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One apt definition of war is this: war is an actual, intentional and widespread armed conflict between political communities. Thus, a fisticuffs between individual persons does not count as a war, nor does a gang fight, nor does a feud on the order of the Hatfields versus the McCoys. War is a phenomenon which occurs only between political communities, defined as those entities which either are states or intend to become states (in order to allow for civil war). Similarly, the mere threat of war and the presence of mutual disdain between these communities do not suffice as indicators of war. The conflict of arms must be actual and not merely latent. Further, the actual armed conflict must be both intentional and widespread: isolated clashes between rogue officers, or border patrols, do not count as actions of war. The onset of war requires a conscious commitment, and a significant mobilization, on the part of the belligerent communities in question.

Perhaps it would be appropriate here to cite the legendary Carl von Clausewitz. Clausewitz famously suggested that "war is the continuation of policy by other means." As a description, this conception is both powerful and plausible. It fits in nicely with his own general definition of war as "an act of violence intended to compel our opponent to fulfil our will." War, he says, is like a duel, but on "an extensive scale." As Michael Gelven has written recently, in an elegant monograph on how we ought to conceive of the essence of war, war is intrinsically vast, communal (or political) and violent. It is a widespread and deliberate armed conflict between political communities. It is the entity or phenomenon falling under such a description which is the primary focus of this entry.

The Ethics of War and Peace

One of the most enduring, and difficult, philosophical questions with regard to war focuses on the ethics of getting involved with it in the first place. It is most helpful, in ordering one's thoughts about this issue, to realize that there are three traditions of thought which dominate the philosophical treatment of this topic. This is not necessarily to imply that these three traditions exhaust all possible options for thinking about the ethics of war and peace, merely to note that they are hegemonic and importantly different from each other. But very few theories on the ethics of war succeed in resisting ultimate classification into one of them. The three traditions are: JUST WAR THEORY; REALISM; and PACIFISM.

Before spending some time discussing the core aspects of each tradition, let's declare, right from the start, the core conceptual differences between "the big three" perspectives. The core, and controversial, proposition of just war theory is that, sometimes, states can have moral justification for resorting to armed force in the international system. War is sometimes, but of course not all the time, morally right. The idea here is not that the war in question is merely politically shrewd, or prudent, or bold and daring, but fully moral, just. It is an ethically appropriate use of mass political violence. Realism, by contrast, sports a profound skepticism about the application of moral concepts, such as justice, to the key problems of foreign policy. Power and national security, realists claim, motivate states during wartime and thus moral appeals are strictly wishful thinking. Talk of the morality of warfare is pure bunk: ethics has got nothing to do with the rough-and-tumble world of global politics, where only the strong and cunning survive. Pacifism does not share realism's moral skepticism. For the pacifist, moral concepts can indeed be applied fruitfully to international affairs. It does make sense to ask whether a war is just. But the result of such normative application, in the case of war, is always that war should not be resorted to. Where just war theory is sometimes permissive with regard to war, pacifism is always prohibitive. For the pacifist, war is always wrong. Now let's turn to each of these three traditions.

Just War Theory

Just war theory is probably the most influential perspective on the ethics of war and peace. The just war tradition has enjoyed a long and distinguished pedigree, including such notables as Augustine, Aquinas, Grotius, Suarez, Vattel and Vitoria. Hugo Grotius probably deserves credit for being the most comprehensive and formidable member of the tradition; and James T. Johnson is the authoritative historian of this tradition. Many of the rules developed by the just war tradition have since been codified into contemporary international laws governing armed conflict, such as The Hague and Geneva Conventions. The tradition has thus been doubly influential, dominating both moral and legal discourse surrounding war. It sets the tone, and the parameters, for the great debate.

Just war theory can be meaningfully divided into three parts, which in the literature are referred to, for the sake of convenience, in Latin. These parts are: 1) jus ad bellum, which concerns the justice of resorting to war in the first place; 2) jus in bello, which concerns the justice of conduct within war, after it has begun; and 3) jus post bellum, which concerns the justice of peace agreements and the termination phase of war.

