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The Experience and Perception of Time

We see colours, hear sounds and feel textures. Some aspects of the world, it seems, are perceived through a particular sense. Others, like shape, are perceived through more than one sense. But what sense or senses do we use when perceiving time? It is certainly not associated with one particular sense. In fact, it seems odd to say that we see, hear or touch time passing. And indeed, even if all our senses were prevented from functioning for a while, we could still notice the passing of time through the changing pattern of our thought. Perhaps, then, we have a special faculty, distinct from the five senses, for detecting time. Or perhaps, as seems more likely, we notice time through perception of other things. But how?

Time perception raises a number of intriguing puzzles, including what it means to say we perceive time. In this article, we shall explore the various processes through which we are made aware of time, and which influence the way we think time really is. Inevitably, we shall be concerned with the psychology of time perception, but the purpose of the article is to draw out the philosophical issues, and in particular whether and how aspects of our experience can be accommodated within certain metaphysical theories concerning the nature of time and causation.

What is ‘the perception of time’?

The very expression ‘the perception of time’ invites objection. Insofar as time is something different from events, we do not perceive time as such, but changes or events in time. But, arguably, we do not perceive events only, but also their temporal relations. So, just as it is natural to say that we perceive spatial distances and other relations between objects (I see the dragonfly as hovering above the surface of the water), it seems natural to talk of perceiving one event following another (the thunderclap as following the flash of lightening), though even here there is a difficulty. For what we perceive, we perceive as present-as going on right now. Can we perceive a relation between two events without also perceiving the events themselves? If not, then it seems we perceive both events as present, in which case we must perceive them as simultaneous, and so not as successive after all. There is then a paradox in the notion of perceiving an event as occurring after another, though one that perhaps admits of a straightforward solution. When we perceive B as coming after A, we have, surely, ceased to perceive A. In which case, A is merely an item in our memory. Now if we wanted to construe ‘perceive’ narrowly, excluding any element of memory, then we would have to say that we do not, after all, perceive B as following A. But in this article, we shall construe ‘perceive’ more broadly, to include a wide range of experiences of time that essentially involve the senses. In this wide sense, we perceive a variety of temporal aspects of the world. We shall begin by enumerating these, and then consider accounts of how such perception is possible.

Kinds of temporal experience

There are a number of what Ernst Pöppel (1978) calls ‘elementary time experiences’, or fundamental aspects of our experience of time. Among these we may list the experience of (i) duration; (ii) non-simultaneity; (iii) order; (iv) past and present; (v) change, including the passage of time. It might be thought that experience of non-simultaneity is the same as experience of time order, but it appears that, when two events occur very close together in time, we can be aware that they occur at different times without being able to say which one came first (see Hirsh and Sherrick (1961)). We might also think that perception of order was itself explicable in terms of our experience of the distinction between past and present. There will certainly be links here, but it is a contentious question whether the experience of tense-that is, experiencing an event as past or present-is more fundamental than the experience of order, or vice versa, or whether indeed there is such a thing as the experience of tense at all. This issue is taken up below. Finally, we should expect to see links between the perception of time order and the perception of motion if the latter simply involves perception of the order of the different spatial positions of an object. This is another contentious issue that is taken up below.


One of the earliest, and most famous, discussions of the nature and experience of time occurs in the autobiographical Confessions of St Augustine. Augustine was born in Numidia (now Algeria) in 354 AD, held chairs in rhetoric at Carthage and Milan, and become Bishop of Hippo in 395. He died in 430. As a young adult, he had rejected Christianity, but was finally converted at the age of 32. Book XI of the Confessions contains a long and fascinating exploration of time, and its relation to God. During the course of it Augustine raises the following conundrum: when we say that an event or interval of time is short or long, what is it that is being described as of short or long duration? It cannot be what is past, since that has ceased to be, and what is non-existent cannot presently have any properties, such as being long. But neither can it be what is present, for the present has no duration. (For the reason why the present must be regarded as durationless, see the section on the specious present, below.) In any case, while an event is still going on, its duration cannot be assessed.

