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Samuel Clarke

First published Sat 5 Apr, 2003

Samuel Clarke (b. 1675-d. 1729) was the most important British philosopher in the generation between Locke and Berkeley, and a leading figure in Newton's circle. His philosophical interests were mostly in theology, metaphysics, and marginally in ethics; epistemology seems to have held little attraction for him. His philosophical vocabulary and some of his metaphysical ideas were influenced by Descartes, whom he followed in holding that the world contains two types of substance, mind and matter, the combination of which constitutes humans. However, he sided with Malebranche and Locke in denying that introspection lets us reach the substance of the soul. Indeed, like Locke and Newton he held that we just don't know the substance of things. Furthermore, Clarke's overall judgment of Descartes was quite critical. He shared the view expressed by More, Pascal, Bayle, and Leibniz that Descartes' system could be, and had been, used to further irreligion and had naturally developed into Spinozism. In particular, he believed that Descartes' identification of matter with extension, and therefore space, entails making it eternal and infinite. He defended natural religion from naturalism (the view that nature constitutes a self-sufficient system of which we are but a part) and revealed religion from deism in two sets of Boyle Lectures and in exchanges with Anthony Collins and Leibniz.

In what follows, we use "W" as an abbreviation to cite passages in The Works, and "D" as an abbreviation to cite passages in A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God and Other Writings. For the full references, see the Bibliography.

1. Life and Works

Samuel Clarke was born at Norwich on October 11, 1675. He took his B.A. degree at Cambridge in 1695 by defending Newton's views, which then were still far from uncontroversial. His tutor apparently convinced him to provide a new annotated Latin translation of Rohault's Treatise of Physics. The translation was published in 1697 and Clarke's notes in effect criticized Cartesian physics in favor of Newton's. In that same year, Clarke befriended Whiston, who probably introduced him into the Newtonian circle, of which he soon became a leading figure. His relation with Newton is somewhat unclear, in part because none of their correspondence (if there was any, since they were neighbors for many years) survives; however, in contrast to many members of the Newtonian circle, it seems that he never fell out of favor with Newton. In 1704 he delivered his first set of Boyle Lectures under the title A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God. More particularly in answer to Mr Hobbes, Spinoza and their followers. They were so successful that he was asked to deliver the 1705 Lectures as well, which he did under the title A Discourse concerning the Unchangeable Obligations of Natural Religion and the Truth and Certainty of Christian Revelation. The Boyle Lectures gave him great notoriety, and his connection with Newton became official in 1706, when he translated the Opticks into Latin. In the same year, Clarke attacked Henry Dodwell, who had claimed that the soul is naturally mortal and receives immortality by the supernatural efficacy of baptism. Clarke's criticism drew a reply by Anthony Collins, a materialist follower of Locke's, and the ensuing exchange on whether matter can think brought Clarke even greater notoriety. His reputation had become so great that in 1710 Berkeley sent him the first edition of the Principles (Clarke declined to comment on them), and in 1713 Joseph Butler consulted him on some difficulties in Clarke's 1704 Boyle Lecture. In the meantime, he had been introduced to Queen Anne, who made him one of her chaplains in 1706, and three years later he was elevated to the rectory of St. James's, Westminster.

In 1712, apparently against the advice of some of Queen Anne's ministers, Clarke published The Scripture Doctrine of the Trinity, which was accused of Arianism, the view that Christ is divine but created. The ensuing controversy culminated two years later in his humiliating promise to the Upper House of Convocation not to preach or write on the topic any longer. However, this act of submission did not silence the correct rumors that he, like Newton himself, was still an Arian. How much these suspicions of heterodoxy damaged his ecclesiastical career is unclear. However, Voltaire reports that Bishop Gibson effectively prevented Clarke's elevation to the see of Canterbury by pointing out that Clarke was indeed the most learned and honest man in the kingdom, but had one defect: he was not a Christian.

After the Hanoverian accession, Clarke developed a close relationship with the Caroline of Anspach, the Princess of Wales and future queen. It was through her mediation that Clarke engaged Leibniz in the most famous philosophical correspondence of the eighteenth century. The exchange dealt with many of the issues that had occupied Clarke in his Boyle Lectures, such as divine immensity and eternity, the relation of God to the world, the soul and its relation to the body, free will, space and time, and the nature of miracles. It also discussed more strictly scientific topics, such as the nature of matter, the existence of atoms and the void, the size of the universe, and the nature of motive force, which were then often given both a philosophical and a scientific treatment.