Jus ad bellum

The rules of jus ad bellum are addressed, first and foremost, to heads of state. Since political leaders are the ones who inaugurate wars, setting their armed forces in motion, they are to be held accountable to jus ad bellum principles. If they fail in that responsibility, then they commit war crimes. In the language of the Nuremberg prosecutors, aggressive leaders who launch unjust wars commit "crimes against peace." What constitutes a just or unjust resort to armed force is disclosed to us by the rules of jus ad bellum. Just war theory contends that, for any resort to war to be justified, a political community, or state, must fulfil each and every one of the following six requirements:

1. Just cause. A state may launch a war only for the right reason. The just causes most frequently mentioned include: self-defence from external attack; the protection of innocents; and punishment for wrongdoing. Vitoria suggested that all of the proffered just causes be subsumed under the one category of "a wrong received." Walzer, and most modern just war theorists, speak of the one just cause for resorting to war being the resistance of aggression. Aggression, simply put, is unjustified and harmful violence.

The key principle underlying just cause, and just war theory more broadly, is the vindication of fundamental rights and the protection of those who have such rights from serious, standard threats to them, such as aggression. Self-defence, and other-defence, from rights violating aggression are thus prime just causes for resorting to war. These rights are traditionally understood as the rights of states to political sovereignty and territorial integrity: states have the right to make their own political decisions for their own people, within their own borders. Only if these rights are violated - for instance, through an armed invasion across the border - is a country justified in resorting to a war of self-defence in response. Other countries may join the war on the victim's side, since the aggressor forfeits its state rights when it violates the victim's.

But what grounds the importance of these state rights? States have state rights, to things like sovereignty and integrity, only because their individual citizens have human rights. People create, and adhere to, state structures in order to secure the objects of their human rights. Human rights are elemental entitlements we all have to basic human dignity and to the objects of vital human need. The human rights most broadly endorsed are those to life, liberty and subsistence, for instance as enshrined in the United Nation's Universal Declaration and subsequent International Covenants.

Following John Rawls, we might establish criteria of minimal justice (MJ) which a state must fulfil if it is to be entitled to state rights: MJ 1) it is able to rule its people in accord with law and order; MJ 2) it provides its people with secure access to the objects of their human rights; and MJ 3) it adheres to basic norms of international justice, notably respect for the rights of persons and other minimally just states. Thus, a state which commits aggression against the people of another country violates principle MJ 3, and thus fails to be minimally just. A minimally just state forfeits its right not to be dealt with harshly, as a matter of appropriate punishment and rectification.

2. Right intention. A state must intend to fight the war only for the sake of a just cause. Having the right reason for launching a war is not enough: the actual motivation behind the resort to war must also be morally appropriate. Ulterior motives, such as a power or land grab, or irrational motives, such as revenge or ethnic hatred, are ruled out. The only right intention allowed is to see the just cause for resorting to war secured and consolidated. If another intentions crowd in, moral corruption sets in.

3. Proper authority and public declaration. A state may go to war only if the decision has been made by the appropriate authorities, according to the proper process, and made public, notably to its own citizens and to the enemy state(s).

4. Last Resort. A state may resort to war only if it has exhausted all plausible, peaceful alternatives to resolving the conflict in question, in particular diplomatic negotiation. One wants to make sure something as momentous and serious as war is declared only when it seems the only reasonable alternative to effectively punish aggression.

5. Probability of Success. A state may not resort to war if it can foresee that doing so will have no measurable impact on the situation. The aim here is to block mass violence which is going to be futile.

6. (Macro-) Proportionality. A state must, prior to initiating a war, weigh the universal goods expected to result from it, such as securing the just cause, against the universal evils expected to result, notably casualties. Only if the benefits are proportional to, or "worth", the costs may the war action proceed.

Just war theory insists all six criteria must each be fulfilled for a particular declaration of war to be justified: it's all or no justification, so to speak. It is important to note that the first three of these six rules are what we might call deontological requirements, otherwise known as duty-based requirements or first-principle requirements. For a war to be just, some core duty must be violated: in this case, the duty not to commit aggression. A war in punishment of this violated duty must itself respect further duties: it must be appropriately motivated, and must be publicly declared by (only) the proper authority for doing so. The next three requirements are consequentialist: given that these first principle requirements have been met, we must also consider the expected consequences of launching a war which seems justified according to first principles. Thus, just war theory attempts to provide a common sensical combination of both deontology and consequentialism as applied to the issue of war.