Augustine's answer to this riddle is that what we are measuring, when we measure the duration of an event or interval of time, is in the memory. From this he derives the radical conclusion that time itself (or, at least, the past and future) is something in the mind. While not following Augustine all the way to his theory of the subjectivity of time, we can concede that the perception of temporal duration is crucially bound up with memory. It is some feature of our memory of the event (and perhaps specifically our memory of the beginning and end of the event) that allows us to form a belief about its duration. This process need not be described, as Augustine describes it, as a matter of measuring something wholly in the mind. Arguably, at least, we are measuring the event or interval itself, a mind-independent item, but doing so by means of some psychological process.

Whatever the process in question is, it seems likely that it is intimately connected with what William Friedman (1990) calls ‘time memory’: that is, memory of when some particular event occurred. That there is a close connection here is entailed by the plausible suggestion that we infer (albeit subconsciously) the duration of an event, once it has ceased, from information about how long ago the beginning of that event occurred. That is, information that is metrical in nature (e.g. ‘the burst of sound was very brief’) is derived from tensed information, concerning how far in the past something occurred. The question is how we acquire this tensed information. It may be direct or indirect, a contrast we can illustrate by two models of time memory described by Friedman. He calls the first the strength model of time memory. If there is such a thing as a memory trace that persists over time, then we could judge the age of a memory (and therefore how long ago the event remembered occurred) from the strength of the trace. The longer ago the event, the weaker the trace. This provides a simple and direct means of assessing the duration of an event. Unfortunately, the trace model comes into conflict with a very familiar feature of our experience: that some memories of recent events may fade more quickly than memories of more distant events, especially when those distant events were very salient ones (visiting a rarely seen and frightening relative when one was a child, for instance.) A contrasting account of time memory is the inference model. According to this, the time of an event is not simply read off from some aspect of the memory of it, but is inferred from information about relations between the event in question and other events whose date or time is known.

The inference model may be plausible enough when we are dealing with distant events, but rather less so for much more recent ones. In addition, the model posits a rather complex cognitive operation that is unlikely to occur in non-human animals, such as the rat. Rats, however, are rather good at measuring time over short intervals of up to a minute, as demonstrated by instrumental conditioning experiments involving the ‘free operant procedure’. In this, a given response (such as depressing a lever) will delay the occurrence of an electric shock by a fixed period of time, such as 40 seconds, described as the R-S (response-shock) interval. Eventually, rate of responding tracks the R-S interval, so that the probability of responding increases rapidly as the end of the interval approaches. (See Mackintosh (1983) for a discussion of this and related experiments.) It is hard to avoid the inference here that the mere passage of time itself is acting as a conditioned stimulus: that the rats, to put it in more anthropocentric terms, are successfully estimating intervals of time. In this case, the strength model seems more appropriate than the inference model.

The specious present

The term ‘specious present’ was first introduced by the psychologist E.R. Clay, but the best known characterisation of it was due to William James, widely regarded as one of the founders of modern psychology. He lived from 1842 to 1910, and was professor of philosophy at Harvard. His definition of the specious present goes as follows: ‘the prototype of all conceived times is the specious present, the short duration of which we are immediately and incessantly sensible’ (James (1890)). How long is this specious present? Elsewhere in the same work, James asserts ‘We are constantly aware of a certain duration-the specious present-varying from a few seconds to probably not more than a minute, and this duration (with its content perceived as having one part earlier and another part later) is the original intuition of time.’ This surprising variation in the length of the specious present makes one suspect that more than one definition is hidden in James' rather vague characterisation. One could define it, for example, as the extent of short-term memory, in which case it might well vary from person to person, and also from one sense modality to another. Or it might be the interval in which information is experienced as a single unit (say a sentence, or musical phrase)-a rather ambiguous and unsatisfactory definition. A quite different definition is this: the interval of time such that events occurring within that interval are experienced as present. This is how the specious present tends to be treated in recent discussions, though it is inconsistent with James' remark that we can discern earlier and later parts in the specious present. As we remarked at the beginning of this article, if two events are experienced as present, they are surely experienced as simultaneous.

