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Curry's Paradox

First published Wed 10 Jan, 2001

Curry's paradox, so named for its discoverer, namely Haskell B. Curry, is a paradox within the family of so-called paradoxes of self-reference (or paradoxes of circularity). Like the liar paradox (e.g., ‘this sentence is false’) and Russell's paradox, Curry's paradox challenges familiar naive theories, including naive truth theory (unrestricted T-schema) and naive set theory (unrestricted axiom of abstraction), respectively. If one accepts naive truth theory (or naive set theory), then Curry's paradox becomes a direct challenge to one's theory of logical implication or entailment. Unlike the liar and Russell paradoxes Curry's paradox is negation-free; it may be generated irrespective of one's theory of negation. An intuitive version of the paradox runs as follows.

Consider the following list of sentences, named ‘The List’:

  1. Tasmanian devils have strong jaws.
  2. The second sentence on The List is circular.
  3. If the third sentence on The List is true, then every sentence is true.
  4. The List comprises exactly four sentences.
Although The List itself is not paradoxical, the third sentence (a conditional) is. Is it true? Well, suppose, for conditional proof, that its antecedent is true. Then
the third sentence of The List is true
is true. By substitution, it follows that
If the third sentence of The List is true, then every sentence is true
is true. But, then, Modus Ponens on the above two sentences yields that
every sentence is true
is true. So, by conditional proof, we conclude that
If the third sentence of The List is true, then every sentence is true
is true. By substitution, it follows that
the third sentence of The List is true
is true. But, now, by Modus Ponens on the above two sentences we get that
every sentence is true
is true. By naive truth theory we disquote (or, in this case, dis-display, as it were) to conclude: Every sentence is true! So goes (one version of) Curry's paradox.

1. Brief History and Some Caveats

In 1942 Haskell B. Curry presented what is now called Curry's paradox. Perhaps the most intuitive version of the paradox is due to Arthur N. Prior (1955), who recast Curry's paradox as a "proof" of God's existence. (Let C = ‘If C is true then God exists’.) The version presented above is (in effect) Prior's version.

There are basically two different versions of Curry's paradox, a truth-theoretic (or proof-theoretic) and a set-theoretic version; these versions will be presented below. For now, however, there are a few caveats that need to be issued.

Caveat 1. Loeb's Paradox. Prior's version is (in effect) rehearsed by Boolos and Jeffrey (1989), where neither Prior nor Curry is given credit; rather, Boolos and Jeffrey point out the similarity of the paradox to reasoning used within the proof of Loeb's Theorem; and subsequent authors, notably Barwise & Etchemendy (1984), have called the paradox Loeb's paradox. While there is no doubt strong justification for the alternative name (given the similarity of Curry's paradox to the reasoning involved in proving Loeb's Theorem) the paradox does appear to have been first discovered by Curry.

Caveat 2. Geometrical Curry Paradox (Jigsaw Paradox). This is not the same Curry paradox under discussion; it is a well-known paradox, due to Paul Curry, having to do with so-called geometrical dissection. (The so-called Banach-Tarski geometrical paradox is related to Paul Curry's geometrical paradox.) See Gardner 1956 and Fredrickson 1997 for full discussion of this (geometrical) Curry paradox.

2. Curry's Paradox: Truth- and Set-Theoretic Versions

Truth-Theoretic Version

Assume that our truth predicate satisfies the following T-schema:
T-Schema: T[A]if and only ifA,
where ‘[ ]’ is a name-forming device. Assume, too, that we have the principle called Assertion (also known as pseudo modus ponens):
Assertion: (A & (Aif-thenB)) if-then B
(NB: We could also use the principle called Contraction: ((Aif-then(Aif-thenB))if-then(Aif-thenB).) Curry's paradox quickly generates triviality, the case in which everything is true.

By diagonalization, self-reference or the like we can get an arbitrary sentence, C, such that:

C   =   T[C] if-then F,
where F is anything you like. (For effect, though, make F something obviously false.) By an instance of the T-schema (‘T[C]if and only ifC’) we immediately get:
T[C] if and only if (T[C]if-thenF),
Again, using the same instance of the T-Schema, we can substitute C for T[C] in the above to get (1):
1. C if and only if (Cif-thenF)  [by T-schema and Substitution]
2. (C & (Cif-thenF)) if-then F  [by Assertion]
3. (C & C) if-then F  [by Substitution, from 2]
4. C if-then F  [by Equivalence of C and C&C, from 3]
5. C  [by Modus Ponens, from 1 and 4]
6. F  [by Modus Ponens, from 4 and 5]
Letting F be anything entailing triviality Curry's paradox quickly "shows" that the world is trivial!