In 1717, Clarke published the correspondence with Leibniz together with an attack on a work by Collins denying the existence of free will. This was his last significant philosophical work. However, his remaining years were not spent idly. He continued to defend his theological views, and in 1728 wrote a short essay for the Philosophical Transactions trying to show, against the Leibnizians, that the proper measure of force is not mv2 but mv. In 1729, by royal command, he edited and translated into Latin the first twelve books of the Iliad, showing the same skill in classical languages he had manifested in his edition of the works of Caesar seventeen years earlier. He died in 1729 after a very short illness, survived by his wife Katherine and five of his seven children. Clarke was a polite and courtly man who, however, was vivacious with his friends and seems to have been fond of playing cards. Voltaire, who met him was impressed by his piety and admired his logical skills so much that he called him “a veritable thinking machine.”

2. The Attack against Naturalism and the Defense of Natural Religion

Clarke's attack against naturalism revolved around five connected points. First, God is a necessarily existent omnipotent, omniscient, eternal, omnipresent and supremely benevolent person. Second, nature and its laws are radically contingent. God, endowed with a libertarian will, chose to create the world and operate in it by a reasonable but uncaused fiat. Third, although space and time are infinite, matter is spatio-temporally finite, and being endowed only with vis inertiae it has no power of self-motion. Fourth, God is substantially present in nature (or better, nature is literally in God, since space and time are divine attributes) and constantly exercises his power by applying attractive and repulsive forces to bodies. With the exception of the law of inertia, which describes the essentially passive nature of matter, strictly speaking the laws of nature do not describe the behavior of matter, which is just dead mass constantly pushed around, but modalities of operation of the divine power: as in the case of occasionalism (the view that only God is the real cause of events), they prescribe the actions of the divine will rather than describe those of bodies. Fifth, although the soul is extended and interacts with the body, it is necessarily immaterial because matter, being constituted of merely juxtaposed parts, cannot possibly think even by divine intervention; moreover, the soul has been endowed by God with a libertarian will. The first four points guarantee that nature is not a self-sufficient system, so much so that without direct and constant divine physical intervention planets would fly away from their orbits, atoms would break into their components and the machinery of the world literally grind to a halt; the fifth guarantees that the soul is not a part of nature. In the following, we shall see these points emerge from a consideration of Clarke's views on God, free will, matter and the laws of nature, space and time, and the soul.

2.1 God

The proof of the necessary existence and attributes of God occupies most of A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God, Clarke's first set of Boyle Lectures. The main lines of Clarke's argument are as follows. Since something exists now, something has always existed, otherwise nothing would exist now because nothing comes from nothing. What has existed from eternity can only be either an independent being, that is, one having in itself the reason of its existence, or an infinite series of dependent beings. However, such a series cannot be the being that has existed from eternity because by hypothesis it can have no external cause, and no internal cause (no dependent being in it) can cause the whole series. Hence, an independent being exists. As a side argument, Clarke also argued that since space and time cannot be thought of as non-existent and they are obviously not self-subsistent, the substance on which they depend, God, must exist necessarily as well. Finally, teleological considerations show that God is necessarily endowed with intelligence and wisdom. In addition, God has, though not with metaphysical necessity, all the moral perfections.

Although Clarke said little about the divine nature, he rejected not only Spinoza's view that a word can refer both to human and divine properties only equivocally, but also Aquinas' position that it can do so only analogically. Instead, he adopted the Latitudinarian view that human and divine attributes, especially the moral ones, have the same nature, although God's are infinite.

Clarke's most characteristic and controversial views about God concerned divine eternity and immensity. According to traditional Christian theology, God is eternal and immense (omnipresent). The claim that God is eternal can be taken to mean two different things. In one sense it means that God is a timeless being whose duration is not successive, with no before or after: past, present and future are all timelessly present to God. In another sense, it means that God is sempiternal, namely, a being existing throughout time but whose duration is successive and for whom there is a before and an after.

Similarly, divine immensity or omnipresence can be understood in different ways. God can be taken to be present everywhere by operation but not by situation; in other words, God is present by being in a place not as a human would be, but by acting there: God fills a room by causing it and its contents in a way remotely analogous to that in which I can fill a glass by pouring water in it. By contrast, one could claim that divine operational presence requires situational presence and hold that the divine substance is, in some sense to be specified, coextended with what it fills. However, divine extension can itself be taken in two ways. It can be understood in terms of local extension; God, then, would be extended like, say, a stone or perhaps space are, with the proviso that God, unlike a stone, could penetrate all other extended things. Or, it can be understood in non-local terms, in accordance with what More dubbed “holenmerism;” the divine substance, then, would be wholly in the whole of space and wholly in each and every place, in a way analogous to the presence in space of an instant of time.

Clarke rejected the view of God as substantially removed from space and time. Divine eternity involves both necessary existence and infinite duration which, however, could not be identified with the traditional notion of the eternal present (nunc stans) according to which God exists in an unchanging permanent present without any successive duration since, like Newton, he considered such a view unintelligible at best and contradictory at worst. The attribution of successive duration to God might suggest that God, like us, is in time but, unlike us, does not change. However, this was not Clarke's view. For he made clear in his exchanges with Butler that God is not in space and time. Moreover, he attributed distinct and successive thoughts to God, otherwise God could not “vary his will, nor diversify his works, nor act successively, nor govern the world, nor indeed have any power to will or do anything at all” (W, III, 897). Hence, God is immutable with respect to his will and his general and particular decrees only in the sense that he does not change his mind.

Clarke's criticism of the Scholastic view of divine immensity or omnipresence was analogous to that of eternity: the claim that the immensity of God is a point, as his eternity is an instant is, he held, unintelligible. However, while for Clarke God's temporal presence is analogous to ours by involving temporal succession, his views about God's spatial presence were somewhat less clear because he did not explicitly state whether he adopted holenmerism or not. Nevertheless, there are good reasons for holding he did not. Clarke vigorously denied Leibniz’ charge that extension is incompatible with divine simplicity because it introduces parts in God without making any reference to holenmerism, and this intimates that he thought of divine omnipresence in terms of local extension and dimensionality. Nor did he attempt any defense of holenmerism from More's famous critique, and in addition there is some indirect contemporary evidence that Clarke took God to be literally dimensional.[1]

For Clarke, divine eternity and immensity are to be identified with space and time. This identification, however, was fraught with difficulties, in part because Clarke's position was not clear. Usually, he held that space and time are just divine properties. However, in his fourth letter he also told Leibniz that in addition they are necessary effects of God's existence and necessary requirements for divine eternity and ubiquity, without supplying any argument to show that these different accounts are equivalent or even compatible. At other times, as in the letter to Daniel Waterland and in the Avertissement to Pierre Des Maizeaux, in the latter of which Newton had more than a hand, he held that they are not, strictly speaking, properties (D, 122-23).[2]

Moreover, as Leibniz and an anonymous correspondent (almost certainly Waterland) readily noted, the identification of divine immensity with space endangers the simplicity of the divine being because space has parts, albeit not separable ones. The objection, though formidable, was not new; Bayle in the Dictionnaire (entry “Leucippus,” remark G) had chided the Newtonians for identifying space with divine immensity in order to solve the ontological problem created by the positing of an infinite space, and had compared this solution to Malebranche's placement of “intelligible extension” in God, a move which, he claimed, Arnauld had shown to lead to the destruction of divine simplicity.

Clarke's solution was to claim parity between spatial and temporal extendedness: since the former is compatible with the simplicity of what “stretches” temporally, the latter is compatible with the simplicity of what stretches spatially. But the parity between space and time, were it to be granted, rather than showing that spatial extendedness is not detrimental to a thing's simplicity because temporal extendedness is not, could be taken to show that the latter is detrimental to a thing's simplicity because the former is. In addition, time, like space, is subject to the category of quantity, traditionally taken to be incompatible with the divine essence.

The same critic also argued that it is incompatible with divine “spirituality”, as Clarke put it, namely with the claim that God thinks. This too aimed at showing that Clarke's God is not a unity. For, according to Clarke, only an essentially simple substance can think, and consequently matter, being a compound, cannot possibly be the subject of consciousness. While unfortunately we do not have the letter of Clarke's critic, presumably the objection was that if the divine consciousness were extended, then it would be possible to consider a spatial part of it as being itself conscious. But this possibility shows that an extended consciousness is not a unity because if a spatial part of consciousness were a consciousness, then the whole consciousness would be a multitude of consciousnesses. And this would not only be incompatible with divine simplicity, but with Clarke's point that consciousness is a unity in the sense of not being composed by several consciousnesses.

As before, Clarke's reply invoked the symmetry between space and time. He started by pointing out, as Newton had done in the General Scholium to book III of Principia, that an instant of time is the same everywhere. But, Clarke thought, the spatial extension of one instant of time does not affect its unity and does not justify the claim that it stretches for, say, one mile. The evidence for this conclusion, Clarke seemed to hold, is given by the fact that one does not think, or talk, about time in terms of miles. Similarly, he concluded, from the fact that the divine consciousness is extended, one should not infer that it is proper to talk about it in terms of its spatial parts. However, Clarke's point seems hardly compelling: if one assumes that an instant of time is infinitely extended, one is implicitly assuming that it is extended for at least one mile.

2.2 Free Will

Clarke attached great importance to the issue of free will. Like many philosophers he held that the highest form of freedom involves willing as one should, namely, having one's will in step with one's right values. He also believed that freedom of the will, or liberty, involves a libertarian power of self-determination and that it is a necessary condition both for that higher form of freedom and for religion. Hobbes' and Spinoza's views that everything happens deterministically or necessarily, he thought, destroys it. However, Spinoza, Hobbes and their followers could be defeated by noticing that the very causal version of the principle of sufficient reason, customarily used to show that no self-determining will is possible because each of its determinations is the effect of previous causes, in reality entails that God has a self-determining free will. The reason is that the causal version of the principle of sufficient reason in the cosmological argument shows that the necessary being on which the contingent world depends must have in itself “a principle of acting...which is the idea of liberty” (D, 53-4).

Clarke's argument is disconcerting. At most, the cosmological argument shows that the first cause cannot be acted upon by any other cause and consequently must be an original causal principle. Spinoza knew this and pointed out that God is self-existent and self-determined, i.e., a free cause in his sense, and that its essence is power. But whether the divine power operates in accordance with metaphysically necessary laws themselves arising from the divine nature or not, is left open by the causal version of the principle of sufficient reason. Clarke thought he had an answer to this sort of objection by showing that the notion of a necessary agent is contradictory because agency involves the libertarian capacity of suspending action. Therefore, since God must be an agent, he cannot operate necessarily, and since being an agent and being free are the same thing, God is free as well. Of course, the identification of agency with the capacity to choose provided further evidence against the view that Spinoza's god is an agent. But Clarke failed to justify his libertarian view of agency, and finally could not explain why the first cause ought to be an agent in his sense rather than just a Spinozistic cause which produces all that can be produced without choosing. Ultimately, the causal version of the principle of sufficient reason cannot yield the conclusion Clarke wanted.

However, Clarke had other arguments against the view that divine operations are necessary. If God operated necessarily, things could not be different from how they are. But the number of planets, their orbits, indeed, the law of gravitation itself could have been different, as any reasonable person (but not Spinoza) could plainly see. Further, the obvious presence of final causes indicates that divine activity follows not necessary but architectonic patterns.

Clarke did not content himself with attacking necessitarianism and determinism with arguments drawn from general metaphysical considerations; he also criticized the specific theories of volition which determinists and necessitarians had put forth, in particular the view that volition is caused by, or even identical with, the last evaluative judgment. He did not identify whom he had in mind, but certainly the targets were Spinoza and Hobbes. Spinoza had argued that every act of volition is an act of affirmation and viceversa, and Hobbes had argued that the evaluative judgment, although not identical with volition is its the final and decisive cause.

Clarke was ready to grant that the understanding is fully determined to assent to a proposition that is perceived to be true in the same way in which an open eye is fully determined to see objects. In this sense, the assent is necessary. However, the necessity of the last evaluative judgment is totally immaterial to the issue of freedom. His opponents, Clarke thought, were guilty of basic philosophical errors. If they maintained that the content of the evaluation, the evaluative proposition, is identical with the volition or causes it, then they were confusing reasons with causes or, as he put it, “moral motives with physical efficients” (D, 73). The understanding presents the agent with a value judgment e.g. “doing X is better than doing Y,” which the agent has the power to follow or not. The reason, Clarke explained to Collins, is that the motive, e.g., the proposition “doing X is better than doing Y,” cannot cause anything because it is an abstract entity. Holding the contrary is taking an abstract entity for a substance.

On the other hand, if Clarke's opponents maintained that, not the evaluative proposition, but one's perceiving, judging or otherwise believing it, is identical with, or a partial cause of, volition, then they were falling foul of a basic causal principle. Against Descartes, Clarke insisted that judging, i.e., assenting to what appears true and dissenting from what appears false, is not an action but a passion. But what is passive cannot cause anything active. So, there is no causal link between evaluation and volition, or as Clarke put it “approbation and action” (D, 126). Nor is there any causal link between previous non-volitional mental states and any volition. What causes the volition is the principle of action itself, which Clarke identified with the agent, that is, the spiritual substance.

Having shown that God is endowed with liberty, Clarke tried to show that we are as well. His argument was based both on metaphysics and experience. It is clear that liberty is a communicable power because it does not entail such incommunicable qualities as total causal independence and self-existence. We do not know how the power of action can be transmitted, but considerations drawn from experience assure us that is has been, since our actions seem to us to be free, exactly as they would do on the supposition that we are really free agents. Of course this does not amount to a strict demonstration; but denying that we have free will is on a par with denying the existence of the external world, a coherent but unreasonable option. The burden of proof is not on the supporter of liberty, but on its denier.

In addition to providing evidence for the libertarian position, Clarke also endeavored to answer arguments against it. Against the claim that divine foreknowledge is incompatible with free will, Clarke objected that since knowledge does not affect the thing known, our free choices are unaffected by divine omniscience. He also addressed the Hobbesian argument that, since thought is a mode of matter and matter has no self-moving power, there cannot be any freedom of the will. Against this he advanced two objections. One is a complex argument, which we discuss later, for the claim that thought cannot possibly inhere either naturally or supernaturally in matter. The other consists in the claim that Hobbes and his followers were guilty of sliding from meaning “extended solid substance” by “matter” (which of course would not have free will even if it were to think per impossibile) to meaning “substantial substratum or subject of inherence”, (to which any previous conclusion regarding free will based on solidity and extension need not apply).

Another objection Clarke considered is that a free agent cannot choose whether to have a will or not; “...but (the two contradictories of acting or not acting being always necessarily before him) he must of necessity, and essentially to his being a free agent, perpetually will one of these two things, either to act or to forbear acting,” a view that induced even “some considerate persons” to entertain “great doubts concerning the possibility of liberty” (D, 74). Clarke did not identify the philosophers he had in mind, but probably one of his targets was Locke, who at Essay II, 21, 23-4 seemed to move from the claim that an action can take place or not only if the agent wills it or not and the claim that necessarily an action must take place or not, to the conclusion that the will of the agent is determined. Clarke pointed out that the argument was guilty of confusing de dicto and de re necessity. It might be true that if I think about doing A, then it is necessary that either I will to do A or will not to do A. However, from this it does not follow that if I think about doing A, necessarily I will to do A. Nor does it follow that if I think about doing A, then necessarily I will not to do A.

2.3 Matter and the Laws of Nature

Clarke's views on matter are best seen in connection with his ideas about miracles. Like Joseph Glanville, Thomas Sprat, Boyle, and Locke, he belonged to that group of English intellectuals associated with the Royal Society who thought that miracles could be used as evidence for the claim that Christianity is the true religion. According to Clarke, a miracle is a “work effected in a manner unusual…by the interposition either of God himself, or of some intelligent agent superior to man, for the proof or evidence of some particular doctrine, or in attestation to the authority of some particular person” (W, II, 701).

However, Clarke claimed, “Modern Deists”, noticing that nature is regular and constant and that certain causes produce certain effects according to fixed laws, have come to the conclusion that “there are in matter certain laws or powers the result of which is…the course of nature; which they think is impossible to be changed or altered, and consequently that there can be no such things as miracles” (D, 150). It is difficult to see why Clarke worried about this allegedly deist view. Certainly, even in a physical world ruled by metaphysically necessary laws, events can have unusual causes, e.g., by being brought about by invisible agents. Presumably then, when Clarke claimed that miracles are “effected in manner unusual, or different from the common and regular method of providence,” he meant that the causes of a miracle are not subsumable under the laws of nature; consequently, if the natural laws are unbreakable and all pervasive, as the deists and Spinoza claim, then miracles are impossible.

The deistic view, Clarke argued, is completely wrong because “all things done in the world, are done either immediately by God himself, or by created intelligent beings: matter being evidently not at all capable of any laws or powers whatsoever” except for the negative power of inertia. Consequently, the so called “effects of the natural powers of matter, and laws of motion; of gravitation, attraction, or the like” properly speaking are but the “effects of God's acting upon matter continually and every moment, either immediately by himself, or mediately by some created intelligent beings.” The course of nature is “nothing else but the will of God producing certain effects in a continued, regular, constant and uniform manner which…being in every moment perfectly arbitrary, is as easy to be altered at any time, as to be preserved” (D, 149). So, the possibility of miracles for Clarke depends upon a form of theological voluntarism and the denial of the activity of matter.

Clarke's theological voluntarism was moderate if compared to the extreme views of Descartes. For him, moral laws are independent of the divine will and even the absolute power of God is limited to what is logically possible. Nor is the divine will inscrutable, if that entails that divine attributes and powers are absolutely different from the human ones since, as we saw above, they have the same nature and differ only in degree. Moreover, the “arbitrariness” of God's will is not to be construed as irrationality; rather, the divine will infallibly follows his necessarily correct judgment, and consequently God always acts on the basis of rules of “uniformity and proportion.” However, true to his libertarian position, Clarke held that the will, in God as in us, is not causally determined by the understanding, and therefore the rules governing the ordinary power of God, a subset of which are the laws of nature, are freely self-imposed, and not the result of the necessarily correct divine understanding: they are a manifestation of God's moral, and therefore free, attributes, not of God's metaphysical, and therefore necessary, ones.

Clarke steadfastly maintained that matter has neither an essential nor an accidental power of self-motion. The first claim was very common among early modern philosophers, and held not only a fortiori by an occasionalist like Malebranche, but also by thinkers of different persuasions like Descartes, Locke and Boyle. In fact, even Gassendi, who had upheld the notion of an active matter by claiming that atoms have an internal corporeal principle of action, had fallen short of claiming that they possess it essentially.

Clarke's second claim, however, was more controversial. For although most early modern mechanists programmatically tried to substitute a nature made of inert particles for the living nature of Renaissance philosophy, the attempt soon ran into great difficulties. Strict mechanism proved inadequate to explain phenomena like exothermic reactions (where does the explosive motion of gunpowder come from?) or the spring of the air (why does a deflated closed balloon expand in a vacuum tube?). In order to explain such phenomena, mechanism was altered by philosopher-scientists like Boyle, Charleton, Petty, and Newton to include particles variously endowed with powers of motion, attraction and repulsion.

Clarke's position on the issue was radical: the various non-mechanical powers of particles are the result of direct divine or spiritual activity. He could not bring himself to accept active matter because he thought of it as a prelude to atheism for, as we noticed above, Clarke believed that denying God's continuous direct intervention in nature in effect amounts to eliminating him, as John Toland had done by endowing matter with essential “autokynesis.” Clarke's views, however, had their own problems. A God who is actually extended and constantly operates physically on matter looked suspiciously like the soul of the world, as Leibniz charged using Newton's identification (in the Opticks) of space as the sensorium of God. Similarly, the placement of gravitational forces within the purview of ordinary divine activity drew from Leibniz the accusation of obscurantism.

2.4 Space and Time

According to Clarke, the ideas of space and time are the two “first and most obvious simple Ideas, that every man has in his mind” (D, 114). Like many of the philosophers who investigated the nature of space and time, he tended to produce arguments with regard to space, leaving the reader to infer that parallel arguments could be drawn with respect to time. With Newton, he argued that while matter can be thought of as non-existing, space exists necessarily because “to suppose any part of space removed, is to suppose it removed from and out of itself: and to suppose the whole to be taken away, is supposing it to be taken away from itself, that is, to be taken away while it still remains: which is a contradiction in terms” (D, 13).

Although space is not sensible, Clarke rejected its identification with nothingness, since space has some properties, for example, quantity and dimensions. One might add other properties he accepted, such as homogeneity, immutability, and continuity, and probably impenetrability. Space, then, is an entity in which things are, and not mere absence of matter. Space is also not an aggregate of its parts but presumably an essential whole preceding all it parts, a view motivated at least in part by theological considerations.

Like Newton, Clarke adopted the view that space is necessarily infinite because “to set bounds to space, is to suppose it bounded by something which itself takes up space” or else that “this bounded by nothing, and then the idea of that nothing will still be space”, and both suppositions are contradictory (D, 115). What Clarke had in mind here is rather unclear. He seemed to think that what has a boundary must be bounded by something else. If so, the argument was not well taken because a sphere, for example, has a boundary which stems from its own nature, not by the presence of something external bounding it: one need not think of space by analogy with a gas kept in place by the walls of a vessel.

Since absolute space has an essential and invariable structure which is independent of the bodies in it and which is not altered by their presence, any possible world must conform to it, as creatures must be in space and God cannot alter essences because his power is limited to the metaphysically possible. The same is true of time, which flows equably independently of anything in it. Creatures occupy an absolute position in space and time that we may or may not be able to establish because we have no direct access to absolute space and time.

The introduction of absolute space, allegedly demanded by Newtonian physics, offered Clarke an immediate philosophical advantage in the fight against Spinoza. For it showed that the Cartesian identification of extension with matter, which had made possible Spinoza's excesses was wrong, a consequence that was not lost on Bayle and insisted upon by Colin McLaurin. Of course, the existence of absolute space introduced a new difficulty, that of its relation to God, but, as we saw, Clarke thought he had solved it by claiming that space and time are attributes of God or the result of divine existence.

2.5 The Soul

In 1706, Henry Dodwell published a book in which he defended conditional immortality: our souls are naturally mortal and upon the death of the body can be kept in existence only by divine supernatural intervention. Clarke wrote an open letter to Dodwell complaining that he had opened wide the floodgates to Libertinism by providing an excuse for the wicked not to fear eternal punishment. He then argued that the soul, being immaterial, is naturally immortal and gave his own version of the traditional argument for the immateriality of the soul from the alleged unity of consciousness, insisting that not even God could endow matter with consciousness.

Clarke's argument failed to convince Anthony Collins, who made no bones about his materialist leanings and had intervened in defense of Dodwell. Clarke told Collins that if thinking in humans were a mode of matter, then “it [would] be but too natural a consequence, to conceive that it may be only the same thing in all other rational beings likewise; and even in God himself. And what a notion of God this would give us, is not difficult to imagine.” For then, Clarke continued, every thinking being, including God, would be governed by “absolute necessity, such as the motion of a clock or a watch is determined by” (W, III, 851). The result would be the destruction of every possibility of self-determination and the undermining of the very foundations of religion.

The exchange with Collins makes clear that Clarke's argument for the immateriality of the soul revolved around three basic claims, namely:

  1. Necessarily consciousness is an individual power.
  2. An individual power cannot result from, or inhere in, a divisible substance; or, alternatively, an individual power can only be produced by, or inhere in, an individual being.
  3. Matter is not, and cannot possibly be, an individual being.

The conclusion is that consciousness cannot possibly be the product of, or inhere in, matter.

The first premise, Clarke explained, must be understood as expressing the obvious truth that consciousness is “truly one undivided consciousness, and not a multitude of distinct consciousnesses added together” (W, III, 784). Collins accepted Clarke's first premise and was also ready to accept the third premise, not with respect to matter per se, but with respect to systems of matter such as the brain. However, he disagreed with Clarke's claim that an individual power such as consciousness can inhere only in an individual subject, namely a being which, as Clarke put it, is “essentially one, i.e., such that any division in it destroys its essence” (D, 152-53). Consequently, he disagreed with Clarke's contention that only an individual substance like an immaterial soul can be the subject of consciousness. Clarke's attempts to meet Collins' objections generated an interesting and protracted controversy.

For Clarke, although the soul is necessarily immaterial, it can causally affect the body because material qualities such as figure and mobility are “negative qualities, deficiencies or imperfections” which can be brought about by consciousness, which is a positive quality (D, 41). One can appreciate the theological, moral, and broadly philosophical motivations for such a position. He clearly wanted to leave the door open for arguing that God, the maker of matter, is immaterial, and the claim that a thinking immaterial substance can produce material modifications is an essential component of his argument. Moreover, for Clarke the capacity of the soul to affect the body causally is a consequence of our being endowed with liberty. In addition, Clarke was convinced that we experience the causal power by which we move our body. However, his position on whether the body causally affects the soul was less than clear. At times, he leaned towards the view that is does, and at others that it does not.

Collins not only rejected Clarke's argument from the unitary nature of consciousness to the immateriality of its subject, but also wondered how an immaterial substance like the soul can be indivisible if one assumes, as Clarke had obliquely intimated, that it is extended. To Collins' apparent surprise, instead of rejecting the view that the soul is extended, Clarke replied that whether the soul is extended was immaterial to the issue at hand. Moreover, “as the parts of space or expansion itself can demonstrably be proved to be absolutely indiscerpible, so it ought not to be reckoned an insuperable difficulty to imagine that all immaterial thinking substances (upon supposition that expansion is not excluded out of their idea) may be so likewise” (W, III, 763). The point is that for Clarke space is extended and yet indivisible because of the interdependence of its parts. All one has to do is to think of the soul as a substance whose parts depend on each other, like those of space.

One can sympathize with Clarke's guarded reply. On the one hand, he understood the problems involved in the claim that the soul is extended and is also the individual, essentially indivisible, immaterial subject of consciousness, and consequently tried to separate the issue of immateriality from that of extension. On the other hand, Clarke did indeed maintain that the soul is extended. He held that while God is not in space, everything else is. As he eventually told Leibniz, the soul is in a particular place, the sensorium, which a part of the brain occupies. Clarke inferred the presence of the soul in the sensorium through an argument employing two independent premises: first, that something can act only where it is substantially, and second, that the soul interacts with the body. The conclusion is that the soul is substantially present where (at least) a part of the body is.

Saying that the soul must be substantially present where a part of the brain is does not fully determine how the soul is present. It certainly rules out mere Cartesian operational presence, but it fails to determine whether the soul's presence is to be understood in terms of holenmerism or in terms of mere extension. However, there is cumulative evidence that for Clarke the soul is merely coextended with a part of the brain. Clarke used an analogy with space, which he took to be both extended and indivisible, to explain how the soul could be extended and indivisible; but certainly holenmerism does not apply to space. He did not address More's critique of holenmerism, as one would expect him to do had he adopted it. He did not address Leibniz’ accusation that the extension of the soul destroys its unity by appealing to holenmerism; rather, he defended the claim that, as he put is, the soul “fills the sensorium.” In sum, Clarke's views on freedom, with their ties to morality and religion, together with his views on causality, pushed him towards the thesis that the soul is extended.

3. Ethics and Revealed Religion

Although some of his sermons contain interesting analyses of individual Christian virtues, the most sustained exposition of Clarke's ethics is contained in A Discourse concerning the Unalterable Obligations of Natural Religion and the Truth and Certainty of the Christian Revelation, his second set of Boyle Lectures. Clarke started by stating that clearly there are different relations among persons and that from these relations there arise a “fitness” or “unfitness” of behavior among persons. So, for example, given the relation of infinite disproportion between humans and God, it is fit that we honor, worship, and imitate the Lord. In other words, from certain eternal and immutable factual relations among persons there arise certain eternal and immutable obligations, which in their broad features can be rationally apprehended by anyone with a sound mind, although in some entangled cases we may be at a loss in clearly demarcating right from wrong. Being grounded in necessary relations, morality, like geometry, is universal and necessary. As such, it is independent of any will, be it divine or human, and of any consideration of punishment or reward as anyone, but not Hobbes, can plainly see. So, Clarke's view thus far can be characterized as a variety of rationalist deontology.

Morality has three main branches dealing with duties toward God, other humans, and oneself. Duties toward others are governed by equity, which demands that one deal with other persons as one can reasonably expect others to deal with one, and by love, which demands that one further the happiness of all persons. Duties towards oneself demand that one preserve one's life and spiritual well being so as to be able to perform one's duties. Suicide, then, is wrong.

Since God's will is uncorrupted by self-interest or passion, divine volitions and moral commands are extensionally equivalent. Hence, God wants us to follow morality, and such a desire is manifested in laws God has set up. But since laws require sanctions, and since such sanctions are not uniformly present in this life, moral laws are associated with reward and punishment in the next life. Moreover, human depravity makes the prospect of future sanctions a necessary incentive for proper behavior.

However, Clarke seemed prepared to go further, claiming against the Stoics and his beloved Cicero that in our present state virtue is not the highest good (this being happiness), and that consequently it would be unreasonable, not just psychologically difficult, to lay down one's life for the sake of duty. Virtue, Clarke claimed, is not happiness but only a means to it, as in a race running is not itself the prize but the way to obtain it. The present sorry state of mankind, beset by ignorance, prejudice, and corrupt passions renders divine revelation necessary, contrary to what deists think, and therefore the remaining lectures are mainly devoted to establishing the reliability of the Gospels.

Clarke's theory can be, and has been, criticized on several grounds. He never quite explained what is the nature of the relations among persons that ground morality, leaving his followers and detractors to argue inconclusively about it.[3] Nor is it clear how moral obligation arises from such de facto, albeit eternal, relations, although Clarke is hardly alone in facing this problem. Hume famously charged Clarke's theory with motivational impotence because the intellectual perception of “fitness” cannot, by itself, move the will. However, as we saw, Clarke denied that evaluation is causally linked to motivation, although he clearly thought that evaluation provides the agent, who ultimately causes the volition, with reasons for action.

More importantly, Clarke's theory suffers from structural problems. It is torn between deontology and ethical egoism, and Clarke's claim that the deontological aspect applies at the ideal level but not in our corrupt state seems hardly successful. Moreover, as Tindal noted, Clarke's rationalist strand hardly fits with his insistence on the need for Christian revelation, since his arguments establishing the reliability of scripture seem to require much more intellectual effort than the apprehension of our moral duties. Indeed, as Tindal reasonably claimed by approvingly quoting Leibniz’ claim that the Chinese should send us missionaries in natural theology and its subsequent morality, revelation is neither necessary nor sufficient for proper moral behavior even for common people. Hence, how the obligations stemming from natural religion prepare the way for revelation is, to put it mildly, unclear.


Primary Literature

W Clarke, S., 1738, The Works, London 1738; reprint New York: Garland Publishing Co.
D Vailati, E., (ed.), 1998, Samuel Clarke. A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God And Other Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

See also:

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

afterlife | Boyle, Robert | Collins, Anthony | consciousness | deism | Descartes, René | egoism | eternity | free will | Gassendi, Pierre | God: concepts of | Hobbes, Thomas | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Locke, John | matter | miracles | naturalism | Newton, Isaac | Spinoza, Baruch