Taking the specious present as defined by this third characterisation, the doctrine of the specious present holds that the group of events we experience at any one time as present contains successive events spanning an interval. The experienced present is ‘specious’ in that, unlike the objective present, it is an interval and not a durationless instant. The ‘real’ present, as we might call it, must be durationless for, as Augustine argued, in an interval of any duration, there are earlier and later parts. So if any part of that interval is present, there will be another part that is past or future. This definition needs to be tightened up a little, to distinguish the tendency of the mind to group together successive events from the familiar fact that light and sound travel at finite speeds, and so events experienced as present will in fact be past (the degree of pastness varying with distance). What matters, as far as the doctrine is concerned, is not when an event occurred, but when information from that event reached our sense organs. Thus, light beams from two events may reach the retina at slightly different times, and yet the two events be perceived as simultaneous.

A number of arguments have been advanced in favour of the doctrine of the specious present (see Mundle (1966)):

(A) We see things as moving, such as the second-hand of a clock, and ‘to see a second-hand moving is quite a different thing from "seeing" that a hour-hand has moved.’ (Broad (1923)) More formally:

(1) What we see, we see as present.
(2) We see motion.
(3) Motion occurs over an interval.
Therefore: What we see as present occurs over an interval.
(B) If the experienced present were only an durationless instant, then we could not understand a spoken sentence, because what would be presented to the senses at any one point would only be a meaningless phoneme—indeed not even that, since any sound necessarily takes up time (Gombrich (1964)).

(C) If the experienced present were only a durationless instant, then we would not see pictures on the television screen or VDU of a computer, since these are built up from a moving electron beam. More generally, we would not see anything at all, since light itself is a motion (Ibid.).

However, the first two of these arguments are questionable (at least as arguments for the doctrine as we have characterised it; they may be more appropriate for other conceptions of the specious present). If events e1 and e2 are registered in a single specious present, then we perceive them both as present, and so as simultaneous. But we do not see, e.g., the successive positions of a moving object as simultaneous, for if we did we would see a blurred object and not a moving one. So (in response to A) to see an object as moving is not to see as present something that occurs over an interval. Similarly, we do not hear all the parts of a spoken sentence as simultaneous, for if we did it would be a meaningless jumble. So (in response to B) we do not hear all the parts of the sentence as present.

C, in contrast, appears to be sound, and does not involve the contradictory suggestion that we experience some things as both ordered and as present. When events occur sufficiently fast, such as the movement of the electron beam over the television screen, we simply fail to perceive the temporal order of certain components of our experience. In these cases, we see things as simultaneous when they are not simultaneously presented to our sensory apparatus, and that is the basis of the true doctrine of the specious present.

Past, present and the passage of time

The previous section indicated the importance of distinguishing between perceiving the present and perceiving something as present. We may perceive as present items that are past. Indeed, given the finite speed of the transmission of both light and sound (and the finite speed of transmission of information from receptors to brain), it seems that we only ever perceive what is past. However, this does not by itself tell us what it is to perceive something as present, rather than as past. Nor does it explain the most striking feature of our experience as-of the present: that it is constantly changing. The passage (or apparent passage) of time is its most striking feature, and any account of our perception of time must account for this aspect of our experience.

Here is one attempt to do so. The first problem is to explain why our temporal experience is limited in a way in which our spatial experience is not. We can perceive objects that stand in a variety of spatial relations to us: near, far, to the left or right, up or down, etc. Our experience is not limited to the immediate vicinity (although of course our experience is spatially limited to the extent that sufficiently distant objects are invisible to us). But, although we perceive the past, we do not perceive it as past, but as present. Moreover, our experience does not only appear to be temporally limited, it is so: we do not perceive the future, and we do not continue to perceive transient events long after information from them reached our senses. Now, there is a very simple answer to the question why we do not perceive the future, and it is a causal one. Briefly, causes always precede their effects; perception is a causal process, in that to perceive something is to be causally affected by it; therefore we can only perceive earlier events, never later ones. So one temporal boundary of our experience is explained; what of the other?

