Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Philosophy of Film

First published Wed Aug 18, 2004; substantive revision Mon Sep 11, 2006

The philosophy of film is a rapidly growing subfield of contemporary philosophy of art. Although philosophers were among the first academics to publish studies of the new artform in the early decades of the twentieth century, the field continued to develop but it did not experience significant growth until the 1980's when a renaissance occurred. There are many reasons for the field's recent growth. Suffice it to say here that changes in both academic philosophy and the cultural role of the movies in general made it imperative for philosophers to take film seriously as an artform on a par with the more traditional ones like theater, dance, and painting. As a result of this surge in interest in film as a subject for philosophic reflection, the philosophy of film is now an important area of research in aesthetics.

This entry is organized around a number of issues that are central to the philosophy of film. They explore different aspect of film as an artistic medium, illustrating the range of concerns addressed within the philosophy of film.

1. The Idea of a Philosophy of Film

There are two features of the philosophy of film that need to be discussed before delving into more specific issues. The first is that film scholars who are not professional philosophers have made many contributions to the field. This differentiates this area from many other philosophical disciplines. While physicists often write about the philosophy of science, the academic discipline of the philosophy of physics is dominated by professional philosophers. Not so in the philosophy of film. As a result, my use of the term “philosopher of film” will be broad, intended to include all of those interested in theoretical issues about the cinema.

The second peculiarity is that within film studies — itself an institutionalized area of academic study — there is a sub-field of film theory that has significant overlap with the philosophy of film even though the majority of its practitioners operate on significantly different philosophical assumptions than Anglo-American philosophers of film. In the balance of this entry, I shall include both of these areas under the rubric of the philosophy of film, although my primary emphasis is on the contributions of Anglo-American theorists and I will occasionally distinguish this field from film theory as practiced within the area of film studies. One of the characteristics of philosophy as a discipline is its questioning of its own nature and basis. The philosophy of film shares this characteristic with the field in general. Indeed, a first issue that the philosophy of film must address is the grounds for its own existence. This involves not only the question of what the field should look like, but also that of whether it has any reason to exist at all.

Is there any need for a separate philosophic discipline devoted to film in addition to more empirical studies of film undertaken under the aegis of film studies itself? Although this question has not always received the attention it deserves from philosophers, it is actually a pressing one, for it asks philosophers to justify their newly found interest in film as more than an opportunistic incorporation of a highly popular form of popular culture into their domain.

In one sense, however, philosophers need not justify their interest in film, for philosophical aesthetics has always had a concern not just with art in general but with specific art forms. Beginning with Aristotle's Poetics — a work devoted to explaining the nature of Greek tragedy — philosophers have sought to explain the specific characteristics of each significant art form of their culture. From this point of view, there is no more reason to question the existence of a philosophy of film than there is that of a philosophy of music or a philosophy of painting, two fields that are well accepted among the concerns of aesthetics. Since film is a significant artform in our contemporary world, philosophy might even be judged to have a responsibility to investigate its nature.

Still, there are some reasons why it might seem problematic for there to be a separate academic field of the philosophy of film. Because the study of film is already institutionalized within academia in the discipline of film studies, and because that field includes a separate sub-field of film theory, it might seem that, unlike literature and music, say, film is already well-served by this institutional base. From this point of view, the philosophy of film is redundant, occupying a space that has already been carved out by an alternative discipline.

The problem is that the sub-field of film theory within film studies has been dominated by a range of theoretical commitments that many Anglo-American philosophers do not share. Many such philosophers have therefore felt a need not just to make minor revisions in the field and its understanding of film but rather to make a new beginning in the study of film that does not share the problematic assumptions of film theory itself. For this reason, as well as the earlier-cited view of film as a legitimate topic within aesthetics, they have felt it important to develop a philosophically informed mode of thinking about film.

