This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

version history

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

This document uses XHTML/Unicode to format the display. If you think special symbols are not displaying correctly, see our guide Displaying Special Characters.
last substantive content change

The Correspondence Theory of Truth

Narrowly speaking, the correspondence theory of truth is the view that truth is correspondence to a fact -- a view that was advocated by Russell and Moore early in the 20th century. But the label is usually applied much more broadly to any view explicitly embracing the idea that truth consists in a relation to reality, i.e., that truth is a relational property involving a characteristic relation (to be specified) to some portion of reality (to be specified). During the last 2300 years this basic idea has been expressed in many ways, resulting in a rather extended family of views, theories, and theory sketches. The members of the family employ various concepts for the relevant relation (correspondence, conformity, congruence, agreement, accordance, copying, picturing, signification, representation, reference, satisfaction) and/or various concepts for the relevant portion of reality (facts, states of affairs, situations, events, objects, sequences of objects, sets, properties, tropes). The resulting multiplicity of versions and reformulations of the theory is due to a blend of substantive and terminological differences.

The correspondence theory of truth is often associated with metaphysical realism. Its traditional competitors, coherentist, pragmatist, and verificationist theories of truth, are often associated with idealism, anti-realism, or relativism. In recent years, the traditional competitors have been virtually replaced (at least from publication-space) by deflationary theories of truth -- and to a lesser extent by the identity theory -- which now lead the attack against correspondence theories.

1. History of the Correspondence Theory

The correspondence theory is often traced back to Aristotle's well-known definition of truth (Metaphysics 1011b25): “To say of what is that it is not, or of what is not that it is, is false, while to say of what is that it is, or of what is not that it is not, is true” -- but virtually identical formulations can be found in Plato (Cratylus 385b2, Sophist 263b). It is noteworthy that this definition does not highlight the basic correspondence intuition. Although it does invoke a relation (saying something of something) to reality (what is), the relation is not made very explicit, and there is no specification of what on the part of reality is responsible for the truth of a saying. The definition offers a muted, relatively minimal version of a correspondence theory. (For this reason it has also been interpreted as an impure precursor of deflationary theories of truth.) Aristotle sounds much more like a genuine correspondence theorist in the Categories (12b5, 14b15), where he talks of “underlying things” that make statements true and implies that these “things” (pragmata) are logically structured situations or facts (viz., his sitting, his not sitting). Most influential is his claim in De Interpretatione (16a3) that thoughts are “likenessess” (homoiosis) of things. Although he nowhere defines truth in terms of a thought's likeness to a thing or fact, it is clear that such a definition would fit well into his overall philosophy of mind.

In medieval authors we find a division between “metaphysical” and “semantic” versions of the correspondence theory. The former are indebted to the truth-as-likeness theme suggested by Aristotle's overall views, the latter are modeled on Aristotle's definition.

The best known is the metaphysical version presented by Thomas Aquinas: “Veritas est adaequatio rei et intellectus” -- truth is the equation of thing and intellect -- which he restates as: “A judgment is said to be true when it conforms to the external reality” (De Veritate Q.1, A.1&3; cf. Summa Theologiae Q.16). Aquinas credits the Neoplatonist Isaac Israeli with this definition. But there is no such definition in Isaac. It originated with the Arabic philosophers Avicenna and Averroes (Tahafut, 103, 302), and was introduced to the scholastics by William of Auxerre (cf. Boehner 1958; Wolenski 1994). The formula “equation of thing and intellect” is intended to leave room for the idea that “true” can be applied not only to thoughts and judgments but also to things (e.g. a true friend). Aquinas explains that a thought is said to be true because it conforms to reality, whereas a thing is said to be true because it conforms to a thought (a friend is true insofar as, and because, he conforms to our, or God's, conception of what a friend ought to be). This notion of thing-truth, which played an important role in ancient and medieval thinking, is disregarded by modern and analytic philosophers but survives to some extent in existentialist and continental philosophy.

Medieval authors who prefer a semantic version of the correspondence theory often use a peculiarly truncated formula to render Aristotle's definition: A (mental) sentence is true iff, as it signifies, so it is (sicut significat, ita est). This emphasizes the semantic relation of signification while remaining maximally elusive about what it is that is signified by a true sentence. Foreshadowing a favorite approach of the 20th century, medieval semanticists like Ockham (Summa Logicae II) and Buridan (Sophismata) give exhaustive lists of different truth-conditional clauses for sentences of different grammatical categories; they systematically refrain from associating true sentences in general with a single ontological category.