There seems no logical reason why we should not directly experience the distant past. We could appeal to the principle that there can be no action at a temporal distance, so that something distantly past can only causally affect us via more proximate events. But this is inadequate justification. We can only perceive a spatially distant tree by virtue of its effects on items in our vicinity (light reflected off the tree impinging on our retinas), but this is not seen by those who espouse a direct realist theory of perception as incompatible with their position. We still see the tree, they say, not some more immediate object. Perhaps then we should look for a different strategy, such as the following one, which appeals to biological considerations. To be effective agents in the world, we must represent accurately what is currently going on: to be constantly out of date in our beliefs while going about our activities would be to face pretty immediate extinction. Now we are fortunate in that, although we only perceive the past it is, in most cases, the very recent past, since the transmission of light and sound, though finite, is extremely rapid. Moreover, although things change, they do so, again in most cases, at a rate that is vastly slower than the rate at which information from external objects travels to us. So when we form beliefs about what is going on in the world, they are largely accurate ones. (See Butterfield (1984) for a more detailed account along these lines.) But, incoming information having been registered, it needs to move into the memory to make way for more up to date information. For, although things may change slowly relative to the speed of light or of sound, they do change, and we cannot afford to be simultaneously processing conflicting information. So our effectiveness as agents depends on our not continuing to experience a transient state of affairs (rather in the manner of a slow motion film) once information from it has been absorbed. Evolution has ensured that we do not experience anything other than the very recent past (except when we are looking at the heavens).

To perceive something as present is simply to perceive it: we do not need to postulate some extra item in our experience that is ‘the experience of presentness.’ It follows that there can be no ‘perception of pastness’. In addition, if pastness were something we could perceive, then we would perceive everything in this way, since every event is past by the time we perceive it. But even if we never perceive anything as past (at the same time as perceiving the event in question) we could intelligibly talk more widely of the experience of pastness: the experience we get when something comes to an end. And it has been suggested that memories-more specifically, episodic memories, those of our experiences of past events-are accompanied by a feeling of pastness (see Russell (1921)). The problem that this suggestion is supposed to solve is that an episodic memory is simply a memory of an event: it represents the event simpliciter, rather than the fact that the event is past. So we need to postulate something else which alerts us to the fact that the event remembered is past. An alternative account, and one which does not appeal to any phenomenological aspects of memory, is that memories dispose us to form past-tensed beliefs, and is by virtue of this that they represent an event as past.

We have, then, a candidate explanation for our experience of being located at a particular moment in time, the (specious) present. And as the content of that experience is constantly changing, so that position in time shifts. But there is still a further puzzle. Change in our experience is not the same thing as experience of change. We want to know, not just what it is to perceive one event after another, but also what it is to perceive an event as occurring after another. Only then will we understand our experience of the passage of time. We turn, then, to the perception of time order.

Time order

How do we perceive precedence amongst events? A temptingly simple answer is that the perception of precedence is just a sensation caused by instances of precedence, just as a sensation of red is caused by instances of redness. Hugh Mellor (1998), who considers this line, rejects it for the following reason. If this were the correct explanation, then we could not distinguish between x being earlier than y, and x being later than y, for whenever there is an instance of one relation, there is also an instance of the other. But plainly we are able to distinguish the two cases, so it cannot simply be a matter of perceiving a relation, but something to do with our perception of the relata. But mere perception of the relata cannot be all there is to perceiving precedence. Consider again Broad's point about the second hand and the hour hand. We first perceive the hour hand in one position, say pointing to 3 o'clock, and later we perceive it in a different position, pointing to half-past 3. So I have two perceptions, one later than the other. I may also be aware of the temporal relationship of the two positions of the hand. Nevertheless, I do not perceive that relationship, in that I do not see the hand moving. In contrast, I do see the second hand move from one position to another: I see the successive positions as successive.

