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Taoism (Daoism)*

Daoism stands alongside Confucianism as one of the two great religious/philosophical systems of China. Traditionally traced to the mythical Laozi "Old Philosopher," Philosophical Daoism owes more to "philosopher Zhuang" (Zhuangzi) (4th Century BC). Daoism is an umbrella that covers a range of similarly motivated doctrines. The term "Daoism" is also associated with assorted naturalistic or mystical religions. Sometimes the term "Lao-Zhuang Philosophy" is used to distinguish the philosophical from the more religious "Huang-Lao" (Yellow Emperor-Laozi) strain of Daoist thought.

Both the Daode Jing and the Zhuangzi are composite texts written and rewritten over centuries with varied input from multiple anonymous writers. Each has a distinctive rhetorical style, the Daode Jing terse and poetic, the Zhuangzi prolix, funny, elusive and filled with fantasy dialogues. Both texts flow from reflections on the nature of dao (way) and related concepts that were central to the ethical disputes of Ancient China. Neither Daoism nor a distinctively Daoist doctrine existed in ancient China. This reflective, metaethical focus on ethical ways, rather than any specific normative theory, is what distinguishes "Daoists" from other thinkers of the period.

These reflections were by turns skeptical then relativist, here naturalist and there mystical. Daoism has no "constant dao." However, it does have a common spirit. Dao-centered philosophical reflection engendered a distinctive ambivalence in advocacy -- manifested in their indirect, non-argumentative style, their use of poetry and parable. In ancient China, the political implication of this Dao-ism was mainly an opposition to authority, government, coercion, and even to normal socialization in values. Daoist "spontaneity" was contrasted with subtle or overt indoctrination in any specific or social dao.  

1. Definition of "Daoism"

A clear definition of Daoism is difficult because of the complex twists in its development as it played its role in the long history of China. Even the coining of the term creates ambiguity about what to count as its doctrine. Three to seven centuries after they were supposed to have lived, Han dynasty (around 100 BC) historians named six schools of classical thought -- Confucian, Mohist, Yin-yang, Legalist, Daoist and school of names. They coined the term dao-jia (way-school) or (dao-de jia) (way and virtue school) and came to identify Laozi and Zhuangzi as paradigms of the study of dao way.

"Legalist" and Huang-Lao thought were at the time dominating intellectual life. The historians who coined the term "Daoism" were probably thinking of Huang-Lao content when they introduced the term, but they came to fix its reference by pointing to Lao-Zhuang as the originating zi philosopher:master of the school. So the operative definition of Daoism was "what Laozi and Zhuangzi taught." Other early Han writers cribbed and copied from the original texts but, under Huang-Lao influence, exhibited little further philosophical reflection. The products of this "recovery" have also come to be thought of as Daoist texts and include the Huinanzi (around 140 BC) and the Liezi (Fourth Century AD).

During the early Han, Confucianism became the official orthodoxy. Superstitious cosmological speculation (five-phase theory and portentology) dominated Han thought and the intellectual lives of Chinese thinkers for four centuries. When the Han declined, Confucianism lost much of its grip and intellectuals turned to Lao-Zhuang for inspiration -- but now read through cosmological lenses. Western scholars identify this movement as Neo-Daoist but since it fixed the enduring forms of a "traditional text" and provided the first systematic commentaries, their cosmological conception has come to dominate the Chinese view of Daoism. The Neo-Daoist movement also coincided with the initial spread of Buddhism in China. Neo-Daoist discourse practices helped introduce Buddhist ideas into China and Daoism heavily influenced distinctively Chinese forms of Buddhism, particularly Chan (Zen). This development blended the content of the two religious doctrines in the intellectual consciousness so much that Neo-Confucians eventually took them to be essentially similar religious-metaphysical outlooks.

Meantime, "Daoist" religious groups (often rebellious or millenarian movements) emerged in varied forms in each dynasty. Because of its "naturalistic" and anti-authoritarian ethos, the term could encompass virtually any "local" religion with its familiar natural "Gods." The result is that Daoism an essentially malleable concept. Creel's famous question[1] "What is Taoism?" remains as difficult as ever.