Set-Theoretic Version

The same result ensues within naive set theory. Assume, in particular, the (unrestricted) axiom of abstraction (or comprehension):
Unrestricted Abstraction: xis a member of{y | A(y)} if and only if A(x).
Moreover, assume that our conditional, if-then, satisfies Contraction (as above), which permits the deduction of
(sis a member ofs if-then A)
sis a member ofs if-then (sis a member ofs if-then A).
In the set-theoretic case, let C =df {x | xis a member ofx if-then F}, where F remains as you please (but something obviously false, for effect). From here we reason thus:
1. xis an element ofC iff (xis an element ofx if-then F)  [by Naive Abstraction]
2. Cis an element ofC iff (Cis an element ofC if-then F)  [by Universal Specification, from 1]
3. Cis an element of C if-then (Cis an element ofC if-then F)  [by Simplification, from 2]
4. Cis an element ofC if-then F  [by Contraction, from 3]
5. Cis an element ofC  [by Modus Ponens, from 2 and 4]
6. F  [by Modus Ponens, from 4 and 5]
So, coupling Contraction with the naive abstraction schema yields, via Curry's paradox, triviality.

Significance, Solutions, and Open Problems


What is the significance of Curry's paradox? The answer depends on one's approach to paradox in general. Any comprehensive theory of language has to give some sort account of the paradoxes (e.g., the liar, or Russell's, or etc.). Classical approaches tend to fiddle with the T-schema (or naive abstraction) or reject the existence of certain (paradoxical) sentences. Such classical approaches tend to respond to Curry's paradox in the same fashion — by rejecting the existence of Curry sentences or fiddling with the unrestricted T-schema (or naive abstraction). Some popular variations of these two options include Gupta-Belnap revision theory (1993), Tarski's familiar hierarchical theory (or Russellian type theory), Simmons's singularity theory (1993), Burge's indexical theory (1979), Kripke's fixed point semantics (1975), Gaifman's pointer semantics (1988), Barwise-Etchemendy situation-cum-Aczel-set-theory (1984), and others. (NB: These theories are quite different from each other; however, each of them fits under one of the two so-called classical options mentioned above; they either modify the naive T-schema or reject the existence of so-called strengthened liar sentences.) Where Curry's paradox becomes especially significant is not with classical approaches but rather with certain non-classical approaches; specifically, Curry's paradox is a direct challenge to any non-classical approach that attempts to preserve naive truth (or set) theory in full. Such approaches attempt to preserve naive truth (or set) theory, preserve the apparent existence of Curry sentences, and avoid the apparent non-triviality of the world. Satisfying these desiderata requires a paraconsistent logic, one that affords inconsistent but non-trivial theories. What Curry's paradox shows is that not just any old paraconsistent logic will do; in particular, on pain of triviality, no connective in the language can satisfy contraction or absorption and support the T-scheme or Naive comprehension scheme. Among other things, this constraint rules out quite a few popular candidates for implicative conditionals -- including, for example, various popular relevant conditionals, including those of E and R.

A Solution

There is great interest in resolving the paradoxes in the sort of non-classical fashion suggested above. Such interest, coupled with Curry's paradox, has fostered ongoing interest in non-classical (paraconsistent) semantics for entailment. One area in which such research is growing is substructural logic. While there is no generally accepted (non-classical) solution to Curry's paradox one approach is particularly promising, an approach due to Graham Priest (1992) and based upon Kripke's invocation of non-normal worlds. (Kripke invoked such worlds for purposes of modeling Lewis systems weaker than S4, not for purposes of solving Curry's paradox.) The idea may be seen easily through its semantics, as follows.

Setting negation aside (for purposes of Curry), we assume a propositional language with the following connectives: conjunction (&), disjunction (or), and entailment (if-then). (For purposes of resolving Curry's paradox, negation may be set aside; however, the current semantics allow for a variety of approaches to negation, as well as quantifiers.) An interpretation is a 4-tuple, (W,N,[ ], f), where W is a non-empty set of worlds (index points), N is a non-empty subset of W, [ ] is a function from propositional parameters to the powerset of W; we may, for convenience, see the range of [ ] as comprising propositions (sets of worlds at which various sentences are true), and so call the values of [ ] propositions. We let NN be the set of so-called non-normal worlds, namely NN = Wminus.gifN. In turn, f is a function from (ordered) pairs of propositions to NN. Now, [ ] is extended to all sentences (A, B, ...) via the following clauses:

[A&B] = [A]intersection[B]

[AorB] = [A]union[B]

The value of an entailment is the union of two sets: N, the class of normal worlds where the entailment is true, and NN, the of non-normal worlds where the entailment is true. Assuming the usual S5 truth conditions, N and NN are specified thus:
N = W, if [A]subset[B]; otherwise, N=nullset.

NN = f([A],[B]).