Authors of the modern period generally convey the impression that the correspondence theory of truth is far too obvious to merit much, or any, discussion. Brief statements of some version or other can be found in almost all major writers; see e.g. Descartes 1639, ATII 597; Spinoza, Ethics, axiom vi; Locke, Essay, IV.v.i; Leibniz, New Essays, IV.v.ii; Hume, Treatise, 3.1.1; and Kant 1787, B82 -- Berkeley, who does not seem to offer any account of truth, is a potentially significant exception. Due to the influence of Thomism, metaphysical versions of the theory are more popular with the moderns than semantic versions. But since the moderns generally subscribe to a representational theory of the mind (the theory of ideas), they would seem to be committed to spelling out concepts like correspondence or conformity in terms of a psycho-semantic representation relation holding between ideas, or sequences of ideas, and appropriate portions of reality.

The now classical formulation of the theory appears in Moore (1910-11, chap. 15) and Russell: “Thus a belief is true when there is a corresponding fact, and is false when there is no corresponding fact” (1912, 129; cf. also his 1906). The self-conscious emphasis on facts as the corresponding portions of reality -- and a more serious concern with falsehood -- distinguishes this version from its precursors. Russell and Moore's forceful advocacy of truth as correspondence to fact was, at that time, an integral part of their defense of metaphysical realism. Their formulation is indebted to one of their idealist opponents, H. H. Joachim (1906), an early advocate of the coherence theory, who had set up a slightly more involved correspondence-to-fact account of truth as the main target of his attack on realism. Later, Wittgenstein (1921) and Russell (1918) developed “logical atomism”, which introduces an important modification of the correspondence approach. Further modification, and a return to more overtly semantic versions of the approach, was influenced by Tarski's (1935) technical work on truth (cf. Field 1972, Popper 1972).

2. Truth and Truthbearers

Correspondence theories of truth have been given for beliefs, thoughts, ideas, judgments, statements, assertions, utterances, sentences, and propositions. It has become customary to talk of “truthbearers” whenever one wants to stay neutral between these choices. Two points should be kept in mind: (i) The term is somewhat misleading; it is intended to refer to bearers of truth or falsehood (or alternatively, to things of which it makes sense to ask whether they are true or false, thus allowing for the possibility that some of them might be neither); (ii) One distinguishes between secondary and primary truthbearers. Secondary truthbearers are those whose truth-values (truth or falsehood) are derived from the truth-values of primary truthbearers, whose truth-values are not derived from any other truthbearers. It is often unproblematic to advocate one theory of truth for bearers of one type and another theory for bearers of a different type (e.g., an identity theory of truth for propositions could be a component of a correspondence theory of truth for sentences): different theories applied to bearers of different types do not automatically compete. The standard segregation of truth theories into competing camps proceeds under the assumption, or pretense, that they are intended for primary truthbearers. Confusingly, there is little agreement as to which entities are properly taken to be primary truthbearers. Nowadays, the main contenders are public language sentences, sentences of the language of thought (mental representations), and propositions.

3. Simple Versions of the Correspondence Theory

Two simple forms of correspondence definitions of truth should be distinguished (“x” refers to whatever truthbearers might be taken as primary; the notion of correspondence might be replaced by various related notions):
(1) x is true iff x corresponds to some fact;
x is false iff x does not correspond to any fact;
(2) x is true iff x corresponds to some state of affairs that obtains;
x is false iff x corresponds to some state of affairs that does not obtain.

Both forms invoke portions of reality -- facts/states of affairs -- that are denoted by that-clauses or by sentential gerundives, viz., the fact/state of affairs that snow is white, or the fact/state of affairs of snow's being white. (2) is committed to the existence of non-obtaining entities of this sort; (1) is not, for to say that a fact does not obtain means, at best, that there is no such fact. It should be noted that this terminology is not standardized: some authors use “state of affairs” much like “fact” is used here (e.g. Armstrong 1997). The question whether non-obtaining entities of the relevant sort are to be accepted is the substantive issue behind such terminological variations. The difference between (2) and (1) is akin to the difference between Platonism about properties (embraces uninstantiated properties) and Aristotelianism (rejects uninstantiated properties).

Advocates of (2) typically hold that facts are states of affairs that obtain, i.e., they hold that their account of truth is in effect an analysis of (1)'s account of truth. So disagreement turns largely on the treatment of falsehood, which (1) simply identifies with the absence of truth.

The following points can be made for preferring (2) over (1): (a) Form (2) does not imply that things outside the category of truthbearers are false just because they don't correspond to facts. (b) Form (2) allows for items within the category of truthbearers that are neither true nor false, i.e., it allows for the failure of bivalence. (c) If the primary truthbearers are sentences or mental states, then states of affairs can be their meanings or contents, and the correspondence relation in (2) can be understood, accordingly, as the relation of representation, signification, meaning, or having-as-content. Facts, on the other hand, cannot be identified with the meanings or contents of sentences or mental states, on pain of the absurd consequence that false sentences and beliefs have no meaning or content. (d) Take a truth of the form ‘p or q’, where ‘p’ is true and ‘q’ false. What are the constituents of the corresponding fact? Since ‘q’ is false, they cannot both be facts. (2) allows that the corresponding fact is a disjunctive state of affairs composed of a state of affairs that obtains and a state of affairs that does not obtain.

