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There is wide agreement that a term is vague to the extent that it has borderline cases. This makes the notion of a borderline case crucial in accounts of vagueness. I shall concentrate on an historical characterization of borderline cases that most commentators would accept. Vagueness will then be contrasted with ambiguity and generality. This will clarify the nature of the philosophical challenge posed by vagueness. I will then discuss some rival theories of vagueness with a special emphasis on supervaluationism. I will conclude with the issue of whether all vagueness is linguistic.

1. Inquiry Resistance

If you cut one head off of a two headed man, have you decapitated him? What is the maximum height of a short man? When does a fertilized egg develop into a person?

These questions are impossible to answer because they involve absolute borderline cases. In the vast majority of cases, the unknowability of a borderline statement is only relative to a given means of settling the issue (Sorensen 2001a, chapter 1). For instance, a boy may count as a borderline case of ‘obese’ because people cannot tell whether he is obese just by looking at him. A curious mother could try to settle the matter by calculating her boy's body mass index. The formula is to divide his weight (in kilograms) by the square of his height (in meters). If the value exceeds 30, this test counts him as obese. The calculation will itself leave some borderline cases. The mother could then use a weight-for-height chart. These charts are not entirely decisive because they do not reflect the ratio of fat to muscle, whether the child has large bones, and so on. The boy will only count as an absolute borderline case of ‘obese’ if no possible method of inquiry could settle whether he is obese. When we reach this stage, we start to suspect that our uncertainty is due to the concept of obesity rather than to our limited means of testing for obesity.

Absolute borderline cases are targeted by Charles Sander Peirce's entry for ‘vague’ in the 1902 Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology:

A proposition is vague when there are possible states of things concerning which it is intrinsically uncertain whether, had they been contemplated by the speaker, he would have regarded them as excluded or allowed by the proposition. By intrinsically uncertain we mean not uncertain in consequence of any ignorance of the interpreter, but because the speaker's habits of language were indeterminate. (Peirce 1902, 748)

In the case of relative borderline cases, the question is clear but our means for answering it are incomplete. In the case of absolute borderline cases, there is incompleteness in the question itself.

When a term is applied to one of its absolute borderline cases the result is a statement that resists all attempts to settle whether it is true or false. No amount of conceptual analysis or empirical inquiry can settle whether removing one head from a two headed man counts as decapitating him. We could give the appearance of settling the matter by stipulating that ‘decapitate’ means ‘remove a head’ (as opposed to ‘make headless’ or ‘remove the head’ or ‘remove the most important head’). But that would amount to changing the topic to an issue that merely sounds the same as decapitation.

Vagueness is standardly defined as the possession of borderline cases. For example, ‘tall’ is vague because a man who is 1.8 meters in height is neither clearly tall nor clearly non-tall. No amount of conceptual analysis or empirical investigation can settle whether a 1.8 meter man is tall. Borderline cases are inquiry resistant. Indeed, the inquiry resistance typically recurses. For in addition to the unclarity of the borderline case, there is normally unclarity as to where the unclarity begins. In other words ‘borderline case’ has borderline cases. This higher order vagueness shows that ‘vague’ is vague.

2. Comparison with Ambiguity and Generality

‘Tall’ is relative. A 1.8 meter pygmy is tall for a pygmy but a 1.8 meter Masai is not tall for a Masai. Although relativization disambiguates, it does not eliminate borderline cases. There are shorter pygmies who are borderline tall for a pygmy and taller Masai who are borderline tall for a Masai. The direct bearers of vagueness are a word's full disambiguations such as ‘tall for an eighteenth century French man’. Words are only vague indirectly, by virtue of having a sense that is vague. In contrast, an ambiguous word has its ambiguity directly — simply in virtue of having multiple meanings.

This contrast between vagueness and ambiguity is obscured by the fact that most words are both vague and ambiguous. ‘Child’ is ambiguous between ‘offspring’ and ‘immature offspring’. The latter reading of ‘child’ is vague because there are borderline cases of immature offspring. The contrast is further complicated by the fact that most words are also general. For instance, ‘child’ covers both boys and girls.

Mathematical terms such as ‘prime number’ show that a term can be general without being vague. A term can also be vague without being general. Borderline cases of analytically empty predicates illustrate this possibility.