But once the philosophy of film is granted autonomy as a separate sub-field of aesthetics, the question arises as to its form. That is, philosophers are concerned with the issue of how the philosophy of film should be constituted as a field of study. What role is there for film interpretation in the field? How do studies of particular films relate to more theoretical studies of the medium as such? And what about philosophy in film, a popular mode of philosophic thinking about film? Is there a unified model that can be employed to characterize this newly vitalized domain of philosophic inquiry?

An increasingly popular way of thinking about the philosophy of film is to model it on scientific theorizing. Although there is disagreement on the precise details of such a proposal, its adherents urge that the study of film be treated as a scientific discipline with an appropriate relationship between theory and evidence. For some, this means having an empirical body of film interpretations that gives rise to wider theoretical generalizations. For others, it means developing a set of small scale theories that attempt to explain different aspect of films and our experience of them. The emphasis here is on developing models or theories of various features of films.

This idea of modeling the discipline of the philosophy of film on the natural sciences has been prominent among cognitive film theorists. This rapidly developing approach emphasizes viewers' conscious processing of films, as opposed to the emphasis within traditional film theory on unconscious processes. In general, these theorists lean towards seeing the study of film as a scientific undertaking.

The idea that the philosophy of film should model itself upon a scientific model has been contested from a variety of points of view. Some philosophers, relying on the writings of pragmatists like William James, have questioned the idea that natural science provides a useful way to think about what philosophers are doing in their reflections on film. Here, there is an emphasis on the particularity of films as works of art in contrast the to the urge to move to a general theory of film. Others, making use of later Wittgenstein as well as the tradition of hermeneutics, also question such a natural scientific orientation for philosophic reflections on film. This camp sees the study of film as a humanistic discipline that is misunderstood when it is assimilated to a natural science.

The debates about what the philosophy of film should look like are really just being joined. This is because it is only recently that a scientific conception of the philosophy of film has emerged as a competitor. But despite the increasing popularity of a cognitive approach to film, there are fundamental issues about the structure of the philosophy of film that remain to be settled.

2. The Nature of Film

The question that dominated early philosophical inquiry into film was whether the cinema — a term that emphasizes the institutional structure within which films were produced, distributed, and viewed — could be regarded as an artform. There were two reasons why cinema did not seem worthy of the honorific designation of an art. The first was that early contexts for the exhibition of films included such venues as the vaudeville peep show and the circus side show. As a popular cultural form, film seemed to have a vulgarity that made it an unsuitable companion to theater, painting, opera, and the other fine arts. A second problem was that film seemed to borrow too much from other art forms. To many, early films seemed little more than recordings of either theatrical performances or everyday life. The rationale for the former was that they could be disseminated to a wider audience than that which could see a live performance. But film then only seems to be a means of access to art and not an independent art form on its own. The latter, on the other hand, seemed too direct a reproduction of life to qualify as art, for there seemed little mediation by any guiding consciousness.

In order to justify the claim that film deserves to be considered an independent art form, philosophers investigated the ontological structure of film. The hope was to develop a conception of film that made it clear that it differed in significant ways from the other fine arts. For this reason, the question of film's nature was a crucial one for theorists of film during what we might call the classic period.

Hugo Münsterberg, the first philosopher to write a monograph about the new art form, sought to distinguish film by means of the technical devices that it employed in presenting its narratives. Flashbacks, close-ups, and edits are some examples of the technical means that filmmakers employ to present their narratives that theater lacks. For Münsterberg, the use of these devices distinguished film from the theater as an artform.

Münsterberg went on to ask how viewers are able to understand the role that these technical devices play in the articulation of cinematic narratives. His answer is that these devices are all objectifications of mental processes. A close-up, for example, presents in visual form a correlate to the mental act of paying attention to something. Viewers naturally understand how such cinematic devices function because they are familiar with the workings of their own minds and can recognize these objectified mental functions when they see them. Although this aspect of Münsterberg's theory links him to contemporary cognitive philosophers of film, he does not explain how viewers know that what they are looking at are objectified mental functions.