Jus in bello

Jus in bello refers to justice in war, to right conduct in the midst of battle. Responsibility for state adherence to jus in bello norms falls primarily on the shoulders of those military commanders, officers and soldiers who formulate and execute the war policy of a particular state. They are to be held responsible for any breach of the principles which follow below. Such accountability may involve being put on trial for war crimes.

Just war theorists insist that jus in bello is a category separate from jus ad bellum. For even if a state has resorted to war justly, it may be prosecuting that war in an unjustified manner. It may be deploying decrepit means in pursuit of its otherwise justified end. Just war theory insists on a fundamental moral consistency between means and ends with regard to wartime behaviour: justified ends may only be pursued through justified means.

Concern with consistency, however, is not the only, or even the main, reason behind the endorsement of separate rules regulating wartime conduct. Such rules are also required to limit warfare, to prevent it from spilling over into an ever-escalating, and increasingly destructive, experiment in total warfare. If just wars are limited wars, designed to secure their just causes with only proportionate force, the need for rules on wartime restraint is clear. Even though modern warfare has displayed a disturbing tendency towards totality - particularly during the two World Wars - it does not follow that the death of old-time military chivalry marks the end of moral judgment. We still hold soldiers to certain standards of conduct.

There are three widely recognized rules of jus in bello.

1. Discrimination. Soldiers are only entitled to target those who are, in Walzer's words, "engaged in harm." Thus, when they take aim, soldiers must discriminate between the civilian population, which is morally immune from direct and intentional attack, and those legitimate military, political and industrial targets involved in rights-violating harm. While some collateral civilian casualties are excusable, it is wrong to take deliberate aim at civilian targets. An example would be saturation bombing of residential areas.

2. (Micro-) Proportionality. Soldiers may only use force proportional to the end they seek. Weapons of mass destruction, for example, are usually seen as being out of proportion to legitimate military ends.

3. No Means Mala in Se. Soldiers may not use weapons or methods which are "evil in themselves." These include: mass rape campaigns; genocide or ethnic cleansing; torturing captured enemy soldiers; and using weapons whose effects cannot be controlled, like chemical or biological agents.

Jus post bellum

Jus post bellum refers to justice during the third and final stage of war: that of war termination. It seeks to regulate the ending of wars, and ease the transition from war back to peace. It is one of the most recent, and topical, issues in just war theory. See Orend's works in the bibliography below for more. Orend proposes the following rules for jus post bellum:

1. Just cause for termination. A state has just cause to seek termination of the just war in question if there has been a reasonable vindication of those rights whose violation grounded the resort to war in the first place. Not only have most, if not all, unjust gains from aggression been eliminated and the objects of the victim's rights been reasonably restored, but the aggressor is now willing to accept terms of surrender which include not only the cessation of hostilities, a formal apology and its renouncing the gains of its aggression but also its submission to reasonable principles of punishment, including compensation, war crimes trials, and perhaps rehabilitation.

2. Right intention. A state must intend to carry out the process of war termination only in terms of those principles contained in the other jus post bellum rules. Revenge is strictly ruled out as an animating force. Moreover, the just state in question must commit itself to symmetry and equal application with regard to the investigation and prosecution of any war crimes its own armed forces may have committed on the battlefield.

3. Public declaration and legitimate authority. The terms of the peace must be publicly proclaimed by a legitimate authority, which is to say the national government of the state victimized by the initial aggression, or perhaps an authorized international body.

4. Discrimination. In setting the terms of the peace, the just and victorious state is to differentiate between the political and military leaders, the soldiers and the civilian population within the aggressor. Undue and unfair hardship is not to be brought upon the civilian population in particular: punitive measures are to be focused upon those elites most responsible for the aggression.

5. Proportionality. Any terms of peace must be proportional to the end of reasonable rights vindication. Absolutist crusades against, and/or draconian punishments for, aggression are especially to be avoided. The people of the defeated aggressor never forfeit their human rights, and so are entitled not to be "blotted out" from the community of nations. There is thus no such thing as a morally-mandated unconditional surrender.

Any serious defection from these principles of jus post bellum, on the part either of the victim or the aggressor, is a violation of the rules of just war and so should be punished. At the very least, such violation of jus post bellum mandates a new round of good-faith diplomatic negotiations - perhaps even binding international arbitration - between the relevant parties to the dispute. At the very most, such violation gives the aggrieved party a just cause - but no more than a just cause - for resuming hostilities. Full recourse to the resumption of hostilities may be made only if all the other criteria of jus ad bellum are satisfied in addition to just cause.