Generality is obviously useful. Often, lessons about a particular F can be projected to other Fs in virtue of their common F-ness. When a girl learns that her cat has a nictating membrane that protects its eyes, she rightly expects her neighbor's cat also has a nictating membrane. Generality saves labor. When the girl says that she wants a toy rather than clothes, she narrows the range of acceptable gifts without going through the trouble of specifying a particular gift. The girl also balances values: a gift should be intrinsically desired and yet also be a surprise. If uncertain about which channel is the weather channel, she can hedge by describing the channel as ‘forty-something’. There is an inverse relationship between the contentfulness of a proposition and its probability: the more specific a claim, the less likely it is to be true. By gauging generality, we can make sensible trade-offs between truth and detail.

‘Vague’ has a sense which is synonymous with abnormal generality. This precipitates many equivocal explanations of vagueness. For instance, many commentators say that vagueness exists because broad categories ease the task of classification. If I can describe your sweater as red, then I do not need to figure out whether it is scarlet. This freedom to use wide intervals obviously helps us to learn, teach, communicate, and remember. But so what? The problem is to explain the existence of borderline cases. Are they present because vagueness serves a function? Or are borderline cases side-effects of ordinary conversation — like echoes?

Unless special preventive measures are taken the attempt to classify objects will unintentionally leave some unanswerable questions in its wake. Predicates are like multi-stage rockets. Rockets which shed components are not designed to spread space age thingamajigs to inaccessible places. But if no precautions are taken, rockets will sow mysteries. At the extreme end of this accidental continuum lie the analogues of borderline cases.

Every natural language is both vague and ambiguous. However, both features seem eliminable. Indeed, both are eliminated in miniature languages such as checkers notation, computer programming languages, and mathematical descriptions. Moreover, it seems that both vagueness and ambiguity ought to be minimized. ‘Vague’ and ‘ambiguous’ are pejorative terms. And they deserve their bad reputations. Think of all the automotive misery that has been prefaced by

Driver: Do I turn left?
Passenger: Right.

English can be lethal. Philosophers have long motivated appeals for an ideal language by pointing out how ambiguity creates the menace of equivocation:

No child should work.
Every person is a child of someone.
Therefore, no one should work.

Happily, we know how to criticize and correct all equivocations. Indeed, every natural language is self-disambiguating in the sense that each has all the resources needed to uniquely specify any reading one desires. Ambiguity is often the cause but rarely the object of philosophical rumination.

3. The Philosophical Challenge Posed by Vagueness

Vagueness, in contrast, precipitates a profound problem: the sorites paradox. For instance,

Base step: A one day year old human being is a child.

Induction step: If an n day old human being is a child, then that human being is also a child when it is n + 1 days old.

Conclusion: Therefore, a 36,500 day old human being is a child.

The conclusion is false because a 100 year old man is clearly a non-child. Since the base step of the argument is also plainly true and the argument is valid by mathematical induction, we seem to have no choice but to reject the second premise.

George Boolos (1991) observes that we have an autonomous case against the induction step. In addition to implying plausible conditionals such as ‘If a 1 day old human being is a child, then that human being is also a child when it is 2 days old’, the induction step also implies ludicrous conditionals such as ‘If a 1 day old human being is a child, then that human being is also a child when it is 36,500 days old’. For some reason, we tend to overlook these easy counterexamples to the induction step.

With Boolos' helping hand, we have driven two stakes into the heart of the sorities paradox. Yet the paradox seems far from dead. The negation of the second premise classically implies a sharp threshold for childhood. For it implies the existential generalization that there is a number n such that an n day old human being is a child but is no longer a child n + 1 days.

Epistemicists accept this astonishing consequence. They think vagueness is a form of ignorance. Timothy Williamson (1994) traces the ignorance of the threshold for childhood to "margin for error" principles. If one knows that an n day old human being is a child, then that human being must also be a child when n + 1 days old. Otherwise, one is right by luck.

Most philosophers believe that epistemicism is tantamount to the acceptance of a linguistic miracle. They boggle at the possibility that our rough and ready terms such as ‘child’ could so sensitively classify objects. Epistemicists counter that this bafflement rests on an over-estimate of the role of stipulation in meaning. They say much meaning is acquired passively by default rather than actively by decision.