The main point in favor of (1) over (2) is that (1) is not committed to counting non-obtaining states of affairs, like the state of affairs that snow is green, as constituents of reality.

Both forms (1) and (2) should be distinguished from

(3) x is true iff x corresponds to some fact that exists;
x is false iff x corresponds to some fact that does not exist,

which is a confused version of (1), or a confused version of (2), or, if unconfused, implies commitment to Meinongianism, i.e., the thesis that there are things that do not exist. The lure of (3) stems from the desire to give a good account of falsehood while avoiding commitment to non-obtaining states of affairs. Moore sometimes succumbs to (3)'s temptations (1910-11, 269). It can also be found in Wittgenstein (1921, 4.25), who uses “Sachverhalt” to refer to (atomic) facts. The problem of falsehood -- How can we think what is not the case? -- which is related to the problem of nonexistence -- How can we think of what does not exist? -- was brought out nicely in Plato's Theaetetus (188c-89).

4. Arguments for the Correspondence Theory

The main positive argument given by advocates of the correspondence theory of truth is its obviousness. Descartes: “I have never had any doubts about truth, because it seems a notion so transcendentally clear that nobody can be ignorant of it…the word ‘truth’, in the strict sense, denotes the conformity of thought with its object” (1639, AT II 597); Kant: “The nominal definition of truth, that it is the agreement of [a cognition] with its object, is assumed as granted” (1787, B82); Oxford English Dictionary: “Truth, n. Conformity with fact; agreement with reality”. Since the (relatively recent) arrival of apparently competing theories, correspondence theorists have added negative arguments to their arsenal, defending their view against objections and attacking (sometimes ridiculing) competing views.

5. Objections to the Correspondence Theory

Objection 1: Definitions like (1) or (2) are too broad; although they apply to truths from some domains of discourse, e.g., the domain of science, they fail for others, e.g., the domain of morality: there are no moral facts.

The objection recognizes moral truths, but rejects the idea that reality contains moral facts. Logic provides another example of a domain that has been “flagged” in this way: the logical positivists recognized logical truths but rejected logical facts.

There are four possible responses to objections of this sort: (a) Error theory, which says that all claims from the flagged domain are false; (b) Noncognitivism, which says that, despite appearances to the contrary, claims from the flagged domain are not truth-evaluable to begin with, they are commands or emotions disguised as truthbearers; (c) Reductionism, which says that truths from the flagged domain correspond to facts of a different domain regarded as unproblematic, e.g., moral truths correspond to social-behavioral facts, logical truths correspond to facts about linguistic conventions; (d) Standing firm, i.e., embracing facts of the flagged domain. The last option can be supported by the following observation. The objection in effect maintains that there are different brands of truth (not just different brands of truths) for the different domains. This makes it hard to explain why there are many obviously valid arguments combining premises from flagged and unflagged domains.

Objection 2: Correspondence theories are too obvious; they are trivial, vacuous, engaging in mere platitudes. Locutions from the “corresponds to the facts”-family are used regularly in everyday language as idiomatic substitutes for “true”. Such common turns of phrase should not be taken to indicate commitment to a correspondence theory in any serious sense. Definitions like (1) or (2) merely condense some trivial idioms into handy formulas; they don't deserve the grand label “theory”: there is no theoretical weight behind them (cf. Woozley 1949, chap. 6; Blackburn 1984, chap. 7.1).

In response, one could point out: (a) Definitions like (1) or (2) are “mini-theories” -- mini-theories are quite common in philosophy, and it is not obvious that they are vacuous merely because they are modeled on common usage; (b) There are correspondence theories that go beyond these definitions; (c) The complaint implies that definitions like (1) or (2) are generally accepted and are, moreover, so shallow that they are compatible with any deeper theory of truth. This makes it difficult to explain why a considerable number of thinkers emphatically reject all correspondence formulations. Moreover, the suggestion that the correspondence of Ss belief to a fact could be said to consist in, e.g., its coherence with Ss belief system seems quite implausible, even on the most shallow understanding of “correspondence” and “fact”.

Objection 3: Correspondence theories are too obscure.

Objections of this sort, which are the most common, protest that the central notions of a correspondence theory carry unacceptable commitments and/or cannot be accounted for in any respectable manner. They might be divided into objections primarily aimed at the correspondence relation, or its relatives, and objections primarily aimed at the notions of fact or state of affairs:

3.C1: The correspondence relation must be some sort of resemblance relation. But truthbearers don't resemble anything in the world except other truthbearers -- echoing Berkeley's “an idea can be like nothing but an idea”.

3.C2: The correspondence relation is very mysterious: it seems to reach into the most distant regions of space (faster than light?) and time (past and future). How could such a relation possibly be accounted for within a naturalistic framework? What physical relation could it possibly be?

