Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Evolutionary Game Theory

1. In a mixed strategy, a player assigns a probability to each pure strategy, and chooses which strategy to play using a randomization device. For the Hawk-Dove game, one mixed strategy would assign equal probabilities to playing Hawk or Dove, and decide which to play in a given case by flipping a fair coin.

2. In Nowak and May's model, each individual on the lattice plays the prisoner's dilemma with their eight nearest neighbors. At the end of each game round, an individual compares her score with that of her neighbors. If one of her neighbors earned a higher score, that player will adopt the strategy used by her most successful neighbor (presumably using some kind of randomization process to break ties). If no neighbor earned a higher score, that player will continue using the same strategy for the next round of play. All individuals switch strategies at the same time, and all have the same payoff structure.

3. Of course, Nowak and May were speaking somewhat loosely when they referred to this behavior as "chaotic." Since there are only finitely many states of the population, it must be the case that this dynamical system will eventually settle into a cycle (although it may not repeat itself for a very long time). However, the point is clear enough: in this particular case we are incapable of predicting the state of the model after N generations (for a large N) without running the model for that length of time. In both of the previous cases, it is easy to predict the future state of the population given its current state.

4. Both agents would clearly do better if both agents elected to cooperate, but the point where both individuals choose cooperate is not a Nash equilibrium: if both agents initially cooperate, the first individual can increase her payoff by choosing to defect (and vice versa).

5. This is a problem only when we consider games other than two-person zero sum games, since all Nash equilibria in these sort of games have equivalent payoffs and are interchangable.

6. One "beauty pageant" game is as follows: a group of subjects is told to choose any number in the interval [0,100]. The person whose choice is closest to half of the mean of the group wins the game. Assuming that the rules of the game and the rationality of the players are common knowledge, the predicted outcome of the game is that all members of the group choose 0. Since 50 is the largest possible winning choice (if each subject chose 100, half of the group mean would be 50), no rational individual would choose a number more than 50. However, since no rational individual would choose a number greater than 50, and all subjects know this, no subject will choose a number greater than 25. In the limit, all players will converge upon 0. Tests with real human subjects (other than game theorists or people who have been exposed to this game before) demonstrate that the modal offer is significantly greater than zero. If the game is repeated, though, subjects do approach the game theoretic prediction.

7. In the Hawk-Dove game discussed in section 2, the quantities in the payoff matrix represent the change in Darwinian fitness of the two individuals.

8. A more appropriate name would be "Hume's fallacy." Moore's "naturalistic fallacy" discussed in Principia Ethica differs significantly from the mistaken inference of an ought-statement from an is-statement. Using the same label for such different fallacies invites confusion.