We will not attempt to settle that larger controversy, but will focus on the less controversial contrast between philosophical and religious Daoism. Even focusing only on philosophical Daoism invites enough controversy. Those who speak of it often identify Daoist philosophy with metaphysical monism or mysticism and contrast that with practical or political thought. For our purposes, we will refer to Daoist philosophy using our own distinction between ‘philosophy’ and ‘religion’ and use ‘philosophy’ to embrace both metaphysics and ethical-political thought particularly when marked by second-level reflection -- thinking about thinking.

Although we treat Laozi and Zhuangzi as the exemplars of ‘Daoism,’ the use of Lao-Zhuang to identify a strain of thought may have become common only as late as Neo-Daoism. Not only is it true that "Zhuangzi never knew he was a Daoist",[2] he also didn't know he was "following" Laozi. The reasons for denying that Zhuangzi had heard of Laozi or the Daode Jing are stronger than for believing it. However, albeit without the name, writers responsible for later chapters of the Zhuangzi itself recognized an affinity between the two texts. A large chunk of the "outer" chapters use the character of Laozi as spokesman and often echo the style and attitudes of (though not quotations from) the Daode Jing. Common themes, tropes and modes of expression seem to link the authors of the outer chapters with Daode Jing. One plausible speculation is that anonymous students of the Zhuangzi, working after his death, were "developing" the text while in contact with the group anonymously composing the Daode Jing. They shaped each other's themes, expressions and ideas. See further discussion in Texts and Textual Theory.

The underlying distinction between the philosophical and religious poles is an epistemic issue. Both species of Daoism start from a common critique of "ordinary" knowing of dao way:guide. From this mildly skeptical or relativist base, philosophical Daoism tends toward pluralism, perspectivalism, skepticism, political equality and freedom. Religious "mysticism" professes to control of an esoteric way of overcoming the skepticism and typically claims some "superlative" or direct access to a single correct dao way:guide. As the special insight cannot be justified to those with "ordinary" perspectives and/or cannot be put into language and argument, it tends to generate esoteric, hierarchical and authoritarian forms.

The latter tendency is associated with a Confucian-like emphasis on "cultivating" this special epistemic ability, obediently following teachers and traditions. The philosophical strain's emphasis on natural spontaneity, freedom and egalitarianism, leads them to favor political anarchy. This is because in the context of Ancient China, the assumed role of government is cultivating moral character, that is, instilling the same moral dao way:guide in everyone whether by education, attraction or force. The gap between the religious and political attitudes can partly be closed by claims that the content of the religious dao is egalitarian, empty or anarchist.

Confucianism argues that the religious strain's shared interest in cultivating a special moral status means that Confucianism and Daoism are ultimately compatible. Both have at their core a dogmatic asseveration of a "special," cultivated ability of direct (not mediated by language or reasons) access to the single, correct, dao -- which cannot be cast in the form of "fixed" principles. The supposedly shared presupposition is the possibility of cultivating an intuitive guidance that is not undermined by the philosophical Daoist arguments. Insofar as they are accountable for justifying or answering those arguments, tendencies in that direction can still count as ‘philosophical.’ We draw the line of definition when the claim to special insight rests on dogmatic claim, special pleading or "revelation."

The domination of Confucianism in Chinese intellectual life has brought with it the wide acceptance of this "friendly" orthodox religious interpretation of Daoism. History does little to settle which line of interpretation is "original" since lines of thought leading in each direction can be found in early classical sources. This difficulty is compounded by the diffidence of the writing styles in both the Daode Jing and the Zhuangzi -- which is so marked that it is often tempting to suspect the writers intended to be ambiguous, to invite divergent interpretation as an object lesson in the "inconstancy" of any discourse-based dao. Conceivably, therefore, both trends may have drawn "support" from reading the early texts as expressing ideas compatible with their own. See Origins of Daoism.

The plethora of strains of Daoism makes it hard to specify the content of Daoism to the satisfaction of all parties attracted to the texts and its ideas. Treatments range from interpreting Daoism as a sophisticated metaethical position rooted in analytic studies of language tending toward ethical skepticism and relativism at one end and "praising" Daoism as an anti-logical, deliberately self-contradictory mysticism -- a cultural rebuke of Western rationality -- at the other. Despite (or because of?) their "Rorschach" quality, the two main texts remain among the most popular in Chinese philosophy. No one doubts their literary qualities and poetic style which they combined with a lighthearted humor to leave readers with a compelling inkling that these texts are somehow philosophically profound. See the section Philosophical Daoism: A Primer.