3.F1: Given the great variety of complex truthbearers, a correspondence theory will be committed to all sorts of complex “funny facts” that are ontologically disreputable: negative, disjunctive, conditional, universal, probabilistic, subjunctive, and counterfactual facts have all given cause for complaint on this score.

3.F2:All facts, even the most simple ones, are disreputable. Fact-talk, being wedded to that-clauses, is entirely parasitic on truth-talk. Facts are too much like truthbearers. Facts are fictions, spurious sentence-like slices of reality, “projected from true sentences for the sake of correspondence” (Quine 1987, 213; cf. Strawson 1950).

6. Correspondence as Isomorphism

A correspondence theory is usually expected to go beyond a mere definition like (1) or (2) and discharge a triple task: it should tell us about the workings of the correspondence relation, about the nature of facts, and about the conditions that determine which truthbearers correspond to which facts. It is natural to tackle this by construing correspondence as an isomorphism between truthbearers and facts (cf. Kirkham 1992, chap. 4). The basic idea is that truthbearers and facts are both complex structured entities: truthbearers are composed of words, or concepts, and other truthbearers; facts are composed of things, properties, relations, and other facts or states of affairs. The aim is to show how the correspondence relation is generated from underlying relations between the ultimate constituents of truthbearers and the ultimate constituents of their corresponding facts. One part of the project will be concerned with these correspondence-generating relations: it will lead into a theory that addresses the question how simple words, or concepts, can be about things, properties, and relations; i.e., it will merge with semantics or psycho-semantics (depending on what the truthbearers are taken to be). The other part of the project, the specifically ontological part, will have to provide identity criteria for facts and explain how their simple constituents combine into complex wholes. Putting all this together should yield an account of the conditions determining which truthbearers correspond to which facts.

The isomorphism approach offers an answer to objection 3.C1. Although the truth that the cat is on the mat does not resemble the cat or the mat (the truth doesn't smell, etc.), it does resemble the fact that the cat is on the mat. This is not a qualitative resemblance; it is a more abstract, structural resemblance.

The approach also puts objection 3.C2 in some perspective. The correspondence relation is supposed to reduce to underlying relations between words, or concepts, and reality. Consequently, a correspondence theory is little more than a spin-off from semantics and/or psycho-semantics (the theory of intentionality). This reminds us that, as a relation, correspondence is no more -- but also no less -- mysterious than semantic relations in general. Such relations have some curious features, and they raise a host of puzzles and difficult questions -- most notoriously: Can they be explained in terms of natural (causal) relations, or do they have to be regarded as irreducibly non-natural aspects of reality? Some philosophers have claimed that semantic relations are too mysterious to be taken seriously, usually on the grounds that they are not explainable in naturalistic terms. But one should bear in mind that this is a very general and extremely radical attack on semantics as a whole, on the very idea that words and concepts can be about things. The common practice to aim it specifically at the correspondence theory seems misleading. As far as the intelligibility of the correspondence relation is concerned, the correspondence theory will stand, or fall, with the general theory of reference and intentionality.

On a straightforward implementation of the isomorphism approach, correspondence will be a one-one relation between truths and corresponding facts, which leaves the approach vulnerable to objections against funny facts (3.F1): each true truthbearer, no matter how complex, will be assigned a matching fact. Moreover, since the approach assigns corresponding entities to all (relevant) constituents of truthbearers, complex facts will contain objects corresponding to the logical constants (“not”, “or”, “if-then”, etc.), and these “logical objects” will have to be regarded as constituents of the world. Many philosophers have found it hard to believe in the existence of all these funny facts and objects.

The isomorphism approach has never been advocated in a fully naïve form, assigning corresponding objects to each and every wrinkle of our verbal or mental utterings. Instead, proponents try to isolate the “relevant” constituents of truthbearers through meaning analysis, aiming to uncover the logical form, or deep structure, behind ordinary language and thought. This deep structure might then be expressed in an “ideal-language” (e.g., the language of predicate logic) whose syntactic structure is designed to mirror perfectly the ontological structure of reality. The resulting view -- correspondence as isomorphism between properly analyzed truthbearers and facts -- avoids assigning strange objects to such phrases as “the average husband”, “the present king of France”, or “the sake of”, the view remains committed to logically complex facts and to logical objects corresponding to the logical constants.

Austin (1950) rejects the isomorphism approach on the grounds that it reads the structure of our language into the world. On his version of the correspondence theory (a more elaborated variant of (2) applied to statements), a statement as a whole is correlated to a state of affairs by arbitrary linguistic conventions without mirroring the inner structure of its correlate. This approach appears vulnerable to the objection that it avoids funny facts at the price of neglecting systematicity. Language does not provide separate linguistic conventions for each statement: that would require too vast a number of conventions. Rather, it seems that the truth-values of statements are systematically determined, via a relatively small set of conventions, by the semantic values (relations to reality) of their simpler constituents. Recognition of this systematicity is built right into the isomorphism approach.