Münsterberg was writing during the silent era. The development of the simultaneous sound track — the “talkie” — changed film forever. It is not surprising that this important innovation spawned interesting theoretical reflections.

The well-known psychologist of art, Rudolph Arnheim, made the surprising claim that the talkie represented a decline from the highpoint of silent cinema. Relying on the idea that, in order to be a unique artform, film had to be true to its own specific medium, Arnheim denigrates the sound film as a mixture of two distinct artistic media that do not constitute a satisfying whole.

For Arnheim, the silent film had achieved artistic status by focusing on its ability to present moving bodies. Indeed, for him, the artistic aspect of cinema consisted in its ability to present abstractions, an ability completely lost when films began to employ simultaneous soundtracks. Writing near the dawn of the talkie, Arnheim could only see what we now recognize as a natural development of the artform as a decline from a previously attained height.

André Bazin, though not a professional philosopher or even an academic, countered Arnheim's assessment in a series of articles that still exert an important influence on the field. For Bazin, the important dichotomy is not that between the sound and the silent film but rather between films that focus on the image and those that emphasize editing. Although editing had emerged for many such as Sergei Eisenstein as the distinctive aspect of film, Bazin returns to the silent era to demonstrate the presence of an alternative means of achieving film art, namely an interest in allowing the camera to reveal the actual nature of the world. Relying on a conception of film as having a realist character because of its basis in photography, Bazin argues that the future of cinema as an artform depends on its development of this capacity to present the world to us “frozen in time.”

In making his argument, Bazin valorizes the film style he dubs realism, characterized by extended shots and deep focus. Jean Renoir, Orson Welles, and the Italian neo-Realists are the filmmakers whom Bazin sees as culminating this imagist tradition of filmmaking that has realized the true potential of the medium.

In his pathbreaking study of what he called “classical film theory,” Noël Carroll argued that there were many illicit presuppositions at play in the classical theorists' attempts to define film's nature. In particular, he accused them of confusing particular styles of filmmaking with more abstract claims about the nature of the medium itself. His accusations seemed to spell the end of such attempts to justify film styles by their grounding in the medium's nature.

Recent work on the nature of film has attempted to support a more refined version of Bazin's claims about film as a realist medium. In different ways, both Kendall Walton and Gregory Currie have argued that there is a defensible sense, albeit not one of Bazin's, in which film is a realist medium because of its basis in photography. There have been numerous attacks on these claims, not least by Carroll, but the question of whether film is a realist medium continues to be discussed. Most recently, the emergence of digital technologies for fashioning the image raise very basic questions about the plausibility of this view.

3. Film and Authorship

Films are the product of many individuals working together. This is apparent when one watches the credits at the end of any recent Hollywood film and sees the myriad names that come scrolling by. To coin a phrase, it takes a village to make a movie.

It might therefore seem surprising that there is a significant tendency among film scholars to treat films as the product of a single individual, its auteur or author. On this line of interpretation, the director of the film is the creative intelligence who shapes the entire film in a manner parallel to how we think of, say, literary works being authored.

The idea of the director as auteur was first suggested by Francois Truffaut — later to become one of the central directors in the French New Wave. Truffaut used the term polemically to denigrate the then dominant mode of filmmaking that emphasized the adaptation of great works of literature to the screen. In the attempt to valorize a different style of filmmaking, Truffaut argued that the only films that deserved to be designated art were those in which the director had complete control over its production by writing the screenplay as well as actually directing the actors. Only films made in this way deserved to be given the status of works of art.

The well-known American film scholar and reviewer, Andrew Sarris, adopted Truffaut's theory in order to legitimate film studies as an academic discipline. For Sarris, the auteur theory was a theory of film evaluation, for it suggested to him that the works of great directors were the only significant ones. In his somewhat idiosyncratic use of the idea, he even argued that the flawed works of major directors were artistically better than masterpieces made by minor ones. A more defensible aspect of his ideas was the emphasis on the entire ouvre of a director. Within film studies, the emphasis on synoptic studies of individual directors is derived from Sarris' version of the auteur theory.