Still, most philosophers blame logic rather than our beliefs about language. Surprisingly, H. G. Wells was amongst the first to suggest that we must moderate the application of logic:

Every species is vague, every term goes cloudy at its edges, and so in my way of thinking, relentless logic is only another name for stupidity — for a sort of intellectual pigheadedness. If you push a philosophical or metaphysical enquiry through a series of valid syllogisms — never committing any generally recognized fallacy — you nevertheless leave behind you at each step a certain rubbing and marginal loss of objective truth and you get deflections that are difficult to trace, at each phase in the process. Every species waggles about in its definition, every tool is a little loose in its handle, every scale has its individual. — First and Last Things (1908)

Many more believe that problem is with logic itself rather than the manner in which it is applied. They favor solving the sorites paradox by replacing standard logic with an earthier deviant logic.

There is a desperately wide range of opinions as to how the revision of logic should be executed. Every form of deviant logic has been applied in the hope of resolving the sorites paradox.

An early favorite was many-valued logic. On this approach, borderline statements are assigned truth-values that lie between full truth and full falsehood. New rules are introduced to calculate the truth value of compound statements that contain statements with intermediate truth-values. For instance, the revised rule for conjunctions is to assign the conjunction the same truth-value as the conjunct with the lowest truth-value.

Most theorems of standard logic break down when intermediate truth-values are involved. (An irregular minority, such as ‘If P, then P’, survive.) Even the classical contradiction ‘Bozo is bald and it is not the case that he is bald’ receives a truth-value of .5 when ‘Bozo is bald’ has a truth-value of .5. Many-valued logicians note that the error they are imputing to classical logic is often so small that classical logic can still be fruitfully applied. But they insist that the sorites paradox illustrates how tiny errors can accumulate into a big error.

Critics of the many-valued approach complain that it botches phenomena such as hedging. If I regard you as a borderline case of ‘tall man’, I cannot sincerely assert that you are tall and I cannot sincerely assert that you are of average height. But I can assert the hedged claim ‘You are tall or of average height’. The many-valued rule for disjunction is to assign the whole statement the truth-value of its highest disjunct. Normally, the added disjunct in a hedged claim is not more plausible than the other disjuncts. Thus it cannot increase the degree of truth. Disappointingly, the proponent of many-valued logic cannot trace the increase of assertibility to an increase the degree of truth.

Epistemicists explain the rise in assertibility by the increasing probability of truth. Since the addition of disjuncts can raise probability indefinitely, the epistemicists correctly predict that we can hedge our way to full assertibility. However, epistemicists does not have a monopoly on this prediction.

4. Supervaluationism

According to supervaluationists, borderline statements lack a truth-value. This neatly explains why it is universally impossible to know the truth-value of a borderline statement. Supervaluationism offers details about the nature of absolute borderline cases. Simple sentences about borderline cases lack a truth-value. Compounds of these statements can have a truth-value if they come out true regardless of how the statement is precisified. For instance, ‘Either Mr. Stoop is tall or it is not the case that Mr. Stoop is tall’ is true because it comes out true under all ways of sharpening ‘tall’. Thus the method of supervaluations allows one to retain all the theorems of standard logic while admitting "truth-value gaps".

One may wonder whether this striking result is a genuine convergence with standard logic. Is the supervaluationist characterizing vague statements as propositions? Or is he merely pointing out that certain non-propositions have a structure isomorphic to logical theorems? (Some electrical circuits are isomorphic to tautologies but this does make the circuits tautologies.) Kit Fine (1975, 282), and especially David Lewis, characterize vagueness as hyper-ambiguity. Instead of there being one vague concept, there are many precise concepts that closely resemble each other. ‘Child’ can mean a human being at most one day old or mean a human being at most two days old or mean a human being at most three days old . . . Thus the logic of vagueness is a logic for equivocators. Lewis' idea is that ambiguous statements are true when they come out true under all disambiguations. But logicians normally require that a statement be disambiguated before logic is applied. The laws of logic are about propositions. The mere fact that an ambiguous statement comes out true under all its disambiguations does not show that the statement itself is true. Sentences which are actually disambiguated may have truth-values. But the best that can be said of those that merely could be disambiguated is that they would have had a truth-value had they been disambiguated (Tye 1989).

Supervaluationism will converge with classical logic only if each word of the supervaluated sentence is uniformly interpreted. For instance, ‘Either a carbon copy of Teddy Roosevelt's signature is an autograph or it is not the case that a carbon copy of Teddy Roosevelt's signature is an autograph’ comes out true only if ‘autograph’ is interpreted the same way in both disjuncts. Vague sentences resist mixed interpretations. However, mixed interpretations are permissible for ambiguous sentences. As Lewis himself notes in a criticism of relevance logic, ‘Scrooge walked along the bank on his way to the bank’ can receive a mixed disambiguation. When exterminators offer ‘non-toxic ant poison’, we charitably relativize: the substance is safe for human beings but deadly for ants.

