# Bayesian Epistemology

*First published Thu Jul 12, 2001; substantive revision Fri Aug 11, 2006*

‘Bayesian epistemology’ became an epistemological movement
in the 20^{th} century, though its two main features can be
traced back to the eponymous Reverend Thomas Bayes (c. 1701-61). Those
two features are: (1) the introduction of a *formal apparatus*
for inductive logic; (2) the introduction of a *pragmatic
self-defeat test* (as illustrated by Dutch Book Arguments) for
*epistemic* rationality as a way of extending the justification
of the laws of deductive logic to include a justification for the laws
of inductive logic. The formal apparatus itself has two main elements:
the use of the laws of probability as coherence constraints on
rational degrees of belief (or degrees of confidence) and the
introduction of a rule of probabilistic inference, a rule or principle
of *conditionalization*.

Bayesian epistemology did not emerge as a philosophical program
until the first formal axiomatizations of probability theory in the
first half of the 20^{th} century. One important
application of Bayesian epistemology has been to the analysis of
scientific practice in *Bayesian Confirmation Theory*. In
addition, a major branch of statistics, *Bayesian
statistics*, is based on Bayesian principles. In psychology,
an important branch of learning theory, *Bayesian learning
theory*, is also based on Bayesian principles. Finally, the
idea of analyzing rational degrees of belief in terms of rational
betting behavior led to the 20^{th} century development of a
new kind of decision theory, *Bayesian decision theory*, which is
now the dominant theoretical model for the both the descriptive and
normative analysis of decisions. The combination of its precise
formal apparatus and its novel pragmatic self-defeat test for
justification makes Bayesian epistemology one of the most important
developments in epistemology in the 20^{th} century, and one of
the most promising avenues for further progress in epistemology in the
21^{st} century.

- 1. Deductive and Probabilistic Coherence and Deductive and Probabilistic Rules of Inference
- 2. A Simple Principle of Conditionalization
- 3. Dutch Book Arguments
- 4. Bayes' Theorem and Bayesian Confirmation Theory
- 5. Bayesian Social Epistemology
- 6. Potential Problems
- 7. Other Principles of Bayesian Epistemology
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Deductive and Probabilistic Coherence and Deductive and Probabilistic Rules of Inference

There are two ways that the laws of deductive logic have been thought to provide rational constraints on belief: (1) Synchronically, the laws of deductive logic can be used to define the notion of deductive consistency and inconsistency. Deductive inconsistency so defined determines one kind of incoherence in belief, which I refer to as*deductive incoherence*. (2) Diachronically, the laws of deductive logic can constrain admissible changes in belief by providing the

*deductive rules of inference*. For example,

*modus ponens*is a deductive rule of inference that requires that one infer

*Q*from premises

*P*and

*P*→

*Q*.

Bayesians propose additional standards of synchronic coherence —
standards of *probabilistic coherence* — and additional rules
of inference — *probabilistic rules of inference* — in both
cases, to apply not to beliefs, but degrees of belief (degrees of
confidence). For Bayesians, the most important standards of
probabilistic coherence are the laws of probability. For more on the
laws of probability, see the following supplementary article:

Supplement on Probability LawsFor Bayesians, the most important probabilistic rule of inference is given by a

*principle of conditionalization*.

## 2. A Simple Principle of Conditionalization

If unconditional probabilities (e.g.*P*(

*S*)) are taken as primitive, the conditional probability of

*S*on

*T*can be defined as follows:

By itself, the definition of conditional probability is of little epistemological significance. It acquires epistemological significance only in conjunction with a further epistemological assumption:Conditional Probability:

P(S/T) =P(S&T)/P(T).