7. Modified Versions of the Correspondence Theory

7.1 Logical Atomism

Wittgenstein (1921) and Russell (1918) propose a modified correspondence account of truth as part of their program of “logical atomism”. Such an account proceeds in two stages: (A) the basic truth-definition, say (1), is restricted to a special subclass of truthbearers, the so-called elementary, or atomic, truthbearers; (B) the truth-values of non-elementary, or molecular, truthbearers are explained recursively in terms of their logical structure and the truth-values of their simpler constituents: for example, a sentence of the form ‘not-p’ is true iff ‘p’ is false; a sentence of the form ‘p and q’ is true iff ‘p’ is true and ‘q’ is true; a sentence of the form ‘p or q’ is true iff ‘p’ is true or ‘q’ is true, etc. These recursive clauses (called “truth conditions”) can be reapplied until the truth of a molecular sentence of arbitrary complexity is reduced to the truth or falsehood of its atomic constituents. Definition (1), restricted to atomic truthbearers, serves as the base-clause for the truth-conditional recursions.

Such an account of truth is designed to go with the ontological view that the world is the totality of atomic facts (cf. Wittgenstein 1921, 2.04); i.e., atomic facts are all the facts there are -- although logical atomists tend to allow conjunctive facts, regarding them as mere aggregates of atomic facts. An atomic truth is true because it corresponds to an atomic fact: correspondence is still isomorphism, but it holds exclusively between atomic truths and atomic facts. Molecular truths are not assigned any matching facts: strictly speaking, they do not correspond to facts at all; but their truth-values are explained in terms of logical structure and correspondence of atomic constituents. One-one correspondence is restricted to the atomic level; above that level, there is no one-one correlation between truths and facts (e.g., ‘p’, ‘p or q’, and ‘p or r’ might all be true merely because ‘p’ corresponds to a fact). The trick for avoiding logically complex facts lies in not assigning any entities to the logical constants. Logical complexity, so the idea goes, belongs to the structure of language and/or thought; it is not a feature of the world.

While Wittgenstein and Russell seem to have held that the constituents of atomic facts are to be determined on the basis of a priori considerations, Armstrong (1997) advocates an a posteriori form of logical atomism. On his view, atomic facts are composed of particulars and simple universals (properties and relations). The latter are objective features of the world that ground the objective resemblances between particulars and explain their causal powers. Accordingly, what particulars and universals there are will have to be determined on the basis of total science.

Logical atomism is not easy to sustain and has rarely been held in a pure form. Among its difficulties are the following: (a) There are molecular truthbearers, like subjunctives and counterfactuals, that tend to provoke the funny-fact objection but cannot be handled by simple truth-conditional clauses because their truth-values do not seem to be determined by the truth-values of their atomic constituents. (b) Are there universal facts corresponding to true universal generalizations? Wittgenstein (1921) disapproves of universal facts; apparently, he wants to reanalyze universal generalizations as infinite conjunctions of their instances. Russell (1918) and Armstrong (1997) reject this analysis; they admit universal facts. (c) Negative truths are the most notorious problem case, because they clash with an appealing principle, the “truthmaker principle” (Armstrong 1997, chap. 8), which says that for every truth there must be something in the world that makes it true, i.e., every true truthbearer must have a truthmaker. On the account given above, ‘not-p’ is true iff ‘p’ is false iff ‘p’ does not correspond to any fact; hence, ‘not-p’ is not made true by any fact: it does not seem to have a truthmaker. Russell finds himself driven to admit negative facts, regarded by many as paradigmatically disreputable portions of reality. Wittgenstein (cf. 1921, 2.06) sometimes talks of atomic facts that do not exist and calls their very nonexistence a negative fact -- but this is hardly an atomic fact itself. Armstrong (1997, chap. 8.7) holds that negative truths are made true by a second-order “totality fact” which says of all the (positive) first-order facts that they are all the first-order facts.

Logical atomism is designed to address objections to funny facts (3.F1). It is not designed to address objections to facts in general (3.F2). Here logical atomists will respond by defending (atomic) facts. According to one defense, facts are needed because mere objects are not sufficiently articulated to serve as truthmakers. If a were the sole truthmaker of ‘a is F’, then the latter should imply ‘a is G’, for any ‘G’. So the truthmaker for ‘a is F’ needs at least to involve a and Fness. But since Fness is a universal, it could be instantiated in another object, b, hence the mere existence of a and Fness is not sufficient for making true the claim ‘a is F’: a and Fness need to be tied together in the fact of a's being F. Armstrong (1997) and Olson (1987) also maintain that facts are needed to make sense of the tie that binds particular objects to universals. In this context it is usually emphasized that facts do not supervene on, hence, are not reducible to, their constituents. Facts are entities over and above the particulars and universals of which they are composed: a's loving b and b's loving a are not the same fact even though they have the same constituents. Another defense, surprisingly rare, would point out that many facts are observable: one can see that the cat is on the mat; and this is different from seeing the cat, or the mat, or both -- the objection that many facts are not observable invites the rejoinder that many objects are not observable either.

