Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Fideism

1. It is interesting to note that Montaigne and Bayle are frequently assumed to have harbored anti-religious intentions. According to this view, they fully appreciated the apparently agnostic implications of their skepticism, and their professions of faith were insincere. Popkin (1964: pp. 56, 108-110) and Penelhum (pp. 18ff) have both argued against this reading.

2. James seems here to be conceiving of the scientific method in terms of verifiability, rather than falsifiability.

3. The Wittgensteinian Fideist might be classified as a religious ironist in a Rortyian (rather than a Kierkegaardian) sense. An “ironist,” in Richard Rorty's sense, is someone who recognizes the contingency of her discourse and “does not think that her vocabulary is closer to reality than others [sic], that it is in touch with a power not herself.” The ironist is thus “never quite able to take [herself] seriously” (p. 73).