Mellor's proposal is that I perceive x precede y by virtue of the fact that my perception of x causally affects my perception of y. As I see the second hand in one position, I have in my short-term memory an image (or information in some form) of its immediately previous position, and this image affects my current perception. The result is a perception of movement. The perceived order of different positions need not necessarily be the same as the actual temporal order of those positions, but it will be the same as the causal order of the perceptions of them. Since causes always precede their effects, the temporal order perceived entails a corresponding temporal order in the perceptions. Dainton (2001) has objected to this that, if the account were right, we should not be able to remember perceiving precedence, since we only remember what we can geuinely perceive. But there seems no reason to deny that, just because perception of precedence may involve short-term memory, it does not thereby count as genuine perception.

There is a further disanalogy between perception of colour and perception of time order. What is perceived in the case of colour is something that has a definite spatio-temporal location. The relation of precedence, in contrast, is not something that has any obvious location. But causes do have locations, so the perception of precedence is rather harder to reconcile with the causal theory of perception than the perception of colour (Le Poidevin (2004)).

In effect, Mellor's idea is that the brain represents time by means of time: that temporally ordered events are represented by similarly temporally ordered experiences. This would make the representation of time unique. (For example, the brain does not represent spatially separated objects by means of spatially separated perceptions, or orange things by orange perceptions.) But why should time be unique in this respect? In other media, time can be represented spatially (as in cartoons, graphs, and analogue clocks) or numerically (as in calendars and digital clocks). So perhaps the brain can represent time by other means. One reason to suppose that it must have other means at its disposal is that time needs to be represented in memory (I recall, both that a was earlier than b, and also the experience of seeing a occur before b) and intention (I intend to F after I G), but there is no obvious way in which Mellor's ‘representation of time by time’ account can be extended to these.

On Mellor's model, the mechanism by which time-order is perceived is sensitive to the time at which perceptions occur, but indifferent to their content (what the perceptions are of). Daniel Dennett (1991) proposes a different model, on which the process is time-independent, but content-sensitive. For example, the brain may infer the temporal order of events by seeing which sequence makes sense of the causal order of those events. One of the advantages of Dennett's model is that it can account for the rather puzzling cases of ‘backwards time referral’, where perceived order does not follow the order of perceptions. (See Dennett (1991) for a discussion of these cases, and also Roache (1999) for an attempt to reconcile them with Mellor's account.)

The metaphysics of time perception

In giving an account of the various aspects of time perception, we inevitably make use of concepts that we take to have an objective counterpart in the world: the past, temporal order, causation, change, the passage of time and so on. But one of the most important lessons of philosophy, for many writers, is that there may be a gap, perhaps even a gulf, between our representation of the world and the world itself, even on a quite abstract level. (It would be fair to add that, for other writers, this is precisely not the lesson philosophy teaches.) Philosophy of time is no exception to this. Indeed, it is interesting to note how many philosophers have taken the view that, despite appearances, time, or some aspect of time, is unreal. In this final section, we will take a look at how two metaphysical debates concerning the nature of the world interact with accounts of time perception.

The first debate concerns the reality of tense, that is, our division of time into past, present and future. Is time really divided in this way? Does what is present slip further and further into the past? Or does this picture merely reflect our perspective on a reality in which there is no uniquely privileged moment, the present, but simply an ordered series of moments? Tensed theorists say that our ordinary picture of the world as tensed reflects the world as it really is: the passage of time is an objective fact. Tenseless theorists deny this. For them, the only objective temporal facts concern relations of precedence and simultaneity between events. (I ignore here the complications introduced by the Special Theory of Relativity, since tenseless theory-and perhaps tensed theory also-can be reformulated in terms which are compatible with the Special Theory.) Tenseless theorists do not deny that our tensed beliefs, such that that a cold front is now passing, or that Sally's wedding was two years ago, may be true, but they assert that what makes such beliefs true are not facts about the pastness, presentness or futurity of events, but tenseless facts concerning precedence and simultaneity (see Mellor (1998), Oaklander and Smith (1994)). On one version of the tenseless theory, for example, my belief that there is a cold front now passing is true because the passing of the front is simultaneous with my forming the belief. Now one very serious challenge to the tenseless theorist is to explain why, if time does not pass in reality, it appears to do so. What, in tenseless terms, is the basis for our experience as-of the passage of time?