A negative consequence of the influence of auterism is the relative neglect of other important contributors to the making of a film. Actors, cinematographers, screenwriters, composers, and art directors all make significant contributions to films that the auteur theory underestimates. While Truffaut introduced the term polemically to support a new style of filmmaking, subsequent theorists have tended to ignore the context of his remarks.

As a general theory of the cinema, then, the auteur theory is clearly flawed. Not all films — not even all great ones — can be attributed to the control of the director. Actors are the clearest examples of individuals who may have such a significant impact on the making of a specific film that the film has to be seen as attributable to them even more importantly than the director. Although films like Truffaut's own may be (mostly) the product of his authoring, a Clint Eastwood film owes a great deal of its success to that actor's presence. It is a mistake to treat all films as if they were simply the product of one crucial individual, the director.

A more general criticism of the auteur theory is its emphasis on individuals. Most of the great directors studied by film theorists worked within well-defined institutional settings, the most famous of which is Hollywood. To attempt to understand films without placing them within their broader context of production has been seen as a real shortcoming of the theory.

This sort of criticism of auterism has received a more theoretical formulation within postmodernism, with its famous (or infamous) declaration of the death of the author. What this self-consciously rhetorical gesture asserts is that works of art, including films, should not be seen as the product of a single controlling intelligence, but have to seen as products of their times and social contexts. The goal of the critic should not be to reconstruct the intentions of the author but to display the various different contexts that explain the production of the work as well as its limitations.

While the general institutional context is certainly crucial for understanding a film, the auteurtheory does nonetheless provide a useful focus for some efforts in the scholarly study of film: an exploration of the work of individual directors. But even here, there has been worry that the theory overemphasizes the contribution of the director at the expense of other people — actors, directors of photography, screenwriters — whose contributions may be equally important to the making of at least some films.

4. Emotional Engagement

Philosophic discussion of viewer involvement with films starts out with a puzzle that has been raised about many artforms: Why should we care what happens to fictional characters? After all, since they are fictional, their fates shouldn't matter to us in the way that the fates of real people do. But, of course, we do get involved in the destinies of these imaginary being. The question is why. Because so many films that attract our interest are fictional, this question is an important one for philosophers of film to answer.

One answer, common in the film theory tradition, is that the reason that we care about what happens to some fictional characters is because we identify with them. Although or, perhaps, because these characters are highly idealized — they are more beautiful, brave, resourceful, etc. than any actual human being could be — viewers identify with them, thereby also taking themselves to be correlates of these ideal beings. But once we see the characters as versions of ourselves, their fates matter to us, for we see ourselves as wrapped up in their stories. In the hands of feminist theorists, this idea was used to explain how films use their viewers' pleasures to support a sexist society. Male viewers of film, it was held, identify with their idealized screen counterparts and enjoy the objectification of women through both screen images that they view with pleasure and also narratives in which the male characters with whom they identify come to possess the sought after female character.

Philosophers of film have argued that identification is too crude a tool to use to explain our emotional engagement with characters, for there is a wide variety of attitudes that we take to the fictional characters we see projected on the screen. And even if we did identify with some characters, this would not explain why we had any emotional reactions to characters with whom we did not identify. Clearly, a more general account of viewer involvement with cinematic characters and the films in which they appear is required.

The general outline of the answer philosophers of film have provided to the question of our emotional involvement with films is that we care about what happens in films because films get us to imagine things taking place, things that we do care about. Because how we imagine things working out does affect our emotions, fiction films have an emotional impact upon us.