In epistemological terms, this Simple Principle of Conditionalization requires that the effects of evidence on rational degrees be analyzed in two stages: The first is non-inferential. It is the change in the probability of the evidence statementSimple Principle of Conditionalization:

If one begins with initial orpriorprobabilitiesP_{i}, and one acquires new evidence which can be represented as becoming certain of an evidentiary statementE(assumed to state the totality of one's new evidence and to have initial probability greater than zero), then rationality requires that one systematically transform one's initial probabilities to generate final orposteriorprobabilitiesP_{f}by conditionalizing onE— that is: WhereSis any statement,P_{f}(S) =P_{i}(S/E).^{[1]}

*E*from

*P*

_{i}(

*E*), assumed to be greater than zero and less than one, to

*P*

_{f}(

*E*) = 1. The second is a probabilistic inference of conditionalizing on

*E*from initial probabilities (e.g.,

*P*

_{i}(

*S*)) to final probabilities (e.g.,

*P*

_{f}(

*S*) =

*P*

_{i}(

*S*/

*E*)).

Problems with the Simple Principle (to be discussed below) have led many Bayesians to qualify the Simple Principle by limiting its scope. In addition, some Bayesians follow Jeffrey in generalizing the Simple Principle to apply to cases in which one's new evidence is less than certain (also discussed below). What unifies Bayesian epistemology is a conviction that conditionalizing (perhaps of a generalized sort) is rationally required in some important contexts — that is, that some sort of conditionalization principle is an important principle governing rational changes in degrees of belief.

## 3. Dutch Book Arguments

Many arguments have been given for regarding the probability laws as coherence conditions on degrees of belief and for taking some principle of conditionalization to be a rule of probabilistic inference. The most distinctively Bayesian are those referred to as*Dutch Book Arguments*. Dutch Book Arguments represent the possibility of a new kind of justification for epistemological principles.

A Dutch Book Argument relies on some descriptive or normative
assumptions to connect degrees of belief with willingness to wager —
for example, a person with degree of belief *p* in sentence
*S* is assumed to be willing to pay up to and including
$*p* for a unit wager on *S* (i.e., a wager that pays $1
if *S* is true) and is willing to sell such a wager for any
price equal to or greater than $*p* (one is assumed to be equally
willing to buy or sell such a wager when the price is exactly
$*p*).^{[2]}
A *Dutch Book* is a combination of
wagers which, on the basis of deductive logic alone, can be shown to
entail a sure loss. A *synchronic Dutch Book* is a Dutch Book
combination of wagers that one would accept all at the same time. A
*diachronic Dutch Book* is a Dutch Book combination of wagers
that one will be motivated to enter into at different times.

Ramsey and de Finetti first employed synchronic Dutch Book Arguments
in support of the probability laws as standards of synchronic
coherence for degrees of belief. The first diachronic Dutch Book
Argument in support of a principle of conditionalization was reported
by Teller, who credited David Lewis. The Lewis/Teller argument depends
on a further descriptive or normative assumption about conditional
probabilities due to de Finetti: An agent with conditional probability
*P*(*S*/*T*) = *p* is assumed to be
willing to pay any price up to and including $*p* for a unit
wager on *S* conditional on *T*. (A unit wager on
*S* conditional on *T* is one that is called off, with
the purchase price returned to the purchaser, if *T* is not
true. If *T* is true, the wager is not called off and the wager
pays $1 if *S* is also true.) On this interpretation of
conditional probabilities, Lewis, as reported by Teller, was able to
show how to construct a diachronic Dutch Book against anyone who, on
learning only that *T*, would predictably change his/her degree
of belief in *S* to *P*_{f}(*S*)
> *P*_{i}(*S*/*T*); and how
to construct a diachronic Dutch Book against anyone who, on learning
only that *T*, would predictably change his/her degree of
belief in *S* to *P*_{f}(*S*)
< *P*_{i}(*S*/T*)*. For
illustrations of the strategy of the Ramsey/de Finetti and the
Lewis/Teller arguments, see the following supplementary article:

Supplement on Dutch Book ArgumentsThere has been much discussion of exactly what it is that Dutch Book Arguments are supposed to show. On the

*literal-minded interpretation*, their significance is that they show that those whose degrees of belief violate the probability laws or those whose probabilistic inferences predictably violate a principle of conditionalization are liable to enter into wagers on which they are sure to lose. There is very little to be said for the literal-minded interpretation, because there is no basis for claiming that rationality requires that one be willing to wager in accordance with the behavioral assumptions described above. An agent could simply refuse to accept Dutch Book combinations of wagers.

