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Thought Experiments

Thought experiments are devices of the imagination used to investigate nature. We need only list a few of the well-known thought experiments to be reminded of their enormous influence and importance in the sciences: Newton's bucket, Maxwell's demon, Einstein's elevator, Heisenberg's gamma-ray microscope, Schrödinger's cat. The 17th century saw some of its most brilliant practitioners in Galileo, Descartes, Newton, and Leibniz. And in our own time, the creation of quantum mechanics and relativity are almost unthinkable without the crucial role played by thought experiments. Galileo and Einstein were, arguably, the most impressive thought experimenters, but they were by no means the first. Thought experiments existed throughout the middle ages, and can be found in antiquity, too.

1. Examples of Thought Experiments

One of the most beautiful early examples (Lucretius, De Rerum Natura) attempts to show that space is infinite: If there is a boundary to the universe, we can toss a spear at it. If the spear flies through, it isn't a boundary after all; if the spear bounces back, then there must be something beyond the supposed edge of space, a cosmic wall which is itself in space that stopped the spear. Either way, there is no edge of the universe; space is infinite. This example nicely illustrates many of the common features of thought experiments: We visualize some situation; we carry out an operation; we see what happens. It also illustrates their fallibility. (In this case we've learned how to conceptualize space so that it is both finite and unbounded.)

Often a real experiment that is the analogue of a thought experiment is impossible for physical, technological, or just plain practical reasons; but this needn't be a defining condition of thought experiments. The main point is that we seem able to get a grip on nature just by thinking, and therein lies the great interest for philosophy. How is it possible to learn (apparently) new things about nature without new empirical data?

Ernst Mach (who seems to have coined the expression Gedankenexperiment) developed an interesting empiricist view in his classic, The Science of Mechanics. We possess, he says, a great store of "instinctive knowledge" picked up from experience. This needn't be articulated at all, but comes to the fore when we consider certain situations. One of his favourite examples is due to Simon Stevin. When a chain is draped over a double frictionless plane, as in Fig. 1a, how will it move? Add some links as in Fig. 1b.

Figure 1a Figure 1b
Figure 1a Figure 1b
Now it is obvious. The initial setup must have been in static equilibrium. Otherwise, we would have a perpetual motion machine; and according to our experience-based "instinctive knowledge", says Mach, this is impossible.

2. Recent Work on Thought Experiments

Thomas Kuhn's "A Function for Thought Experiments" employs many of the concepts (but not the terminology) of his well-known Structure of Scientific Revolutions. On his view a well-conceived thought experiment can bring on a crisis or at least create an anomaly in the reigning theory and so contribute to paradigm change. So thought experiments can teach us something new about the world, even though we have no new data, by helping us to reconceptualize the world in a better way.

Recent years have seen a sudden growth of interest in thought experiments. The views of Brown (1991) and Norton (1991, 1996) represent the extremes of platonic rationalism and classic empiricism, respectively. Norton claims that any thought experiment is really a (possibly disguised) argument; it starts with premisses grounded in experience and follows deductive or inductive rules of inference in arriving at its conclusion. The picturesque features of any thought experiment which give it an experimental flavour might be psychologically helpful, but are strictly redundant. Thus, says Norton, we never go beyond the empirical premisses in a way to which any empiricist would object. (For criticisms see Brown (1991, 1993) and for a defense see Norton (1996).)

By contrast, Brown holds that in a few special cases we do go well beyond the old data to acquire a priori knowledge of nature. Galileo showed that all bodies fall at the same speed with a brilliant thought experiment that started by destroying the then reigning Aristotelian account. The latter holds that heavy bodies fall faster than light ones (H > L). But consider (Fig. 2), in which a heavy canon ball (H) and light musket ball (L) are attached together to form a compound object (H+L); the latter must fall faster than the cannon ball alone. Yet the compound object must also fall slower, since the light part will act as a drag on the heavy part. Now we have a contradiction. (H+L > H and H > H+L) That's the end of Aristotle's theory; but there is a bonus, since the right account is now obvious: they all fall at the same speed (H = L = H+L).

Figure 2
Figure 2
This is said to be a priori (though still fallible) knowledge of nature since there are no new data involved, nor is the conclusion derived from old data, nor is it some sort of logical truth. This account of thought experiments is further developed by linking the a priori epistemology to a recent account of laws of nature which holds that laws are relations between objectively existing abstract entities. It is thus a rather platonistic view, not unlike platonistic accounts of mathematics such as that urged by Gödel. (For details see Brown 1991.)

The two views just sketched might occupy the opposite ends of a spectrum of positions on thought experiments. Some of the promising new alternative views include those of Sorensen (somewhat in the spirit of Mach) who holds that thought experiments are a "limiting case" of ordinary experiments; they can achieve their aim, he says, without being executed. (Sorensen's book is also valuable for its extensive discussion of thought experiments in philosophy of mind, ethics, and other areas of philosophy, as well as the sciences.) Other promising views include those of Gooding (who stresses the similar procedural nature of thought experiments and real experiments), Miscevic and Nersessian (each of whom tie thought experiments to "mental models"), and several of the accounts in Horowitz and Massey (1991). More recent excellent discussions include: Arthur (1999), Gendler (1998), Haggqvist (1996), Humphreys (1994), Genz (1999), McAllister (1996). The literature on thought experiments continues to grow rapidly.


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Descartes, René | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Mach, Ernst | science, philosophy of

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James R. Brown

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