There are two basic accounts that philosophers have put forward to explain the effects that the imagination has upon us. Simulation theory employs a computer analogy, saying that imagining something involves one having one's usual emotional response to situations and people, only the emotions are running off-line. What this means is that, when I have an emotional response like anger to an imagined situation, I feel the same emotion that I would normally feel only I am not inclined to act on this emotion, say, by yelling or responding in an angry way, as I would be if the emotion was a full-fledged emotion.

What this explains, then, is a seemingly paradoxical feature of our film-going experience: that we seem to enjoy watching things on the screen that we would hate seeing in real life. The most obvious context for this is horror films, for we may enjoy seeing horrific events and beings that we would strongly desire not to witness in real life. The last thing I would want to see more of in real life is a rampaging giant ape, yet I am fascinated to watch its screen expoits. The simulation theorist says that the reason for this is that, when we experience an emotion off-line that would be distressing in real life, we may actually enjoy having that emotion in the safety of the off-line situation.

One problem facing the simulation theorist is explaining what it means for an emotion to be off-line. While this is an intriguing metaphor, it is not clear that the simulation theorist can provide an adequate account of how we are to cash it out.

An alternative account of our emotional response to imagined scenarios has been dubbed the thought theory. The idea here is that we can have emotional responses to mere thoughts. When I am told that a junior colleague of mine was unjustly denied reappointment, the thought of this injustice is sufficient to make me experience anger. Similarly, when I imagine such a scenario in relation to someone, the mere thought of them being treated in this way can occasion my anger. Mere thought can bring about real emotion.

What the thought theory claims about our emotional response to films is that our emotions are brought about by the thoughts that occur to us as we are watching a film. When we see the dastardly villain tying the innocent heroine to the tracks, we are both concerned and outraged by the very thought that he is acting in this way and that she is therefore in danger. Yet all the time we are aware that this is a merely fictional situation, so there is no temptation to yield to a desire to save her. We are always aware that no one is really in danger. As a result, there is no need, says the thought theorist, for the complexities of simulation theory in order to explain why we are moved by the movies.

There are some problems with thought theory as well. Why should a mere thought, as opposed to a belief, be something that occasions an emotional response from us? If I believe that you were wronged, that's one think. But the thought of your being wronged is another. Since we can't have full-fledged beliefs about the fictional characters in films, the thought theory needs to explain why we are so moved by their fates.

5. Film and Society

The best way to understand the innovations made by philosophers in our understanding of how films relate to society is to look at the view that was dominant in film theory some years ago. According to that view, popular narrative films — especially those produced by “Hollywood,” a term that referred to the entertainment industry located in Hollywood, California, but also included popular narrative films produced on a similar model — inevitably supported social oppression by denying, in one way or another, its existence. Such films were taken to present nothing but fairytales that used the realistic character of the medium to present those imaginary stories as if they were accurate pictures of reality. In this way, the actual character of the social domination assumed by such a view to be rampant in contemporary society was obscured in favor of a rosy picture of the realities of human social existence.

As part of their argument, these film theorists have gone beyond examining individual films themselves and have argued that the very structure of the narrative film functions to assist in the maintenance of social domination. From this point of view, an overcoming of narrativity itself is required for films to be genuinely progressive.

In opposition to such a negative view of film's relationship to society, philosophers of film have argued that popular films need not support social domination but can even give expression to socially critical attitudes. In making this argument, they have corrected film theory's tendency to make broad generalizations about the relationship between film and society that are not grounded in careful analysis of individual films. They have instead concentrated upon presenting detailed interpretations of films that show how their narratives present critical takes on various social practices and institutions. Class, race, gender, and sexuality are among the different social arenas in which philosophers of film have seen films make socially conscious, critical interventions in public debates.