This entry will focus on exploring that hint of philosophical depth in Daoism and touch on the familiar religious interpretations mainly for context and contrast. We will look at a range of loosely related philosophical positions and some of the interpretive theory fueling them. The philosophical side of Daoism takes the ru-mo Confucianism-Mohism debate about dao as a model of what goes wrong in trying to formulate a "constant dao ." This critique takes the form of metaethics -- a study of the nature or metaphysics of dao ways as well as daos knowability, objectivity and the pragmatics of dispute about dao. This strategy generates a distinctive analysis of key normative concepts of Ancient China. See the section Important Daoist Concepts.

Philosophical Daoist interest in dao ways:guides is thus distinct from the first-order normative focus of Confucians and Mohists, who certainly used the word dao as often as did the classical Daoist thinkers. We distinguish Daoism here as meta-theorizing rather than direct advocacy of some first-order dao . Often the reflections have (or seem to have) implications for how to choose which first-order dao to follow (or whether to abandon all of them). Meta-reflection constitutes the umbrella that covers this wide range of first-order options that includes nihilism, relativism, skepticism, intuitionism, mysticism, primitivism, value contrarianism and naturalist stoicism. Echoes of all these can be found in both texts -- often, as we noted, as if the writers are unable to make up their own minds what follows from their philosophical ascent to meta-critique. The metaethical views also motivate first-order political daos, e.g., daos of suspicion of political authority (anarchism), social convention and traditional mores. The philosophical focus usually construes Daoism as a meta-level challenge to Confucianism, while the religious treats it as a sibling -- with similar emphasis on cultivation, direct intuition, sages and a prosaic interest only in enunciating an alternative first-order normative dao.

[Return to Index]

2. Philosophical Daoism: A Primer

Ancient Chinese thinkers discussed mainly three species of dao: human (or social) dao, tian natural dao, and great dao. When I instruct you to put your hand on your partner's head, I am delivering a bit of human dao. Natural dao (often translated heavenly dao) is akin to what we would consider the constancies of science. It is the way things reliably happen. Great dao refers to the entire actual history of space and time -- whatever has happened, is happening or will eventually happen in the universe is part of great dao. (A form of determinism might treat tian dao and great dao as identical -- the laws of nature make only one world history possible. Technically, however, Great dao is simply the counterpart of Wittgenstein's "All that is the case.")

Daoist philosophers typically express their doubts about various human dao (paradigmatically Confucian dao) by considering them in relation to natural dao and/or great dao (the actual dao). This works mainly because ancient Chinese moralists tended to treat tian nature:sky as the authority for their human daos. Mature Daoist analysis centers on the insight that while human daos are normative, neither the natural nor the actual dao are. Natural dao and Great dao are "constant" while human dao are inherently changeable and subject to interpretation. This insight is most famously expressed in the first line of the Daode Jing "dao guides that can dao guide are not constant dao guides.

One shared feature of the ru-mo Confucian-Mohist debate was their appeal to the normative authority of tian nature:sky as endorsing their respective daos. Daoists aver that nature does not authorize or endorse any particular social dao. This claim has two versions (pluralist & primitivist). Denying that it endorses a particular one is compatible with its endorsing either many or none. To answer none and still treat tian nature:sky as the normative authority generates a conflict between human and natural dao . Since the metaphysical type of human dao is guiding discourse, this line of thought motivates Daoist "silence" -- the notorious reluctance to use language.

The Zhuangzi strain, informed by contact with Chinese philosophy of language, recognized that a blanket anti-language position was self-censuring. Their pluralist reading is that all de facto rival practices are natural daos in virtue of their being actual practices. Human daos in general are a part of natural dao . That they "are walked" shows they are, in that sense, compatible with natural constancies. Similarly, all actual rival daos are part of great dao simply in virtue of being followed -- as the Zhuangzi says, "daos are made by walking them".

Both pluralist and primitivist Daoism would reject the Confucian-Mohist assumption that political authority should bring about a harmony of daos -- making everyone follow a single dao. The social world survives as well (or better) when people follow different ways of life. Focus on either tian nature:sky dao or Great dao thus undermines the sense that it is imperative to master any particular first-order dao.

The primitivist version of Daoism, however, typically takes the form that nature does endorse a particular normative dao, albeit not a human one (particularly one in discourse form). There is a single, constant, correct way of life that cannot be expressed or presented in practices, rules, narratives, maps, examples, songs or any other human or social form of communication and advocacy. Though we usually think in terms of the natural dao, there could, in principle, be multiple, equally natural and "primitive" daos.