A more plausible interpretation of Dutch Book Arguments is that they
are to be understood hypothetically, as symptomatic of what has been
termed *pragmatic self-defeat*. On this interpretation, Dutch
Book Arguments are a kind of heuristic for determining when
one's degrees of belief have the potential to be
*pragmatically self-defeating*. The problem is not that one
who violates the Bayesian constraints is likely to enter into a
combination of wagers that constitute a Dutch Book, but that, on any
reasonable way of translating one's degrees of belief into
action, there is a potential for one's degrees of belief to
motivate one to act in ways that make things worse than they might
have been, when, as a matter of logic alone, it can be determined
that alternative actions would have made things better (on one's
own evaluations of better and worse).

Another way of understanding the problem of susceptibility to a Dutch
Book is due to Ramsey: Someone who is susceptible to a Dutch Book
evaluates identical bets differently based on how they are described.
Putting it this way makes susceptibility to Dutch Books sound
irrational. But this standard of rationality would make it
irrational not to recognize all the logical consequences of what one
believes. This is the *assumption of logical omniscience*
(discussed below).

If successful, Dutch Book Arguments would reduce the justification of the principles of Bayesian epistemology to two elements: (1) an account of the appropriate relationship between degrees of belief and choice; and (2) the laws of deductive logic. Because it would seem that the truth about the appropriate relationship between the degrees of belief and choice is independent of epistemology, Dutch Book Arguments hold out the potential of justifying the principles of Bayesian epistemology in a way that requires no other epistemological resources than the laws of deductive logic. For this reason, it makes sense to think of Dutch Book Arguments as indirect, pragmatic arguments for according the principles of Bayesian epistemology much the same epistemological status as the laws of deductive logic. Dutch Book Arguments are a truly distinctive contribution made by Bayesians to the methodology of epistemology.

It should also be mentioned that some Bayesians have defended their
principles more directly, with non-pragmatic arguments. In addition
to reporting Lewis's Dutch Book Argument, Teller offers a
non-pragmatic defense of Conditionalization. There have been many
proposed non-pragmatic defenses of the probability laws (e.g., van
Fraassen; Shimony). The most compelling is due to Joyce. All such
defenses, whether pragmatic or non-pragmatic, produce a puzzle for
Bayesian epistemology: The principles of Bayesian epistemology are
typically proposed as principles of *inductive* reasoning. But
if the principles of Bayesian epistemology depend ultimately for their
justification solely on the laws of deductive logic, what reason is
there to think that they have any *inductive* content? That is
to say, what reason is there to believe that they do anything more
than extend the laws of deductive logic from beliefs to degrees of
belief? It should be mentioned, however, that even if Bayesian
epistemology only extended the laws of deductive logic to degrees of
belief, that alone would represent an extremely important advance in
epistemology.

## 4. Bayes' Theorem and Bayesian Confirmation Theory

This section reviews some of the most important results in the Bayesian analysis of scientific practice —*Bayesian Confirmation Theory*. It is assumed that all statements to be evaluated have prior probability greater than zero and less than one.

### Bayes' Theorem and a Corollary

Bayes' Theorem is a straightforward consequence of the probability axioms and the definition of conditional probability:

Bayes' Theorem:

P(S/T) =P(T/S) ×P(S)/P(T) [whereP(T) is assumed to be greater than zero]

The epistemological significance of Bayes' Theorem is that it
provides a straightforward corollary to the Simple Principle of
Conditionalization. Where the final probability of a hypothesis
*H* is generated by conditionalizing on evidence *E*,
Bayes' Theorem provides a formula for the final probability of
*H* in terms of the prior or initial *likelihood* of
*H* on *E*
(*P*_{i}(*E*/*H*)) and the prior
or initial probabilities of *H* and *E*:

Corollary of the Simple Principle of Conditionalization:

P_{f}(H) =P_{i}(H/E) =P_{i}(E/H) ×P_{i}(H)/P_{i}(E).