Just war theory thus offers rules to guide decision-makers on the appropriateness of their conduct during the resort to war, conduct during war and the termination phase of the conflict. Its over-all aim is to try and ensure that wars are begun only for a very narrow set of truly defensible reasons, that when wars break out they are fought in a responsibly controlled and targeted manner, and that the parties to the dispute bring their war to an end in a speedy and responsible fashion that respects the requirements of justice.


Realism is most influential amongst political scientists, as well as scholars and practitioners of international relations. While realism is a complex and often sophisticated doctrine, its core propositions express a strong suspicion about applying moral concepts, like justice, to the conduct of international affairs. Realists believe that moral concepts should be employed neither as descriptions of, nor as prescriptions for, state behaviour on the international plane. Realists emphasize power and security issues, the need for a state to maximize its expected self-interest and, above all, their view of the international arena as a kind of anarchy, in which the will to power enjoys primacy.

Referring specifically to war, realists believe that it is an intractable part of an anarchical world system; that it ought to be resorted to only if it makes sense in terms of national self-interest; and that, once war has begun, a state ought to do whatever it can to win. In other words, "all's fair in love and war." During the grim circumstances of war, "anything goes." So if adhering to the rules of just war theory, or international law, hinders a state during wartime, it should disregard them and stick steadfastly to its fundamental interests in power and security. Prominent classical realists often mentioned include Thucydides, Machiavelli and Hobbes. Modern realists include Hans Morgenthau, George Kennan, Reinhold Niebuhr and Henry Kissinger, as well as so-called neo-realists, such as Kenneth Waltz.

It is important to distinguish between descriptive and prescriptive realism. Descriptive realism is the claim that states, as a matter of fact, either do not (for reasons of motivation) or cannot (for reasons of competitive struggle) behave morally, and thus moral discourse surrounding interstate conflict is empty, the product of a category mistake. States are simply not animated in terms of morality and justice: it's all about power, security and national interest for them. States are not like "big persons": they are creations of an utterly different kind, and we cannot expect them to live by the same rules and principles we require of individual persons. States inhabit a violent international arena, and they've got to be able to get in that game and win, if they are to serve and protect their citizens in an effective way over time. Morality is simply not on the radar screen for creations such as states, given their defensive function and the brutal environment in which they subsist.

Walzer offers arguments against this kind of realism, contending that states are in fact responsive to moral concerns, even when they fail to live up to them. States, because they are the creation of individual persons, want to act morally and justly. Walzer goes so far as to say that any state which was motivated by nothing more than the struggle to survive and win power could not over time sustain the support from its own population, which demands a deeper sense of community and justice. He also argues that all the pretence regarding "the necessity" of state conduct in terms of pursuing power is exaggerated and rhetorical, ignoring the clear reality of foreign policy choice enjoyed by states in the global arena. States are not frequently forced into some kind of dramatic, do-or-die struggle: the choice to go to war is a deliberate one, freely entered into and often hotly debated and agonized over before the decision is made. And this is leaving unspoken the argument regarding the defiant, Machiavellian amorality behind certain kinds of realism, and the moral calibre of the actions it might recommend on this basis. For example, if it's all about power and winning in the competitive struggle, does that make it alright to unleash weapons of mass destruction? Or to launch a mass rape campaign? Just war theory suggests not, and just war theorists like Walzer want to claim that the rest of us agree.

Prescriptive realism, though, need not be rooted in any form of descriptive realism. Prescriptive realism is the claim that a state ought (prudential "ought") to behave amorally in the international arena. A state should, for prudence's sake, adhere to an amoral policy of smart self-regard in international affairs. A smart state will leave its morality at home when considering what to do on the international stage. It's important to note that a prescriptive realist might, in the end, actually endorse rules for the regulation of warfare, much like those offered by just war theory. These rules include: "Wars should only be fought in response to aggression"; and "During war, non-combatants should not be directly targeted with lethal violence." Of course, the reason why a prescriptive realist might endorse such rules would be very different from the reasons offered by the just war theorist: the latter would talk about abiding moral values whereas the former would refer to useful rules which help establish expectations of behaviour, solve coordination problems and to which prudent bargainers would consent. Just war rules, the prescriptive realist might claim, do not have independent moral purchase on the attention of states. These rules are what Douglas Lackey calls "salient equilibria", stable conventions limiting war's destructiveness which all prudent states can agree on, assuming general compliance. There might even be some room for overlap between this kind of realism and just war theory.