The contrarian version expresses itself via deliberate flaunting or "reversing" all the norms and attitudes in the conventional dao. Laozi's is the most famous example of this dao of reversal, though overtones can be found in Zhuangzi's description of "the perfect" person or ability as one that is so incomprehensible and so irrelevant to our concerns that he appears as the opposite whatever we normally respect. The political consequence is still a government guided by a discourse dao -- the systematic reversal of the dominant Confucian dao.

Relativist (pluralist) or skeptical versions need not deny that that there are norms for endorsing some daos over others, but would observe that the norms of endorsing a dao constitute a distinct dao that is presupposed. It, by hypothesis, is also both natural and "actual." Relativism may deserve the ‘Daoist’ appellation on the further ground that it entails that normative authority comes from dao not from the Confucian-Mohist tian nature:sky. It's not that we should flaunt or violate nature, but that, in principle, we can't. Hence, "follow nature" is empty (tautological) as a normative guide -- a dao that does not dao. Whatever dao we choose will be a natural one, in virtue of being one we can choose and "walk".

The naturalist, mystical, and intuitionist versions similarly draw differently nuanced conclusions from this analysis of the role of daos in nature and actual history. Intuitionism tends toward the religious strain's claim of special epistemic access, but could be developed in a egalitarian way. Naturalism is inherently more egalitarian while mysticism's implications are unclear. Daoist mysticism tends toward what some call "external" mysticism. It arises from these reflections on the context sensitivity and normative complexity of dao rather than on some "inner" experience as of an inexpressible "oneness." If combined with some doctrine of a particular (discourse or non-discourse) dao, it tends to foster religious claims of superlative "access" to a mystically "correct" penetration of the complexity -- though it may still claim that the insight is equally accessible to everyone.

Despite the divergence in these versions of Daoism, all can claim to underwrite a theme of harmony with nature -- the pluralist seeing the point of such harmony as permissive & tolerant, the primitivist seeing it as a more intolerant rejection or prohibition of any conventional dao and so forth.

Metaphysically, Daoism is naturalistic in that any first-order dao must be rooted in nature.

[Return to Index]

3. The Origins of Daoism

Much of the thrust of Daoism, as we have seen, naturally motivates a reaction against the moralistic and elitist inclinations of Confucianism. Confucianism stood for a rigid, detailed, traditional pattern of hierarchical social behavior. Duties were assigned to all of one's roles -- and a person typically had many such roles, e.g., husband, father, minister, younger brother, teacher, student, etc. One could escape this heavy scheme of obligations mainly in retirement or, paradoxically, the traditional duty to spend three years "in mourning" for the death of one's father. The withdrawal from society the antipathy toward ritual roles, traditional "morality," and any social structures or traditional culture suggests a kind of Daoist "ethos" as an antithesis to Confucianism in China. We can trace the origin of Daoism, accordingly, in two ways. One is attitudinal, the other theoretical. The theoretical mark of Daoism is an interest in the meaning or nature of dao which may inform or encourage Daoist attitudes. In view of the religious strain, however, we have to recognize two attitudes as marks of proto-Daoism in China. The first is the vague reaction against the demanding scheme of traditional Confucian rules. The second is interest in techniques for cultivating the adept to achieve an elevated epistemic status resulting in with some special or transcendent access to a dao that is impenetrable to those who have not had this "cultivation."

3.1 Attitudinal Daoism I: Anarchism

Traditionally scholars have traced the first "Daoist spirit" back to "proto-Daoist" hermits who sporadically crop up in the Analects, confronting Confucius and his disciples as they traveled to or fled from various rulers. Their approximate message was an early version of Yangist purification by withdrawal from society. Robert Eno[3] argues that Confucius himself had a heavy dose of this "Daoist" attitude and his "political" theory was actually a justification of his staying remote from government -- at least until a sage is in power! This attitude tends to be expressed as anti-moral or amoral mainly because it targets a Confucian conception that systematically elides morality and conventional mores. It also seems to include some of the attitudes that let to the agriculturalists with their opposition to the division of labor the differential social status and ranks to which it gives rise. These are early manifestations of egalitarianism and the value of impartiality.