Some logical atomists propose a version of (1) without facts because they regard facts as too sentence-like. Instead, they propose events and/or objects-plus-tropes as the corresponding portions of reality. It is claimed that these items are more “thingy” than facts but still sufficiently articulated -- and sufficiently abundant -- to serve as adequate truthmakers (cf., e.g., Mulligan, Simons, and Smith 1984).

7.2 Logical “Subatomism”

Logical atomism aims at getting by without complex truthmakers by restricting definitions like (1) or (2) to atomic truthbearers and accounting for the truth-values of molecular truthbearers recursively in terms of their logical structure and atomic truthmakers (atomic facts, events, objects-plus-tropes). More radical modifications of the correspondence theory push the recursive strategy even further, entirely discarding definitions like (1) or (2), and hence the need for atomic truthmakers, by going, as it were, “subatomic”.

Such accounts analyze truthbearers, e.g., sentences, into their subsentential constituents and dissolve the relation of correspondence into appropriate semantic subrelations: names refer to, or denote, objects; predicates (open sentences) apply to objects, or are satisfied by objects. Satisfaction of complex predicates can be handled recursively in terms of logical structure and satisfaction of simpler constituent predicates: an object o satisfies ‘x is not F’ iff o does not satisfy ‘x is F’; o satisfies ‘x is F or x is G’ iff o satisfies ‘x is F’ or o satisfies ‘x is G’; and so on. These recursions are anchored in a base-clause addressing the satisfaction of primitive predicates: e.g., o satisfies ‘x is F’ iff o instantiates the property expressed by ‘F’ -- some would prefer a more nominalistic base-clause for satisfaction, hoping to get by without seriously invoking properties. Truth for singular sentences, consisting of a name and an arbitrarily complex predicate, is defined thus: A singular sentence is true iff the object denoted by the name satisfies the predicate. Logical machinery provided by Tarski (1935) can be used to turn this simplified sketch into a more general definition of truth -- a definition that handles sentences containing relational predicates and quantifiers and covers molecular sentences as well. (Whether Tarski's own definition of truth can be regarded as a correspondence definition even in this modified sense is under debate; cf. Popper 1972; Field 1972, 1986; Kirkham 1992, chaps. 5-6; Soames 1999.)

Since it promises to avoid facts and all similarly articulated, sentence-like slices of reality, correspondence theorists who take seriously objection 3.F2 favor this subatomistic approach: not even atomic truthbearers are assigned any matching truthmakers. The correspondence relation itself has given way to two semantic relations between constituents of truthbearers and objects: denotation and satisfaction -- relations central to any semantic theory. Some advocates envision causal accounts of denotation and satisfaction (cf., Field 1972; Devitt 1982, 1984; Schmitt 1995; Kirkham 1992, chaps. 5-6). It turns out that relational predicates require talk of satisfaction by ordered sequences of objects. Davidson (1969, 1977) maintains that satisfaction by sequences is all that remains of the traditional idea of correspondence to facts; he regards denotation and satisfaction as “theoretical constructs” not in need of causal, or any, explanation.

Problems: (a) The subatomistic approach accounts for the truth-values of molecular truthbearers in the same way as the atomistic approach; consequently, molecular truthbearers that are not truth-functional pose similar problems. (b) Belief attributions and modal claims pose special problems; e.g., it seems that “believes” is a relational predicate, so that “John believes that snow is white” is true iff “believes” is satisfied by John and the object denoted by “that snow is white”; but the latter appears to be a proposition or state of affairs, which threatens to let in through the back-door the very sentence-like slices of reality the subatomic approach was supposed to avoid; (c) The phenomenon of referential indeterminacy threatens to undermine the idea that the truth-values of atomic truthbearers are always determined by the denotation and/or satisfaction of their constituents; e.g., pre-relativistic uses of the term “mass” are plausibly taken to lack determinate reference (referring determinately neither to relativistic mass nor to rest mass); yet a claim like “The mass of the earth is greater than the mass of the moon” seems to be determinately true even when made by Newton (cf. Field 1973).