The accounts we considered above, first of the temporal restrictions on our experience, and secondly of our experience of time order, did not explicitly appeal to tensed notions. The facts we did appeal to look like purely tenseless ones: that causes are always earlier than their effects, that things typically change slowly in relation to the speed of transmission of light and sound, that our information-processing capacities are limited, and that there can be causal connections between memories and experiences. So it may be that the tenseless theorist can discharge the obligation to explain why time seems to pass. But two doubts remain. First, perhaps the tensed theorist can produce a simpler explanation of our experience. Second, it may turn out that supposedly tenseless facts are dependent upon tensed ones, so that, for example, a and b are simultaneous by virtue of the fact that both are present.

What is clear, though, is that there is no direct argument from experience to the tensed theory, since the present of experience, being temporally extended and concerning the past, is very different from the objective present postulated by the tensed theory.

The second metaphysical issue that has a crucial bearing on time perception concerns causal asymmetry. The account of our sense of being located at a time which we considered under Past, present and the passage of time rested on the assumption that causation is asymmetric. Later events, it was suggested, cannot affect earlier ones, as a matter of mind-independent fact, and this is why we do not perceive the future, only the past. But attempts to explain the basis of causal asymmetry, in terms for example of counterfactual dependence, or in probabilistic terms, are notoriously problematic. One moral we might draw from the difficulties of reducing causal asymmetry to other asymmetries is that causal asymmetry is primitive, and so irreducible. Another is that that the search for a mind-independent account is mistaken. Perhaps causation in intrinsically symmetric, but some feature of our psychological constitution and relation to the world makes causation appear asymmetric. This causal perspectivalism is the line taken by Huw Price (1996). That causal asymmetry should be explained in part by our psychological constitution, in a way analogous to our understanding of secondary qualities such as colour, is a radical reversal of our ordinary assumptions, but then our ordinary understanding of a number of apparently objective features of the world—tense, absolute simultaneity—have met with similarly radical challenges. Now, if causal asymmetry is mind-dependent in this way, then we cannot appeal to it in accounting for our experience of temporal asymmetry—the difference between past and future.

But the facts of perception may themselves constitute a problem for perspectivalism over causal asymmetry. We will leave the topic of time perception with the following conundrum for proponents of causal perspectivalism. Consider the following causally ordered (but not directed) series:

Assuming, as perspectivalism holds, that causation is intrinsically symmetric, β stands in exactly the same causal relation to Φ as it does to κ. However, although not directed, the series is ordered in that the relation of causal betweenness holds between items. Thus β is causally between Φ and κ. But then, if this is so, it is not clear how perspectivalism could explain why the following principle holds:
If β is a perceptual experience, then it cannot have both Φ and κ as its object
This principle does not beg the question against perspectivalism by smuggling in an assumption about causal asymmetry. For it is surely a trivial fact about our perception of time that if A is experienced as occurring before B, A and B cannot be experienced as simultaneous. And it is surely an objective (although non-trivial) fact that our experience of A will be causally between A and our experience of B. Now if perspectivalism cannot answer the challenge to explain the truth of the above principle, it seems that our experience of temporal asymmetry, insofar as it has a causal explanation, requires causation to be objectively asymmetric.

One strategy the causal perspectivalist could adopt (indeed, the only one available) is to explain the asymmetric principle above in terms of some objective non-causal asymmetry. Price, for example, allows an objective thermodynamic asymmetry, in that an ordered series of states of the universe will exhibit what he calls a thermodynamic gradient: entropy will be lower at one end of the series than at the end. We should resist the temptation to say that entropy increases, for that would be like asserting that a road goes uphill rather than downhill without conceding the perspectival nature of descriptions like ‘uphill’. Could such a thermodynamic asymmetry explain why perception points in one direction? That is a thought for the reader to ponder.


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Augustine, Saint | memory | perception: the problem of | space and time: being and becoming in modern physics | time

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Robin Le Poidevin

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