Mencius attacks another candidate for this "proto-Daoist" status. According to Mencius, Yang Zhu advocated a kind of ethical egoism and derived from it an opposition to society and politics. Graham has influentially (and controversially) reconstructed Yang Zhu's ideas, but they significantly do not include any meta-theorizing about the nature or meaning of dao. Like Mozi's attack on Confucianism, the Yangist thrust is mainly the proposal of a (shocking!) rival first order normative dao -- egoism. Yangist attitudes are evident in the Laozi and huge chunks of the "outer chapters" of the Zhuangzi. At its core is a worry that social conventions and structures (including mores) damage our natural spontaneity and interfere with efficient functioning of our natural powers.

3.2 Attitudinal Daoism II: Authoritative Intuition

Others credited as precursors of Daoism seemed to share with Mencius the confidence that they had achieved some non-linguistic or intuitive access to a dao guide that resists "ordinary" formulation (and vitiates the need for interpretation with its associated inconstancies). The Confucian value of ren humanity may be the first instance of this tendency. Anti-language intuitionists disagreed with each other about who else had such access, about what the intuited dao required and about the best method of cultivating this special access to dao guidance. Some scholars cite evidence of early interests in breath control, fasting, hallucinogenic drugs and perhaps even meditation. Others suggest that Yogic techniques were already transmitted from India. The epistemic commitment these hypotheses impute to their proto-Daoists, however, is that these techniques help achieve superlative epistemic access to the correct normative dao guide. Usually this access was direct and unmediated by language or culture. So they might echo the anarchists rejection of rules or principles but for quite different reasons, i.e., that they can neither formulate nor inferentially defend the intuitively "correct" dao.

These seemingly contradictory attitudinal streams leading to Daoism may come together in being equally compatible with the anarchist, egalitarian and even philosophically skeptical Daoism. One strategy is to treat the skeptical passages as directed at "ordinary" or Confucian or linguistic claims to access, not at the mystical, direct, transcendent or otherwise superlative access of Daoist sages. It may further reduce the tension by taking the mystical dao to be an egalitarian or anti-authoritarian one.[4]

No doubt a general trend of "authoritarian intuitionism" does have roots in classical thinking -- clearly evidenced in Warring States Confucians (Mencius and Xunzi) as well as sections of proto-Legalists such as the Guanzi (Nei-ye Inner work and Xin-shu heart-mind arts) and arguably a component of Huang-Lao ruler worship. Religious interpretations take these to be the real forerunners of Daoism. The argument could be bolstered with evidence of experimentation with techniques that produce strange experiences. The attraction to special or supernatural access to knowledge of dao could coexist, as noted above, with a disinclination to claim special implicit authority -- to treat the insight as shared by all humans. When combined with an assumption of privileged access and when it claims authority, the esoteric special access position frees the "master" of an inner cultivation technique from accountability. He need neither defend nor answer for his judgment nor need he justify imposing his dao on the rest of us. A characteristically religious excuse for coercive indoctrination is available. After "proper cultivation," the rebellious person would "see" and appreciate their wisdom in thus coercing him. Thus the Huang-Lao tradition could mesh with the authoritarian Confucian and Legalist elites who dominated the Han.

With the Mawang Dui discovery (see Texts and Textual Theory) came more evidence of Huang-Lao theory. Just how far back its history extends into the classical period remains controversial. It was highly influential in the Qin and Han, when it seemed to be highly favored by the superstitious rulers. Han historians categorized many of the figures in the Daoist history as students of Huang-Lao. Many scholars have come to believe the Laozi stems from forerunners of this cult. The arguments are inconclusive, necessarily so since Laozi remains (for most) a mythical figure. Neither the Laozi nor the Zhuangzi ever clearly grounds its reasoning on claims of a direct mystical access or insight. In any case, the ambiguous style of both texts comports poorly with the implicit authoritarianism of the religious movement. We have little reason to think any proto-yogic techniques could have initiated or explained the sophisticated philosophical understanding of dao.

Ultimately, the question is whether assertions of Daoist intuitionism would or would not be refuted by the skeptical arguments that Zhuangzi directed against the Confucians. Given their similarities, it's difficult to imagine how these religious conclusions could escape his analysis. Modern champions of irrationalist Daoism would not be disturbed by this inconsistency, of course, since, they allege, that Daoists refuse to think logically.