One interesting example of films that develop political stances that are not merely supportive of existing modes of social domination are those that involve interracial couples. So Stanley Kramer's 1967 film, Guess Who's Coming to Dinner, investigates the plausibility of racial integration as a solution to the problems of anti-black racism in America through its portrayal of the problems facing an interracial couple. Nearly 25 years later, Spike Lee's Jungle Fever argues against the earlier film's political agenda, once again using an interracial couple that encounters racism. Only this time, the film asserts that the intransigent racism of White Americans undermines integration as a panacea to the ills of this racist society. And many other films employ this narrative figure to investigate other aspects of racism and possibilities for its overcoming.

Similarly, philosophers have looked outside of Hollywood to the films of progressive filmmakers like John Sayles to illustrate their belief that narrative films can make sophisticated political statements. A film like Matewan is shown to involve a sophisticated investigation of the relationship between class and race as sites of social domination.

In general, then, we can say that philosophers have resisted a monolithic condemnation of films as socially regressive and explored the different means that filmmakers have used to present critical perspectives on areas of social concern. While they have not ignored the ways in which standard Hollywood narratives undermine critical social awareness, they have shown that narrative film is an important vehicle for communal reflection on important social issues of the day.

6. Film as a Source of Knowledge and/or Insight

Ever since Plato banished poets from his ideal city in The Republic, hostility towards the arts has been endemic to philosophy. To a large extent, this is because philosophy and the various artforms are perceived to be competing sources of knowledge and belief. Philosophers concerned to maintain the exclusivity of their claim to truth have dismissed the arts as poor pretenders to the title of purveyors of truth.

Philosophers of film have generally opposed this view, seeing film as a source of knowledge and, even, as potential contributor to philosophy itself. This view was forcefully articulated by Stanley Cavell, whose interest in the philosophy of film helped spark the field's development. For Cavell, philosophy is inherently concerned with skepticism and the different ways that it can be overcome. In his many books and articles, Cavell has argued that film shares this concern with philosophy and can even provide philosophic insights of its own.

Until recently, there have been few adherents to the idea that film is an inherently philosophical medium. In part, this is because Cavell's linking of film to skepticism seems inadequately grounded, while his account of skepticism as a live option for contemporary philosophy is based on a highly idiosyncratic reading of the history of modern philosophy. Nonetheless, Cavell's interpretations of individual films' encounter with skepticism are highly suggestive and have influenced many philosophers and film scholars with the seriousness with which they take film.

Yet recently there have been many books that take film to be at least a vehicle for the illustration of philosophic ideas. In part, this is because students seem more willing to take a philosophic conundrum seriously when they see it registered on the silver screen than they do when they encounter it in a written text. In part, it is because philosophers are increasingly realizing that film is often a means for reflection on significant issues.

There are also certain trends in recent filmmaking that call out for philosophic interpretation. In particular, the so-called neo-noir film often metaphorically pulls the rug out from under its audience's feet by revealing a significant fact towards the end that requires the audience to reevaluate its understanding of exactly what has taken place. Other films play with the structure of their narratives in ways that, once again, seem to ask for a philosophical explanation.

Both of these tendencies were realized in the Wachowski Brothers' 1999 hit The Matrix, a film that has engendered more philosophical discussion than any other film. There are already a myriad of essays and a number of books that investigate the philosophic claims of this engaging film. The issues philosophers have found in it range from the question of whether we could be deceived by our sense as to the nature of reality to that of whether there are valid reasons to condemn illusory pleasures.

The interest generated by this film indicates that philosophers have found that a more promising approach to the question of whether films can be philosophy requires focus upon specific philosophic techniques that film might mimic. It also suggests that philosophers will continue to investigate the question of whether film can be philosophy with more intensity in the years to come.

7. Conclusions and Prognosis

The philosophy of film is a field that has only recently come of age. It is now a rapidly growing area of philosophic and aesthetic research. As more philosophers have come to take film seriously, the field has gained in sophistication and complexity. As film and its related digital media continue to expand in their influence upon the lives of human beings, the philosophy of film can be expected to become an even more vital area for philosophic investigation.


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