Even if one agrees that supervaluationism converges with classical logic about theoremhood, they clearly differ in other respects. Supervaluationism requires rejection of inference rules such as contraposition, conditional proof and reductio ad absurdum (Williamson 1994, 151-152). In the eyes of the supervaluationist, a demonstration that a statement is not true does not guarantee that the statement is false.

The supervaluationist is also under pressure to reject semantic principles which are intimately associated with the application of logical laws. According to Alfred Tarski's Convention T, a statement ‘S’ is true if and only if S. In other words, truth is disquotational. Supervaluationists say that being supertrue (being true under all precisifications) suffices for being true. But given Convention T, supertruth would then be disquotational. Since the supervaluationists accept the principle of excluded middle, they would be forced to say ‘P’ is supertrue or ‘Not P’ is supertrue (even if ‘P’ applies a predicate to a borderline case). This would imply that either ‘P’ is true or ‘Not P’ is true. (Williamson 1994, 162-163) And that would be a fatal loss of truth-value gaps for supervaluationism.

There is a final concern about the "ontological honesty" of the supervaluationist's existential quantifier. As part of his solution to the sorites paradox, the supervaluationist will assert ‘There is a human being who was a child when n days old but not when n + 1 days old’. For this statement comes out true under all admissible precisifications of ‘child’. However, when pressed the supervaluationist will add an unofficial clarification: "Oh, of course I do not mean that there really is a sharp threshold for childhood."

After the clarification, some wonder how supervaluationism differs from drastic metaphysical skepticism. In his nihilist days, Peter Unger (1979) admitted that it is useful to talk as if there are children. But he insisted that strictly speaking, vague terms such as ‘child’ cannot apply to anything. Unger was free to use supervaluationism as a theory to explain our ordinary discourse about children. (Unger instead used other resources to explain how we fruitfully apply empty predicates.) But once the dust had cleared and the precise rubble came into focus, Unger had to conclude that there are no children.

Officially, the supervaluationist rejects the induction step of the sorites argument. Unofficially, he seems to instead reject the base step of the sorites argument.

5. Is All Vagueness Linguistic?

Supervaluationism encourages the view that all vagueness is a matter of linguistic indecision: the reason why there are borderline cases is that we have not bothered to make up our minds. Many supervaluationists maintain that this indecision is functional. Instead of committing ourselves prematurely, we can fill in meanings as we go along in light of new information and interests. This conjecture is promising for the highly stipulative enterprise of promulgating and enforcing laws (Endicott 2000). Judges frequently seem to exercise and control discretion by means of vague language. However, there is the suspicion that the real work is being done by the generality of the legal propositions rather than their vagueness (Sorensen 2001b).

Objects themselves do not seem to be the sort of thing that can be general, ambiguous, or vague. Thus the Romantics appear to be committing a category mistake when they characterize sea foam as vague. Indeed, there used to be a consensus that believers in vague objects were committing the fallacy of verbalism — inferring that an object has the property that its representation has.

A minority of philosophers now believe that there are vague objects (clouds, the sky, perhaps even entities of quantum physics). There is a precedent for this revival. Peter van Inwagen recalls that thirty years ago, there was a consensus that all necessity is linguistic. Most philosophers now take the possibility of essential properties seriously.

Indeed, some allege that supervaluationists inadvertently rely on metaphysical vagueness to characterize linguistic vagueness (Merricks 2001). If ‘Bozo is bald’ lacks a truth-value because there is no fact to make the statement true, then the shortage appears to be ontological rather than linguistic.

The view that vagueness is always linguistic has been attacked from other directions. Mental imagery seems vague. When rising suddenly after a prolonged crouch, I "see stars before my eyes". I can tell there are more than ten of these hallucinated lights but I cannot tell how many. Is this indeterminacy in thought to be reduced to indeterminacy in language? Why not vice versa? Language is an outgrowth of human psychology. Thus it seems natural to view language as merely an accessible intermediate bearer of vagueness.


Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

ambiguity | Sorites paradox

Copyright © 2002
Roy Sorensen

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