With all this in hand, validity is defined in the usual way: namely, as truth-preservation at all normal worlds of all interpretations.

Why restrict the definition merely to normal worlds? The explanation goes hand-in-hand with the informal interpretation of non-normal worlds; according to Priest's suggestion, non-normal worlds should be understood to be worlds where the laws of logic are different — different from the actual laws, where such laws are expressed by (true) entailment claims. Accordingly, since our definition of validity is an attempt to capture our (actual) logical laws, we need not, and should not, worry about worlds where the logical laws are different, at least not in our definition of validity. Such worlds, however, are otherwise very important; as one can easily verify, such worlds afford the usual logical laws (within the positive fragment at issue) but do not sanction the unwanted "laws" — e.g., Assertion and the like. In this way, one can enjoy naive truth theory (or naive set theory) without tripping into triviality as a result of Curry sentences.

Priest (1992) gives a sound and complete proof theory for the given semantics, but this is left for the reader to consult.

Open Issues and Problems

With the foregoing semantics one sneed not reject the existence of Curry sentences (which are difficult to reject when one's language is a natural language) or naive truth theory; however, there are various philosophical issues that need to be addressed, a few of which are canvassed below.

One philosophical issue confronting the given semantics is the very nature of such non-normal worlds. What are they? As intimated, Priest's suggestion is that they are simply (impossible) worlds where the laws of logic are different. But is there any reason, independent of Curry's paradox, to admit such worlds? Fortunately, the answer seems to be ‘yes’. One reason has to do with the common (natural language) reasoning involving counter-logicals, including, for example, sentences such as ‘If intuitionistic logic is correct, then double negation elimination is invalid’. Invoking non-normal worlds provides a simple way of modelling such sentences and the reasoning involving them.

Another objection also arises. Notice that, on the foregoing semantics, there are (non-normal) worlds where the law of simplification, i.e., A&B if-then B, is false; however, there is no world (normal or otherwise) at which we have a false B but true A&B. Likewise for all other worlds where the logical laws differ; the worlds themselves, as it were, do not break the laws, even though the laws are false at such worlds. What explains this "lack of supervenience" at non-normal worlds? Priest himself offers no explanation, and the problem remains an open one. None the less, here is a suggestion (which has yet to be explored in print): What would it take for logical laws to fail? Most philosophers will agree that it is hard to imagine worlds in which there are events that contravene logical laws. My suggestion is that the only way for logical laws to fail is via arbitrary "fiat", as it were. No world (possible or otherwise) comprises events that refute, contravene, or otherwise show the actual logical laws to be false; what is required to falsify logical laws is mere arbitrariness; and such arbitrariness is precisely what one gets from the function, f. The suggestion, then, is simply this: For logical laws to fail at any world (and, hence, at non-normal worlds) one requires arbitrariness and thereby a lack of the supervenience at issue. Whether this suggestion solves the (philosophical) problem at hand is an (other) open problem.

There are other philosophical (and logical) problems that remain open. One of the most important recent papers discussing such problems is Restall's "Costing Non-Classical Solutions to Paradoxes of Self-Reference" (see Other Internet Resources). Restall shows that the sorts of non-classical approach discussed above must give up either transitivity of entailment, infinitary disjunction or distributive lattice logic (i.e., an infinitary disjunction operator distributing over finite conjunction); otherwise, as Restall shows, Curry's paradox arises immediately and triviality ensues. The importance of Restall's point lies not only in the formal constraints imposed on suitable non-classical approaches to Curry; its importance lies especially in the philosophical awkwardness imposed by such constraints. For example, one (formal) upshot of Restall's point is that, on a natural way of modelling propositions (e.g., in familiar world-semantics), some classes of propositions will not have disjunctions on the (given sort of) non-classical approach; the philosophical upshot (and important open problem) is that there is no known explanation for why such classes lack such a disjunction. (Needless to say, it is not a sufficient explanation to note that the presence of such a disjunction would otherwise generate triviality via Curry's paradox.)

The foregoing issues and open problems confront various non-classical approaches to paradox, problems that arise particularly sharply in the face of Curry's paradox. It should be understood, however, that such problems may remain pressing even for those who are firmly committed to classical approaches to paradox; for one might be interested not so much in accepting or believing such non-classical proposals but, rather, merely in using such proposals to model various naive but non-trivial theories — naive truth theory, naive set theory, naive denotation theory, etc.. One need not believe or accept such theories to have an interest in modeling them accurately. If one has such an interest, then the foregoing problems arising from Curry's paradox must be addressed. (See Slaney 1989, and the classic Meyer, Dunn, and Routley 1979, and also Restall 2000 for further discussion.)


Works Cited or Further Reading

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

logic: paraconsistent | logic: relevance | logic: substructural | Russell's paradox