It seems best to rely on Jenny Teichman's definition of pacifism as "anti-war-ism." Literally and straightforwardly, a pacifist rejects war in favour of peace. It is not violence in all its forms that the most challenging kind of pacifist objects to; rather, it is the specific kind and degree of violence that war involves which the pacifist objects to. A pacifist objects to killing (not just violence) in general and, in particular, she objects to the mass killing, for political reasons, which is part and parcel of the wartime experience. So, a pacifist rejects war; she believes that there are no moral grounds which can justify resorting to war. War, for the pacifist, is always wrong.

Mention should straight away be made of a very popular just war criticism of pacifism which will not be used here. This criticism is that pacifism amounts to an indefensible "clean hands policy." The pacifist, it is said, refuses to take the brutal measures necessary for the defense of himself and his country, for the sake of maintaining his own inner moral purity. It is contended that the pacifist is thus a kind of free-rider, gathering all the benefits of citizenship while not sharing all its burdens. Another inference drawn is that the pacifist himself constitutes a kind of internal threat to the over-all security of his state.

This "clean hands" argument is easily, and frequently, over-stated. It is important to note that, to the extent to which any moral stance will commend a certain set of actions or intentions deemed morally worthy, and condemn others as being reprehensible, the "clean hands" criticism can be so malleable as to apply to nearly any substantive doctrine. Every moral and political theory stipulates that one ought to do what it deems good or just and to avoid what it deems bad or unjust. So this popular just war criticism of pacifism is not strong. The very idea of a selfish pacifist simply does not ring true: many pacifists have, historically, paid a very high price for their pacifism during wartime (through severe ostracism and even jail time) and their pacifism seems less rooted in regard for inner moral purity than it is in regard for constructing a less violent and more humane world order. So, this argument against pacifism fails; but what of others?

Walzer, the just war theorist, contends that pacifism's idealism is excessively optimistic. In other words, pacifism lacks realism. More precisely, the nonviolent world imagined by the pacifist is not actually attainable, at least for the foreseeable future. Since "ought implies can", the set of "oughts" we are committed to must express a moral outlook on war less utopian in nature. While we are committed to morality in wartime, we are forced to concede that, sometimes in the real world, resorting to war can be morally justified.

Another objection to pacifism is that, by failing to resist international aggression with effective means, it ends up rewarding aggression and failing to protect people who need it. Pacifists reply to this argument by contending that we do not need to resort to war in order to protect people and punish aggression effectively. In the event of an armed invasion by an aggressor state, an organized and committed campaign of non-violent civil disobedience - perhaps combined with international diplomatic and economic sanctions - would be just as effective as war in expelling the aggressor, with much less destruction of lives and property. After all, the pacifist might say, no invader could possibly maintain its grip on the conquered nation in light of such systematic isolation, non-cooperation and non-violent resistance. How could it work the factories, harvest the fields, or run the stores, when everyone would be striking? How could it maintain the will to keep the country in the face of crippling economic sanctions and diplomatic censure from the international community? And so on.

Though one cannot exactly disprove this pacifist proposition - since it is a counter-factual thesis - there are powerful reasons to agree with John Rawls that such is "an unworldly view" to hold. For, as Walzer points out, the effectiveness of this campaign of civil disobedience relies on the scruples of the invading aggressor. But what if the aggressor is brutal, ruthless? What if, faced with civil disobedience, the invader "cleanses" the area of the native population, and then imports its own people from back home? What if, faced with economic sanctions and diplomatic censure from a neighbouring country, the invader decides to invade it, too? We have some indication from history, particularly that of Nazi Germany, that such pitiless tactics are effective at breaking the will of people to resist. The defence of our lives and rights may well, against such invaders, require the use of political violence. Under such conditions, Walzer says, adherence to pacifism would amount to "a disguised form of surrender."