Due to the influence of Bayesianism, *likelihood* is now a
technical term of art in confirmation theory. As used in this
technical sense, likelihoods can be very useful. Often, when the
conditional probability of *H* on *E* is in doubt, the
likelihood of *H* on *E* can be computed from the
theoretical assumptions of *H*.

### Bayesian Confirmation Theory

**A. Confirmation and disconfirmation.**In Bayesian Confirmation Theory, it is said that evidence confirms (or would confirm) hypothesis

*H*(to at least some degree) just in case the prior probability of

*H*conditional on

*E*is greater than the prior unconditional probability of

*H*:

*P*

_{i}(

*H*/

*E*) >

*P*

_{i}(

*H*).

*E*disconfirms (or would disconfirm)

*H*if the prior probability of

*H*conditional on

*E*is less than the prior unconditional probability of

*H*.

**B. Confirmation and disconfirmation by entailment.**
Whenever a hypothesis *H* logically entails evidence
*E*, *E* confirms *H*. This follows from the fact
that to determine the truth of *E* is to rule out a possibility
assumed to have non-zero prior probability that is incompatible with
*H* — the possibility that ~*E*. A corollary is
that, where *H* entails *E*, ~*E* would
disconfirm *H*, by reducing its probability to zero. The most
influential model of explanation in science is the
hypothetico-deductive model (e.g., Hempel). Thus, one of the most
important sources of support for Bayesian Confirmation Theory is that
it can explain the role of hypothetico-deductive explanation in
confirmation.

**C. Confirmation of logical equivalents.** If two
hypotheses H1 and H2 are logically equivalent, then evidence
*E* will confirm both equally. This follows from the fact that
logically equivalent statements always are assigned the same
probability.

**D. The confirmatory effect of surprising or diverse
evidence.** From the corollary above, it follows that whether
*E* confirms (or disconfirms) *H* depends on whether
*E* is more probable (or less probable) conditional on
*H* than it is unconditionally — that is, on whether:

(b1)An intuitive way of understanding (b1) is to say that it states thatP(E/H)/P(E) > 1.

*E*would be more expected (or less surprising) if it were known that

*H*were true. So if

*E*is surprising, but would not be surprising if we knew

*H*were true, then

*E*will significantly confirm

*H*. Thus, Bayesians explain the tendency of surprising evidence to confirm hypotheses on which the evidence would be expected.

Similarly, because it is reasonable to think that evidence
*E*_{1} makes other evidence of the same kind much more
probable, after *E*_{1} has been determined to be true,
other evidence of the same kind *E*_{2} will generally
not confirm hypothesis *H* as much as other diverse evidence
*E*_{3}, even if *H* is equally likely on both
*E*_{2} and *E*_{3}. The explanation is
that where *E*_{1} makes *E*_{2} much
more probable than *E*_{3}
(*P*_{i}(*E*_{2}/*E*_{1})
>>
*P*_{i}(*E*_{3}/*E*_{1}),
there is less potential for the discovery that *E*_{2}
is true to raise the probability of *H* than there is for the
discovery that *E*_{3} is true to do so.

**E. Relative confirmation and likelihood ratios.** Often
it is important to be able to compare the effect of evidence
*E* on two competing hypotheses,
*H*_{j} and H_{k}, without
having also to consider its effect on other hypotheses that may not be
so easy to formulate or to compare with
*H*_{j} and *H*_{k}.
From the first corollary above, the ratio of the final probabilities
of *H*_{j} and *H*_{k}
would be given by:

If theRatio Formula:

P_{f}(H_{j})/P_{f}(H_{k}) = [P_{i}(E/H_{j}) ×P_{i}(H_{j})]/[P_{i}(E/H_{k}) ×P_{i}(H_{k})]

*odds of*H

_{j}

*relative to*H

_{k}are defined as ratio of their probabilities, then from the Ratio Formula it follows that, in a case in which change in degrees of belief results from conditionalizing on

*E*, the final odds (

*P*

_{f}(

*H*

_{j})/

*P*

_{f}(

*H*

_{k})) result from multiplying the initial odds (

*P*

_{i}(

*H*

_{j})/

*P*

_{i}(

*H*

_{k})) by the

*likelihood ratio*(

*P*

_{i}(

*E*/

*H*

_{j})/

*P*

_{i}(

*E*/

*H*

_{k})). Thus, in pairwise comparisons of the odds of hypotheses, the likelihood ratio is the crucial determinant of the effect of the evidence on the odds.