3.3 Pre-Laozi Daoist Theory

The earliest known "history of thought" in ancient China is Chapter 33 of the Zhuangzi. It surveys trends of thought leading from the "ancients" (the Chinese golden age"?) to Zhuangzi. After introducing the ancient dao it implies a "fall," then lists a series of groups of thinkers leading to Laozi's group and finally to Zhuangzi. The list takes key thinkers to be motivated by goals of neutrality, universality, freedom from bias and natural "spontaneity" in action. The list starts a group that includes Mozi (universal, impartial utilitarians), then discusses anti-conventionalists headed by Song Xing, third came Shen Dao's group (metaphysical anti-knowledge stoics), then Laozi and Zhuangzi. It bitterly dismisses Zhuangzi's friend and frequent philosophical debating companion, Hui Shi along with the school of names as if he were irrelevant to understanding Zhuangzi's thought. Thus we must use this history cautiously and here I will use this internal history but temper it with external accounts, and demur from this last, counter-intuitive, historical re-writing.

Initially, it is a surprise to see Mozi listed as a "forerunner" of Daoism since in many respects, Daoist takes their dispute with Confucianism as its main target. However, in both attitudinal and theoretical senses, Daoism could be said to have roots in the anti-Confucian Mozi (5th Century BC). First, his early challenge to Confucianism initiated higher level philosophical reflections on dao, its role and the kind of thinking it involved. Mozi, for example, theorized that a dao should be constant, not a matter of a special history or arbitrary social convention. He supported his use of a utilitarian standard to evaluate social daos on grounds of the impartiality and constancy of the benefit-harm distinction. He taught this "constant" feature of utilitarianism was evidence that it was tian nature's standard.

Mozi's challenge to Confucianism focused on his crucial philosophical realization that our own traditional norms do not warrant taking traditions as correct. Mozi thus launched the meta-search for a way (a dao ) impartially to select a first-order dao. He first formulates the goal of unbiased, universality in morality. Both of these results, further, involved important theoretical insights into the concept of dao. The Mohists developed much of the terminology of analysis that other Chinese thinkers, including Mencius and Zhuangzi, adopted. (See Concepts.) Zhuangzi deployed the language to undermine all moral authority.

However, Mohism did directly advocate a first order normative dao and followed Confucianism in the assumption that an orderly society needs to follow a single constant dao. Though they developed an account of how to justify a dao and first formulated the standard of dao adequacy (constancy), they did not directly address the nature of a dao nor did they exhibit much worry about whether such a dao was knowable. They disagreed with Confucianism mainly on the content of the dao guide to be imposed on society by authority. Theoretical Daoism focused on the insolubility of this ru-mo Confucian-Mohist debate.

We know far less of the doctrine of the next "step" in the development -- Song Xing. Our main sources are the Zhuangzi description here and a lengthy attack on Song Xing in the Xunzi . He is said to have specialized in a theory of the xin heart-mind and to have argued that destructive values are injected into the heart by socialization and conventional attitudes. Song Xin developed the idea that conventional values incite competition and violence and the way to order is to get people to simplify their heart's ambitions. The heart's qing naturaldesires are relatively few and easy to satisfy. Socialization creates a plethora of desires for "social goods" such as status, reputation, and pride. Socialized values create the attitudes of resentment and anger. If we can remember that being insulted (conventionally) is no (real) disgrace, we can eliminate the violence occasioned by "honor and moral rectitude." In effect, names will never hurt me.

This theme is developed with great skill in Laozi's Daode Jing and it has roots in Mozi's search for impartiality and universality without presupposing changeable social values. Mozi had also explained the source of conflict as the clash of moral ideals, but advocated unifying the concept rather than abandoning it. Zhuangzi built on the same view -- that people develop different moral attitudes from different natural upbringings. Each treats his own views as obvious and natural. Zhuangzi adopts a closely related view of the xin heart-mind in his own writing. So we can see a role for Song Xing in the development, but we still find little indication of meta-reflection on the concept of dao itself in his contribution to the theory of xin heart-mind and socialized attitudes.

The first plausible candidate for a theoretical Daoist comes next in the Zhuangzi historical survey. We will select Shen Dao as representative of this group of scholars. He is sometimes included in the list of Huang-Lao thinkers and cited as a source of Legalist thinking. We will not attempt here to reconcile this latter with the essentially Daoist view presented in the Zhuangzi history.

