is such a thing. However, even if one or another of these views characterizes well the freedom that we value, and even if what that account characterizes is something that is possible, the question remains whether there is good evidence that what is posited by that account actually exists.

Incompatibilist accounts require, first, that determinism be false. But more than this, they require that there be indeterminism of a certain sort (e.g., with some events entirely uncaused, or nondeterministically caused, or caused by agents and not deterministically caused by events) and that this indeterminism be located in specific places (generally, in the occurrence of decisions and other actions). What is our evidence with regard to these requirements' being satisfied?

It is sometimes claimed (e.g., by Campbell [1957: 168-70] and O'Connor [1995: 196-97]) that our experience when we make decisions and act constitutes evidence that there is indeterminism of the required sort in the required place. We can distinguish two parts of this claim: one, that in deciding and acting, things appear to us to be the way that one or another incompatibilist account says they are, and two, that this appearance is evidence that things are in fact that way. Some writers (e.g., Mele [1995: 135-37]) deny the first part. But even if this first part is correct, the second part seems dubious. If things are to be the way they are said to be by some incompatibilist account, then the laws of nature—laws of physics, chemistry, and biology—must be a certain way. (This is so for overt, bodily actions regardless of the relation between mind and body, and it is so for decisions and other mental actions barring a complete independence of mental events from physical, chemical, and biological events.) And it is incredible that how things seem to us in making decisions and acting gives us insight into the laws of nature. Our evidence for the required indeterminism, then, will have to come from the study of nature, from natural science.

The scientific evidence for quantum mechanics is sometimes said to show that determinism is false. Quantum theory is indeed very well confirmed. However, there is nothing approaching a consensus on how to interpret it, on what it shows us with respect to how things are in the world. Indeterministic as well as deterministic interpretations have been developed, but it is far from clear whether any of the existing interpretations is correct. Perhaps the best that can be said here is that, given the demise of classical mechanics and electromagnetic theory, there is no good evidence that determinism is true.

The evidence is even less decisive with respect to whether there is the kind of indeterminism located in exactly the places required by one or another incompatibilist account. Unless there is a complete independence of mental events from physical events, then even for free decisions there has to be indeterminism of a specific sort at specific junctures in certain brain processes. There are some interesting speculations in the works of some incompatibilists about how this might be so (see, e.g., Kane [1996b: 128-30 and 137-42] and the sources cited there); but our current understanding of the brain gives us no evidence one way or the other about whether it is in fact so. At best, it seems we must remain, for the time being, agnostic about this matter.

If incompatibilist free will requires agent causation, and if such a thing is possible, that is another requirement about which we lack evidence. Indeed, it is not clear that there could be any empirical evidence for or against this aspect of agent-causal views.

In sum, we do not have good evidence that any incompatibilist account is true. Some incompatibilists (e.g., van Inwagen [1983: 204-13]) hold that we nevertheless have good reason to believe that some such view is correct, since we have good reason to believe that we are morally responsible, that moral responsibility requires free will, and that free will requires indeterminism. However, lacking empirical evidence for the required indeterminism, if we justifiably believe the last two of the just mentioned propositions, then we have a good reason not to treat each other as morally responsible. For if we are not responsible, then whenever we treat someone as responsible, we do that individual an injustice. And if indeterminism of a certain sort and in a certain location is required for responsibility and we lack evidence for the required indeterminism, then we risk this injustice whenever we treat someone as responsible. That is a strong moral reason (for incompatibilists) not to do so.


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