Pacifists respond to this accusation of "unworldliness" by citing what they believe are real world examples of effective non-violent resistance to aggression. Examples mentioned include Mahatma Ghandi's campaign to drive the British Imperial regime out of India in the late 1940s and Martin Luther King Jr.'s civil rights crusade in the 1960s on behalf of African-Americans. Walzer replies curtly that there is no evidence that non-violent resistance has ever, of itself, succeeded. This may be rash on his part, though it is clear that Britain's own exhaustion after WWII, for example, had much to do with the evaporation of its Empire. Walzer's main counter-argument against these pacifist counter-examples is that they only underline his main point: that effective non-violent resistance depends upon the scruples of those it is aimed against. It was only because the British and the Americans had some scruples, and were moved by the determined idealism of the non-violent protesters, that they acquiesced to their demands. But aggressors will not always be so moved. A tyrant like Hitler, for example, might interpret non-violent resistance as weakness, deserving contemptuous crushing. "Non-violent defense", Walzer suggests, "is no defense at all against tyrants or conquerors ready to adopt such measures."

As sensible as Walzer's remarks might seem, they remain quite narrow, by no means constituting an all-things-considered refutation of pacifism. Generally, there are two kinds of modern secular pacifism to consider: 1) a more consequentialist form of pacifism (or CP), which maintains that the benefits accruing from war can never outweigh the costs of fighting it; and 2) a more deontological form of pacifism (or DP), which contends that the very activity of war is intrinsically wrong, since it violates foremost duties of justice, such as not killing human beings. Most common amongst contemporary secular pacifists, such as Robert Holmes, is a doctrine which attempts to combine both CP and DP. (I might add, parenthetically, that no discussion will be made here as to religious forms of pacifism. While they have been very influential historically, especially their Christian variants, as theoretical propositions I believe they rest on core premises which are too contentious and exclusionary. But the Christian pacifist literature is a very rich source of information for those interested.)

What arguments might a just war theorist employ to overcome CP and DP? A just war theorist might, for starters, focus on the relationship in CP between consequentialism and the denial of killing. Pacifism in either form places overriding value on respecting human life, notably through its injunction against killing. But this value seems to rest uneasily with consequentialism, for there is nothing inherent to consequentialism which bans killing as such. There is no absolute rule, or side-constraint, that one ought never to kill another person, or that nations ought never to deploy lethal armed force in war. With consequentialism, it's always a matter of considering the latest costs and benefits, of choosing the best option amongst feasible alternatives. Consequentialism therefore leaves conceptual space open to the claim that under these conditions, at this time and place, and given these alternatives, killing and/or war appears permissible. After all, what if killing x people (say, soldiers in an aggressive army) appears the best option if we are to save the lives of x + n people (say, fellow citizens who would perish under the brutal heel of an unchecked aggressor)? It is at least conceivable that a quick and decisive resort to war could prevent even greater killing and devastation in the future. So it seems problematic for the consequentialist pacifist, whose principles exhibit a profound abhorrence for killing people, to be willing in such a scenario to allow an even greater number of people to be killed by acquiescing to the violence of others less scrupulous. These are two telling points: CP does not, of itself, ground the categorical rejection of killing and war which is the essence of pacifism; and CP is open to counter-examples which question whether consequentialism would reject killing and war at all under certain conditions. Consequentialism might even, in a particular case, go so far as to recommend war under certain conditions.

Casting doubt on DP is a complicated procedure. Only a sketch of plausible just war theory arguments can here be offered. The first question to ask is: which foremost duty does DP understand being violated by warfare? If the DP response is the duty not to kill another human being, then contention can be made that this is by no means uncontroversial. Consider the most obvious counter-example: aggressor A attacks B for no defensible reason, posing a serious threat to B's life. Some would suggest, in good faith, that B is not duty-bound not to kill A if such seems necessary to stop A's aggression. Indeed, they would argue that B may kill A in legitimate self-defence. The DP pacifist, however, might reply that extending B moral permission to kill A, even in self-defence, violates the human rights of A. He might contend that just war theory merely compounds the wrongness of the situation by paradoxically permitting lethal force to stop lethal force.