Problems for both versions of modified correspondence theories: (a) It is not known whether an entirely general recursive definition of truth, one that covers all truthbearers, can be made available. This depends on unresolved issues concerning the extent to which truthbearers are amenable to the kind of structural analyses that are presupposed by the recursive clauses. The more an account of truth wants to exploit the internal structure of truthbearers, the more it will be hostage to the (limited) availability of appropriate structural analyses of the relevant truthbearers. (b) Any account of truth that employs recursions may be virtually committed to taking sentences (maybe sentences of the language of thought) as primary truthbearers. After all, the recursive clauses rely heavily on what appears to be the logico-syntactic structure of truthbearers, and it is unclear whether anything but sentences can plausibly be said to possess this kind of structure. The thesis that sentences of any sort can be regarded as primary truthbearers is contentious. (c) If clauses like “‘p or q’ is true iff ‘p’ is true or ‘q’ is true” are to be used in a recursive account of our notion of truth, as opposed to some other notion, it has to be presupposed that ‘or’ expresses disjunction: one cannot define ‘or’ and ‘true’ at the same time. To avoid circularity, a modified correspondence theory (be it atomic or subatomic) must hold that the logical connectives can be understood without reference to correspondence truth.

8. The Correspondence Theory and Its Competitors

A. Against the traditional competitors -- coherentist, pragmatist, and verificationist and other epistemic theories of truth -- correspondence theorists raise two main sorts of objections. First, these competing accounts tend to lead into relativism. Take, e.g., a coherentist account of truth. Since it is possible that ‘p’ coheres with the belief system of S while ‘not-p’ coheres with the belief system of S*, the coherentist account seems to imply, absurdly, that contradictories, ‘p’ and ‘not-p’, could both be true. To avoid embracing contradictions, coherentists often commit themselves (if only covertly) to the objectionable relativistic view that ‘p’ is true-for-S and ‘not-p’ is true-for-S*. Second, the competing accounts tend to lead into some form of idealism or anti-realism. E.g., it is possible for the belief that p to cohere with someone's belief system even though it is not a fact that p; also, it is possible for it to be a fact that p even though no one believes that p, or the belief that p does not cohere with anyone's belief system. Cases of this form are frequently cited as counterexamples to coherentist accounts of truth. Coherentists tend to reject such counterexamples by insisting that they are not possible after all -- a reaction that commits them to the anti-realist view that the facts are (largely) determined by what we believe.

B. According to the identity theory of truth, true propositions do not correspond to facts, they are (identical with) facts: the true proposition that snow is white = the fact that snow is white. This non-traditional competitor of the correspondence theory threatens to collapse the correspondence relation into identity. In response, a correspondence theorist might point out: First, the identity theory is defensible only for propositions as truthbearers, and only if propositions are construed in a certain way, namely as having objects and properties as constituents rather than ideas or concepts of objects and properties. Hence, even if the identity theory of truth were accepted for propositions (so construed), there would still be ample room (and need) for correspondence accounts of truth with respect to other types of truthbearers. Second, the identity theory rests on the assumption that that-clauses always denote propositions, so that the that-clause in “the fact that snow is white” denotes the proposition that snow is white. The assumption can be questioned. That-clauses can be understood as ambiguous names, sometimes denoting propositions and sometimes denoting facts. The descriptive phrases “the proposition…” and “the fact…” can be regarded as serving to disambiguate the succeeding ambiguous that-clauses -- much like the descriptive phrases in “the philosopher Socrates” and “the soccer-player Socrates” serve to disambiguate the ambiguous name “Socrates” (cf. David 2002).

C. At present the most noticeable competitors to correspondence theories are deflationary accounts of truth. Deflationists maintain that correspondence theories need to be deflated. Their central notions, correspondence and fact (and their relatives), are said to play no legitimate role in an adequate account of truth: they can be excised without loss. A correspondence-type formulation like

(4) “Snow is white” is true iff it corresponds to the fact that snow is white,
is to be deflated to
(5) “Snow is white” is true iff snow is white,

which, according to deflationists, says all there is to be said about the truth of “Snow is white” without superfluous embellishments (cf. Quine 1987, 213).

Correspondence theorists protest that (5) cannot lead to anything deserving to be regarded as an account or theory of truth because it resists generalization. (5) is a substitution instance of the schema

(6) “p” is true iff p,

which does not say anything itself and cannot be turned into a genuine generalization about truth; moreover, no genuine generalizations about truth can be accounted for on the basis of (6). Correspondence definitions, on the other hand, i.e., definitions like (1) or (2), do yield genuine generalizations about truth. (It should be noted that (4), which lends itself to deflating excisions, misrepresents the correspondence theory. According to (4), corresponding to the fact that snow is white is sufficient and necessary for “Snow is white” to be true. Yet, according to (1) and (2), it is sufficient but not necessary: “Snow is white” will be true as long as it corresponds to some fact or other. The genuine article, (1) or (2), is not as easily deflated as (4).)

This debate turns crucially on the question whether anything deserving to be called an “account” or “theory” of truth ought to take the form of a genuine generalization (and ought to be able to account for genuine generalizations involving truth). Correspondence theorists tend to regard this as a (minimal) requirement. Deflationists argue that truth is a shallow (sometimes “logical”) notion -- a notion that has no serious explanatory role to play: as such it does not require a full-fledged account, a real theory, that would have to take the form of a genuine generalization (cf. Devitt 1984; Field 1986; Kirkham 1992; Gupta 1993; David 1994; Schmitt 1995; and the essays in Blackburn and Simmons 1999, and in Schantz 2002).