**F. The typical differential effect of positive evidence and
negative evidence.** Hempel first pointed out that we typically
expect the hypothesis that all ravens are black to be confirmed to
some degree by the observation of a black raven, but not by the
observation of a non-black, non-raven. Let *H* be the
hypothesis that all ravens are black. Let *E*_{1}
describe the observation of a non-black, non-raven. Let
*E*_{2} describe the observation of a black
raven. Bayesian Confirmation Theory actually holds that both
*E*_{1} and *E*_{2} may provide some
confirmation for *H*. Recall that *E*_{1}
supports *H* just in case
*P*_{i}(*E*_{1}/*H*)/*P*_{i}(*E*_{1})
> 1. It is plausible to think that this ratio is ever so slightly
greater than one. On the other hand, *E*_{2} would seem to
provide much greater confirmation to *H*, because, in this example, it
would be expected that
*P*_{i}(*E*_{2}/*H*)/*P*_{i}(*E*_{2})
>>
*P*_{i}(*E*_{1}/*H*)/*P*_{i}(*E*_{1}).

These are only a sample of the results that have provided support
for Bayesian Confirmation Theory as a theory of rational inference for
science. For further examples, see Howson and Urbach. It
should also be mentioned that an important branch of statistics,
*Bayesian statistics* is based on the principles of Bayesian
epistemology.

## 5. Bayesian Social Epistemology

One of the important developments in Bayesian epistemology has been the exploration of the social dimension to inquiry. The obvious example is scientific inquiry, because it is the community of scientists, rather than any individual scientist, who determine what is or is not accepted in the discipline. In addition, scientists typically work in research groups and even those who work alone rely on the reports of other scientists to be able to design and carry out their own work. Other important examples of the social dimension to knowledge include the use of juries to make factual determinations in the legal system and the decentralization of knowledge over the Internet.

There are two ways that Bayesian epistemology can be applied to social inquiry:

(1) Bayesian epistemology of testimony (understood generally, to include not only personal testimony but all media sources of information). Goldman has developed a Bayesian epistemology of testimony and applied it to social entities such as science and the legal system. In any such approach, a crucial issue is how to evaluate the reliability of the reports one receives. Goldman's approach is to focus on institutional design to motivate the production of reliable reports. Bovens and Hartmann instead try to model how, when there are reports from multiple sources, a Bayesian agent can use probabilistic reasoning to judge the reliability of the reports, and thus, how much credence to place in them. The idea that in evaluating the probability of a report we are implicitly evaluating the reliability of the reporter is developed by Barnes as a potential explanation of the prediction/accommodation asymmetry, discussed in the next section.

(2) Aggregate Bayesianism. If scientific knowledge or jury deliberations produce a group product, it is natural to consider whether the group's knowledge can be represented in aggregate form. In Bayesian terms, the question is whether the individuals' probabililty assignments can be usefully aggregated into a single probability assignment that reflects the group's knowledge. Although Seidenfeld, Kadane, and Schervish have shown that there is generally no way to define an aggregate Bayesian expected utility maximizer to represent the Pareto preferences of a group of two or more individual Bayesian expected utility maximizers, there is no impossibility result precluding the aggregation of individual probabililty assignments into a group probability assignment. However, there is no generally agreed upon rule for doing so. If a group of Bayesian individuals all had begun from the same initial probabilities, then simply sharing their evidence would lead them all to the same final probabilities. It may seem unfortunate that unanimity in science and other social endeavors cannot be achieved so easily, but Kitcher has argued that this is a mistake, because cognitive diversity plays an important role in scientific progress.

The fruitfulness of Bayesian social epistemology may ultimately depend on whether or not the idealizations of Bayesian theory are too unrealistic. For example, if one of the important effects of jury deliberations is that they tend to provide a way for the group to correct for the irrationality of individual members, then no model of jurors as ideal Bayesians is likely to be able to explain that feature of the jury system.

## 6. Potential Problems

This section reviews some of the most important potential problems for Bayesian Confirmation Theory and for Bayesian epistemology generally. No attempt is made to evaluate their seriousness here, though there is no generally agreed upon Bayesian solution to any of them.### 6.1 Objections to the Probability Laws as Standards of Synchronic Coherence

**A. The assumption of logical omniscience.**The assumption that degrees of belief satisfy the probability laws implies omniscience about deductive logic, because the probability laws require that all deductive logical truths have probability one, all deductive inconsistencies have probability zero, and the probability of any conjunction of sentences be no greater than

*any*of its deductive consequences. This seems to be an unrealistic standard for human beings. Hacking and Garber have made proposals to relax the assumption of logical omniscience. Because relaxing that assumption would block the derivation of almost all the important results in Bayesian epistemology, most Bayesians maintain the assumption of logical omniscience and treat it as an ideal to which human beings can only more or less approximate.

**B. The special epistemological status of the laws of
classical logic.** Even if the assumption of logical
omniscience is not too much of an idealization to provide a useful
model for human reasoning, it has another potentially troubling
consequence. It commits Bayesian epistemology to some sort of a
priori/a posteriori distinction, because there could be no Bayesian
account of how empirical evidence might make it rational to adopt a
theory with a non-classical logic. In this respect, Bayesian
epistemology carries over the presumption from traditional
epistemology that the laws of logic are immune to revision on the
basis of empirical evidence.

It is open to the Bayesian to try to downplay the significance of this consequence, by articulating an a priori/a posteriori distinction that aims to be pragmatic rather than metaphysical (e.g., Carnap's analytic/synthetic distinction). However, any such account must address Quine's well-known holistic challenge to the analytic-synthetic distinction.

**C. The problem of the priors.** Are there constraints
on prior probabilities other than the probability laws? Consider
Goodman's "new riddle of induction": In the past all observed
emeralds have been green. Do those observations provide any more
support for the generalization that all emeralds are green than they
do for the generalization that all emeralds are grue (green if
observed before now; blue if observed later); or do they provide any
more support for the prediction that the next emerald observed will
be green than for the prediction that the next emerald observed will
be grue (i.e., blue)? This question divides Bayesians into two
categories:

(a)Objective Bayesians(e.g., Rosenkrantz) hold that there are rational constraints on prior probabilities that require that observations support the green-generalization and the green-prediction much more strongly than the grue-generalization and the grue-prediction. Objective Bayesians are the intellectual heirs of the advocates of a Principle of Indifference for probability. Rosenkrantz builds his account on the maximum entropy rule proposed by E.T. Jaynes. The difficulties in formulating an acceptable Principle of Indifference have led most Bayesians to abandon Objective Bayesianism.(b)

Subjective Bayesians(e.g., de Finetti) do not believe that rationality alone places enough constraints on one's prior probabilities to make them objective. For Subjective Bayesians, it is up to our own free choice or to evolution or to socialization or some other non-rational process to determine one's prior probabilities. Rationality only requires that the prior probabilities satisfy relatively modest synchronic coherence conditions.

Subjective Bayesians believe that their position is not objectionably
subjective, because of results (e.g., Doob or Gaifman and Snir)
proving that even subjects beginning with very different prior
probabilities will tend to converge in their final probabilities,
given a suitably long series of shared observations. These
*convergence results* are not completely reassuring, however,
because they only apply to agents who already have significant
agreement in their priors and they do not assure convergence in any
reasonable amount of time. Also, they typically only guarantee
convergence on the probability of predictions, not on the probability
of theoretical hypotheses. For example, Carnap favored prior
probabilities that would never raise above zero the probability of a
generalization over a potentially infinite number of instances (e.g.,
that all crows are black), no matter how many observations of positive
instances (e.g., black crows) one might make without finding any
negative instances (i.e., non-black crows). In addition, the
convergence results depend on the assumption that the *only*
changes in probabilities that occur are those that are the
non-inferential results of observation on evidential statements and
those that result from conditionalization on such evidential
statements.