One just war theory rejoinder to this DP contention is this: B does no wrong whatsoever - violates no human rights - by responding to A's aggression with lethal force if required. Why does B do nothing wrong? First, it is A who is responsible for forcing B to choose between her own life and rights and those of A. We can hardly blame B for choosing her own. For if she does not choose her own, she loses an enormous amount, perhaps everything. And it is patently unreasonable to expect creatures like us to suffer catastrophic loss by default. Consider also the issue of fairness: if B is not allowed to use lethal force, if necessary, against A in the event of A's aggression, then B loses everything while A loses nothing. Indeed, A gains whatever object he desired in violating or killing B. Such would seem an unfair reward of awful behaviour. Finally, B's having rights at all provides her with an implicit entitlement to use those means necessary to secure her rights, including the use of force in the face of a serious physical threat. These powerful considerations of responsibility, reasonableness, fairness and implicit entitlement come together in support of the just war claims that: B may respond with needed lethal force to A's initial aggression; B does no wrong in doing so; it would be wrong to prohibit B's doing so; and that A bears all of the blame for the situation.

DP pacifists are not, at this point, out of options. Holmes, for example, suggests that the foremost duty of justice violated by war is not the duty not to kill aggressors, but rather the duty not to kill innocent, non-aggressive human beings. To be innocent here means to have done nothing which would justify being harmed or killed; in particular, it means not constituting a serious threat to the lives and rights of other people. It is this sense of innocence that just war theory invokes when it claims that civilians should not be directly attacked during wartime. Even if civilians support the war effort politically, or even in terms of their personal attitudes towards the war, they clearly do not pose serious threats to others. Only armed forces, and the political-industrial-technological complexes which guide them, constitute serious threats against which threatened communities may respond in kind. Civilian populations, just war theory surmises, are morally off-limits as targets. Holmes contends that this just war rule of non-combatant immunity can never be satisfied. For all possible wars in this world - given the nature of military technology and tactics, the heat of battle, and the limits of human knowledge and self-discipline - involve the killing of innocents, thus defined. We know this to be true from history and have no good reason for expecting otherwise in the future. But the killing of innocents, Holmes says, is always unjust. So no war can ever be fought justly, regardless of the nature of the goal sought after, such as national defence from an aggressor's attack. The very activities needed to fight wars are intrinsically corrupt, and cannot be redeemed by the putative justice of the ends they are aimed at. How is a just war theorist to respond to this DP challenge?

Some respond by casting doubt on the concept of innocence in wartime. But a just war theorist subscribing to the rule of non-combatant immunity will neither want, nor logically be at liberty, to argue in this fashion. It is hard to see, for example, how infants could be anything other than innocent during a war, and as such entitled not to be made the object of direct and intentional attack. It is only those who, in Walzer's phrase, are "involved in harming us" - i.e. those who pose serious threats to our lives and rights - that we can justly target in a direct and intentional fashion during wartime.

The more appropriate just war response invokes, alongside Walzer, the doctrine of double effect (or DDE). The DDE, invented by Aquinas, is a complex idea. In spite of its apparent technicality, though, the DDE is closely related to our ordinary ways of thinking about moral life. The DDE assumes the following scenario: agent X is considering performing an action T, which X foresees will produce both good/moral/just effects J and bad/immoral/unjust effects U. The DDE permits X to perform T only if: 1) T is otherwise permissible; 2) X only intends J and not U; 3) U is not a means to J; and 4) the goodness of J is worth, or is proportionately greater than, the badness of U. Assume now that X is a country and T is war. The government of X, contemplating war in response to an attack by aggressor country Y, foresees that, should it embark on war to defend itself, civilian casualties will result, probably in both X and Y. The DDE stipulates that X may launch into this defensive (and thus otherwise permissible) war only if: 1) X does not intend the resulting civilian casualties but rather aims only at defending itself and its people; 2) such casualties are not themselves the means whereby X's end is achieved; and 3) the importance of X's defending itself and its people from Y's aggression is proportionately greater than the badness of the resulting civilian casualties. The DDE, in making these claims, refers to common shared principles regarding the moral importance of intent, of appealing to better expected consequences, and insisting that bad not be done so that good may follow from it.