9. More Objections to the Correspondence Theory

Two final objections to the correspondence theory should be mentioned.

9.1 The Big Fact

Inspired by a similar argument of Frege's, Davidson (1969) argues that the correspondence theory is bankrupt because it cannot avoid the consequence that all true sentences correspond to the same fact: the Big Fact.

Assume that a given sentence, s, corresponds to the fact that p; assume furthermore that ‘p’ and ‘q’ have the same truth-value. Now, since
      {x: x = x & p} = {x: x = x},
which implies
      {x: x = x & q} = {x: x = x},
which in turn implies
it follows that
      s corresponds to the fact that p
      s corresponds to the fact that q.

Since the only restriction on ‘q’ was that it has the same truth-value as ‘p’, it would follow that any sentence that corresponds to any fact corresponds to every fact, so that all true sentences correspond to the same facts, thereby proving the emptiness of the correspondence theory -- the conclusion of the argument is taken as tantamount to the conclusion that every true sentence corresponds to the totality of all the facts, i.e, the Big Fact, i.e., the world as a whole.

This argument, which is a variation on the so-called “slingshot argument”, has been criticized repeatedly. Critics point out that it relies on two assumptions: (i) logically equivalent sentences can be substituted in the context “corresponds to the fact that…”; and (ii) if definite descriptions denoting the same thing can be substituted for each other in a given sentence, then they can still be so substituted if that sentence is embedded within the context “corresponds to the fact that…” (in the version above the relevant descriptions are “{x: x = x & p}” and “{x: x = x & q}”). It is far from obvious why correspondence theorists should be tempted by either one of these assumptions (cf. Olson 1987).

9.2 No Independent Access

The objection that may well have been the most effective in causing discontent with the correspondence theory is based on an epistemological concern. In a nutshell, the objection is that a correspondence theory of truth must inevitably lead into skepticism about the external world because the required correspondence between our thoughts and reality is not ascertainable. Ever since Berkeley's attack on the representational theory of the mind, objections of this sort have enjoyed considerable popularity. It is typically pointed out that we cannot step outside our own minds to compare our thoughts with mind-independent reality. Yet -- so the objection continues -- on the correspondence theory of truth, this is precisely what we would have to do to gain knowledge. We would have to access reality as it is in itself, independently of our cognition of it, and determine whether our thoughts correspond to it. Since this is impossible, since all our access to the world is mediated by our cognition, the correspondence theory makes knowledge impossible. Assuming that the resulting skepticism is unacceptable, the correspondence theory has to be rejected. This type of objection brings up a host of issues in epistemology, the philosophy of mind, and general metaphysics. All that can be done here is to hint at a few pertinent points.

The objection makes use of the following line of reasoning: “If truth is correspondence, then, since knowledge requires truth, we have to know that our beliefs correspond to reality, if we are to know anything about reality”. There are two assumptions implicit in this line of reasoning; both of them debatable. (i) It is assumed that S knows x only if S knows that x is true -- a requirement not underwritten by standard definitions of knowledge, which tell us that S knows x only if x is true and S is justified in believing x. The assumption may rest on confusing requirements for knowing x with requirements for knowing that one knows x. (ii) It is assumed that, if truth = F, then S knows that x is true only if S knows that x has F. This seems highly implausible. By the same standard it would follow that no one who does not know that water is H2O can know that the Nile contains water -- which would mean, of course, that until fairly recently nobody knew that the Nile contained water (that there were stars in the sky, whales in the sea, or that the sun gives light). Moreover, even if one does know that Water is H2O, one's strategy for finding out whether the liquid in one's glass is water does not have to involve chemical analysis. Similarly, it seems the correspondence theory does not entail that we have to know that a belief corresponds to a fact in order to know that it is true, or that our method of finding out whether a belief is true has to involve a strategy of actually comparing a belief with a fact -- although the theory does of course entail that obtaining knowledge amounts to obtaining a belief that corresponds to a fact.

More generally, one might question whether the objection still has much bite once the metaphors of “accessing” and “comparing” are spelled out with more attention to the psychological details involved in belief formation and the epistemological issues involved in the question under what conditions a belief is justified or warranted. Finally, one might wonder whether competing accounts of truth actually enjoy any significant advantage over the correspondence theory when held to the standards set up by this sort of objection.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aristotle | language of thought hypothesis | Meinong, Alexius | Moore, George Edward | propositions | realism | Russell, Bertrand | Tarski, Alfred | tropes | truth: coherence theory of | truth: deflationary theory of | truth: identity theory of | Wittgenstein, Ludwig

Copyright © 2002
Marian David
University of Notre Dame

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy