This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

of Philosophy 
Picture of Stanford University
Winter 2004 Edition
Displaying Special Characters

This guide is divided into the following sections:

1. Microsoft Windows (XP, 2000, ME, 98) Users

If you are using the latest version of IE (version 6) under Windows XP, 2000, ME or 98, and your browser is not displaying the special characters, then we should first mention that some of these combinations are supposed to work! Microsoft's own web pages say that Windows XP, 2000, and ME all shipped with the font Lucida Sans Unicode, which has support for Unicode (the "Sans" stands for sans serif, not "without"). XP also ships with Arial, Times New Roman and Courier New fonts, all of which are supposed to support the Unicode named character entities we use in our documents. However, we have had reports that IE is not able to access/display these fonts even though the fonts exist on the machine and IE has been explicitly set to use them (Tools -> Internet Options -> Fonts).

Here are some things to do:

  1. Some users need only use the Windows Update mechanism built into Internet Explorer to install support for the East Asian languages on your Windows machine. For some reason, this makes the Unicode fonts available to IE!
  2. If, after scanning your system, IE reports that there are no new updates available, you may instead have to use the Control Panel to install support for the East Asian languages on your Windows machine. Again, for some reason, this makes the Unicode fonts available to IE! Just follow the first 4 instructions on the following web page:
    Installing East Asian Language Support Under Windows XP
    Installing East Asian Language Support Under Windows Professional 2000
  3. Alternatively, install and use any of the other web browsers mentioned below:
    Generally these browsers work without any special configuration under Windows XP and Windows 2000, but you may have to (a) follow Step 2 above and (b) set Preferences in these browsers to use a Unicode-enabled font (Lucida Sans Unicode, Arial, Times New Roman), if you want to these browsers to display special characters on a Windows ME/98 machine.

2. Apple Mac OS X and Mac OS 9 Users

Mac OS X. The latest versions of Safari, Firefox, Mozilla, Netscape, and OmniWeb have all been tested successfully under Mac OS X. However, for the best results, you should set the font to Lucida Grande, since this font seems to have the widest support for Unicode characters (including support for the Modifier Letters from Unicode Chart U0300.pdf) in Mac OS X. We've also tested the free version of Opera, but without as much success; it doesn't currently display the symbols typically used in set theory, such as the membership sign, subset sign, etc.

Mac OS 9. Internet Explorer 5 on Mac OS 9 works surprisingly well if you set it to use the font Times New Roman. It has the ability to display most all of the special characters that are widely supported. We know of no way to configure Netscape 4.7 under Mac OS 9 so that it properly displays our pages and the Unicode characters which they use. There is reason to believe, however, that the unofficial build Mozilla 1.3.1 for Mac OS 9 will display our pages properly.

3. Linux, FreeBSD, Solaris, and other un*x OS Users

Firefox, Mozilla, Netscape, and Opera all provide reasonably good support for the special characters used in SEP entries, assuming you use the default font. However, we haven't test our pages with these systems as widely as we have the Windows and Mac platforms. So we cannot supply more specific information about what works best, i.e., what browser/font combination supports the widest range of Unicode characters.

4. A Note About the Special Characters in our Entries

We have tried to format our entries in XHTML so that they display properly in a wide range of web browsers. We have developed a web page of special characters which display correctly in a variety of current browsers. See

Widely Supported HTML 4 and Unicode Characters

But many of our entries use special symbols, such as logical, mathematical, and other symbols, which are not widely supported. Here is a list of such symbols:

Special Symbols Not Widely Supported

In the past, we used many more of the "low-resolution" screen shots of these characters and displayed the resulting graphics in the entry as small images, as we have done on the page cited immediately above. But, recently, after being convinced that there was wide support for Unicode characters among web browsers and operating systems, we starting replacing the low-resolution graphics with widely supported font-based Unicode characters. We are slowly but surely making all of our older entries compatible with the newer XHTML standard in the process. Indeed, we have now configured our publishing system so that our entries must parse as valid XHTML (i.e., be in compliance with the international standards set by the authoritative W3C organization) before they are published on the web. (We determine validity by sending our entries, pre-publication, to <> and fixing any errors reported when this engine tries to determine whether our documents are valid.)

Invariably, our best intentions are sometimes defeated by the technologies involved. If your browser is not properly displaying the named character entities in an entry (e.g., logical symbols, mathematical symbols, etc.), then we hope the above suggestions prove useful.