Just war theorists claim that civilians are not entitled to absolute immunity from attack during wartime. Civilians are owed neither more nor less than what Walzer calls "due care" from the belligerent governments that they not be made casualties of the war action in question. "Due care" involves fighting only in certain ways, applying limited force to specific targets. But does this just war claim simply beg the question against the latest DP principle? DPs insist on absolute immunity for civilians, which in our world would result in banning warfare, whereas just war theorists, acknowledging the threat, seem to dodge it by re-defining the immunity to which civilians are entitled, demoting it to mere "due care." Despite appearances, it is not question-begging but principled disagreement which roots the difference. Just war theorists will argue that civilians cannot be entitled to absolute immunity because that would outlaw all warfare. But outlawing all warfare would ignore both the responsibility for interstate aggression and the implicit entitlement of a state to use necessary means (including armed force) to secure the lives and rights of its citizens from serious and standard threats to them. In the real world, it is neither reasonable nor fair to require a political community not to avail itself of the most effective means available for resisting an aggressive invasion which threatens the lives and rights of its citizens. It is simply not reasonable to require a state to stand down while the aggression of another state wreaks havoc - murder and mayhem - upon its people.

This is not a complete defeat for DP, merely a suggestion of how such defeat might be sought. In my view, DP constitutes the most formidable moral challenge to just war theory (whereas prescriptive realism constitutes the most formidable prudential challenge to just war theory). Suffice it for our purposes to say that the DDE is the just war principle most frequently employed to defeat the DP pacifist's assertion that it is always wrong to kill innocent human beings. Just war theorists prefer to substitute, for this DP claim, the following proposition: what is always wrong, both in peace and war, is to kill innocent human beings intentionally and deliberately. Unintended, collateral civilian casualties can be excused during the prosecution of an otherwise just war, wherein the end is the repulsion of aggression and the means are aimed at legitimate military targets.


This entry provides a sample of the rich and controversial argumentation surrounding philosophical discourse on war. This discourse is dominated by three major traditions of thought: just war theory; realism; and pacifism. The interaction between these three traditions structures the contemporary discussion of wartime issues, at the same time as it fuels fascinating debate about them. While just war theory occupies an especially large and influential space within the discourse, its realist and pacifist alternatives endure as provocative challenges to the philosophical mainstream which it represents.


All the works cited in this entry, plus relevant other works, are listed below. It may be helpful to first locate and emphasize some of the major and most influential sources.

Just war theory is the dominant tradition on the ethics of war and peace. For scholarship on the history and development of just war theory, consult the works of James T. Johnson. Hugo Grotius is often cited as the most formidable classical just war theorist. A translation of his works can be found in J. Scott's edition of Classics of International Law. The major contemporary statement of just war theory remains Michael Walzer's Just and Unjust Wars. For other contemporary statements, see the works of R. Regan; W.V. O'Brien; J.B. Elshtain; and B. Orend. Works critical of just war theory can be found in the pacifist and realist tracts below.

Other important articles on particular aspects of just war theory include: on jus ad bellum, D. Luban, "Just War and Human Rights"; on jus in bello, T. Nagel's "War and Massacre" and R. Fullinwinder's "War and Innocence"; and on jus post bellum, Kant's "Perpetual Peace", in his Political Writings and B. Orend's "Terminating War and Establishing Global Governance".

Hans Morgenthau's Politics Among Nations remains an often-cited defense of realism, as does G. Kennan's Realities of American Foreign Policy. Henry Kissinger's Diplomacy provides the same outlook in perhaps more accessible form. Two of the most focused and effective criticisms of the realist approach to war occur at: Chapter 1 of Walzer's Just and Unjust Wars; and Chapters 1-3 of R. Holmes' On War and Morality.

The three best contemporary, secular works defending pacifism are: R. Holmes, On War and Morality; J. Teichman, Pacifism and the Just War; and R. Norman, Ethics, Killing and War. Two renowned critical essays on pacifism, both reprinted in R. Wasserstrom, ed. War and Morality are G.E.M. Anscombe's "War and Murder" and Jan Narveson's "Pacifism: A Philosophical Analysis".

One prominent writer on the philosophy of war who resists easy classifcation into any of these categories is Carl von Clausewitz. Clausewitz wrote On War, one of the most influential general sources, cited by soldiers and statesmen as often as by philosophers or international lawyers. M. Gelven's War and Existence is an interesting contemporary piece on the meaning and experience of war, with a Clausewitzian flavor to it.

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cosmopolitanism | justice: international | Kant, Immanuel: social and political philosophy | nationalism | responsibility: collective | rights: human | secession | self-determination, collective | sovereignty | world government

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Brian Orend

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