Objective Bayesianism and Subjective Bayesianism are two opposite extremes. There is plenty of room for a compromise position that there are further rationality constraints on prior probabilities that can be added to the Bayesian framework, without supposing that the additional constraints will determine a uniquely rational prior. For some examples of some additional rationality constraints, see the next section. However, because there is no generally agreed upon solution to the Problem of the Priors, it is an open question whether Bayesian Confirmation Theory has inductive content, or whether it merely translates the framework for rational belief provided by deductive logic into a corresponding framework for rational degrees of belief.

### 6.2 Objections to The Simple Principle of Conditionalization as a Rule of Inference, Especially as an Explanation of Theory Confirmation in Science

**A. The problem of uncertain evidence.** The Simple
Principle of Conditionalization requires that the acquisition of
evidence be representable as changing one's degree of belief in a
statement *E* to one — that is, to certainty. But many
philosophers would object to assigning probability of one to any
contingent statement, even an evidential statement, because, for
example, it is well-known that scientists sometimes give up previously
accepted evidence. Jeffrey has proposed a generalization of the
Principle of Conditionalization that yields that principle as a
special case. Jeffrey's idea is that what is crucial about
observation is not that it yields certainty, but that it generates a
non-inferential change in the probability of an evidential statement
*E* and its negation ~*E* (assumed to be the locus of
all the non-inferential changes in probability) from initial
probabilities between zero and one to
*P*_{f}(*E*) and
*P*_{f}(~*E*) = [1 −
*P*_{f}(*E*)]. Then on
Jeffrey's account, after the observation, the rational degree of
belief to place in an hypothesis *H* would be given by the
following principle:

Principle of Jeffrey Conditionalization:

P_{f}(H) =P_{i}(H/E) ×P_{f}(E) +P_{i}(H/~E) ×P_{f}(~E) [whereEandHare both assumed to have prior probabilities between zero and one]

Counting in favor of Jeffrey's Principle is its theoretical elegance. Counting against it is the practical problem that it requires that one be able to completely specify the direct non-inferential effects of an observation, something it is doubtful that anyone has ever done. Skyrms has given it a Dutch Book defense.

**B. The problem of old evidence.** On a Bayesian
account, the effect of evidence *E* in confirming (or
disconfirming) a hypothesis is solely a function of the increase in
probability that accrues to *E* when it is first determined to
be true. This raises the following puzzle for Bayesian Confirmation
Theory discussed extensively by Glymour: Suppose that *E* is an
evidentiary statement that has been known for some time — that is,
that it is *old evidence*; and suppose that *H* is a
scientific theory that has been under consideration for some time. One
day it is discovered that *H* implies *E*. In scientific
practice, the discovery that *H* implied *E* would
typically be taken to provide some degree of confirmatory support for
*H*. But Bayesian Confirmation Theory seems unable to explain
how a previously known evidentiary statement *E* could provide
any new support for H. For conditionalization to come into play, there
must be a change in the probability of the evidence statement
*E*. Where *E* is old evidence, there is no change in
its probability. Some Bayesians who have tried to solve this problem
(e.g., Garber) have typically tried to weaken the logical omniscience
assumption to allow for the possibility of discovering logical
relations (e.g., that *H* and suitable auxiliary assumptions
imply *E*). As mentioned above, relaxing the logical omniscience
assumption threatens to block the derivation of almost all of the
important results in Bayesian epistemology, so there is no general
agreement among Bayesians on how to solve this problem. Other
Bayesians (e.g., Lange) employ the Bayesian formalism as a tool in the
*rational reconstruction* of the evidentiary support for a
scientific hypothesis, where it is irrelevant to the rational
reconstruction whether the evidence was discovered before or after the
theory was initially formulated.

**C. The problem of rigid conditional probabilities.**
When one conditionalizes, one applies the initial conditional
probabilities to determine final unconditional probabilities.
Throughout, the conditional probabilities themselves do not change;
they remain rigid. Examples of the Problem of Old Evidence are but
one of a variety of cases in which it seems that it can be rational
to change one's initial conditional probabilities. Thus, many
Bayesians reject the Simple Principle of Conditionalization in favor
of a qualified principle, limited to situations in which one does not
change one's initial conditional probabilities. There is no
generally accepted account of when it is rational to maintain rigid
initial conditional probabilities and when it is not.

**D. The problem of prediction vs. accommodation.**
Related to the problem of Old Evidence is the following potential
problem: Consider two different scenarios. In the first, theory
*H* was developed in part to *accommodate* (i.e., to
imply) some previously known evidence E. In the second, theory
*H* was developed at a time when *E* was not known. It
was because *E* was derived as a *prediction* from
*H* that a test was performed and *E* was found to be
true. It seems that E's being true would provide a greater degree of
confirmation for *H* if the truth of *E* had been
*predicted* by *H* than if *H* had been developed
to *accommodate* the truth of *E*. There is no general
agreement among Bayesians about how to resolve this problem. Some
(e.g., Horwich) argue that Bayesianism implies that there is no
important difference between prediction and accommodation, and try to
defend that implication. Others (e.g., Maher) argue that there is a
way to understand Bayesianism so as to explain why there is an
important difference between prediction and accommodation.

**E. The problem of new theories.** Suppose that there is
one theory *H*_{1} that is generally regarded as highly
confirmed by the available evidence *E*. It is possible that
simply the introduction of an alternative theory
*H*_{2} can lead to an erosion of
*H*_{1}'s support. It is plausible to think that
Copernicus' introduction of the heliocentric hypothesis had this
effect on the previously unchallenged Ptolemaic earth-centered
astronomy. This sort of change cannot be explained by
conditionalization. It is for this reason that many Bayesians prefer
to focus on probability ratios of hypotheses (see the Ratio Formula
above), rather than their absolute probability; but it is clear that
the introduction of a new theory could also alter the probability
ratio of two hypotheses — for example, if it implied one of them
as a special case.

## 7. Other Principles of Bayesian Epistemology

Other principles of Bayesian epistemology have been proposed, but none has garnered anywhere near a majority of support among Bayesians. The most important proposals are merely mentioned here. It is beyond the scope of this entry to discuss them in any detail.
**A. Other principles of synchronic coherence.** Are the
probability laws the only standards of synchronic coherence for
degrees of belief? Van Fraassen has proposed an additional principle
(Reflection or Special Reflection), which he now regards as a special
case of an even more general principle (General
Reflection).^{[3]}

**B. Other probabilistic rules of inference.** There
seem to be at least two different concepts of probability: the
probability that is involved in degrees of belief (epistemic or
subjective probability) and the probability that is involved in
random events, such as the tossing of a coin (chance). De Finetti
thought this was a mistake and that there was only one kind of
probability, subjective probability. For Bayesians who believe in
both kinds of probability, an important question is: What is (or
should be) the relation between them? The answer can be found in the
various proposals for principles of direct inference in the
literature. Typically, principles of direct inference are proposed
as principles for inferring subjective or epistemic probabilities
from beliefs about objective chance (e.g., Pollock). Lewis reverses
the direction of inference, and proposes to infer beliefs about
objective chance from subjective or epistemic probabilities, via his
(Reformulated) Principal
Principle.^{[4]}
Strevens argues that it is Lewis's Principal Principle that gives
Bayesianism its inductive content.

**C. Principles of rational acceptance.** What is the
relation between beliefs and degrees of belief? Jeffrey proposes to
give up the notion of belief (at least for empirical statements) and
make do with only degrees of belief. Other authors (e.g., Levi,
Maher, Kaplan) propose principles of rational acceptance as part of
accounts of when it is rational to accept a statement as true, not
merely to regard it as probable.

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