Shen Dao's theory (perhaps unwittingly) lays the foundation for Daoism's rejecting the authority of tian nature:sky in favor of dao guide:way. (In religious language, we can describe this as worshipping daoguide rather than tian nature:sky.) The insight that (like God and Nature) appeal to tian nature:sky is normatively empty. All authority presupposes some dao guide. Other theorists appeared to be noticing the same problem. The clearest of these is the Later Mohists5] who first seemed to realize that the appeal to tian nature:sky could justify the thief as well as the sage. Here is the Zhuangzi account of Shen Dao:

For the general public, not cliques; changing and without selfishness; decisive but without any control; responsive to things without dividing in two. Not absorbed with reflection. Not calculating in knowing how. Not choosing among natural kinds and flowing along with them.

They took bonding all the natural kinds together as the key. They said, "tian nature:sky constancies can cover but cannot sustain; Earthly cycles can sustain but cannot cover it. Great dao guide can embrace it but cannot distinguish it." We know the myriad natural kinds all have both that which is acceptable and that which is unacceptable. So they said, "If you select then you cannot be comprehensive, if you teach you cannot convey all of it. Daoguide does not leave anything out."

Hence Shen Dao "abandoned knowledge and discarded ‘self’." He flowed with the inevitable and was indifferent to natural kinds … . He lived together with shi and fei, mixed acceptable and avoidable. He didn't treat knowing and deliberation as guides, didn't know front from back. He was indifferent to everything.

If he was pushed he went, if pulled he followed -- like a leaf whirling in the stream, like a feather in a wind, like dust on a millstone. He was complete and distinguished (fei) nothing … . So he said, "reach for being like things without knowledge of what to do. Don't use worthies and sages. Even a clod of earth cannot miss Dao."

The worthy officials all laughed at him and said, "Shen Dao's dao does not lead to the conduct of a living man but the tendency of a dead man. It is really very strange … ." (Zhuangzi Ch. 33)

Shen Dao's great dao is only actual history of everything and there is just one such history -- one actual past and one actual future. The actual is natural so the great dao (the natural pattern of behaviors, events and processes) requires no learning, no knowledge, no language or shi-fei this-not this distinctions. "Even a clod of earth cannot miss the great dao ."

Shen Dao's insight undermines all these guiding schemes that claim tian nature's approval as justification. The crucial implication of his approach is that great dao has no normative force. To say "follow great daoguide" is as trivial as "do what you do." When we think of dao as the actual course of all nature, it is obvious we will follow it.

On this reasoning, Shen Dao adopted a stoic attitude. His slogan was "abandon knowledge; discard self." "Abandon knowledge" means do not guide your behavior using prescriptive discourse -- a learned dao guide. "Discard self" would mean to discard even Yang Zhu's discourse of self-preservation. Egoistic guidance is also a dao guide and similarly based on a right-wrong or normative, guiding distinction between ‘self’ and ‘other.’ It recommends a particular possible future history. So to abandon knowledge is to discardself’ as a prescriptive term -- to give up using ‘self-other’ as a guiding distinction. Yangzhu's egoism violates Shen Dao's anti-language naturalism as much as does Confucius's traditionalism or Mozi's utilitarianism.

Why does Shen Dao think we should give up guiding ourselves by shared moral prescriptions? His stoicism and some of his reasoning suggests that like the Stoics, he was a fatalist. However Shen Dao's argument has no basis beyond simply logical determinism "what will be will be." The account above has no hint of a theory of causal laws, neither of predictability nor of knowledge of the future. It says nothing here about free will, but Shen Dao does advocate something like giving up moral responsibility. We should not make shi-fei this-not this judgments. Consequently, he can not be saying that we should follow the Great Dao, because that would be to shi this:right whatever actually happens. He avoids this inconsistency and thus is not committed to the Stoic view that the natural/actual course of events is rational or good. It simply is.

In using the notion of the actual dao to motivate avoiding any prescriptive discourse, Shen Dao is saying to Confucians and Mohists, "if you are speaking for the nature of things, you need not say anything!" Nature does not prescribe.

What about Shen Dao's naturalism itself, however? Is it not itself another guide, a doctrine that he has managed to put into yan language? And, is it not natural for humans to use language in coordinating and ordering their interactions, accumulating and transmitting knowledge? "Abandon knowledge" amounts to a prescriptive paradox. The concept of knowledge it uses is prescriptive knowledge. In form and intent, it is a prescription -- a dao guide. If we obey it, we disobey it. This is our first example of Daoist paradox! Shen Dao's dao guide is a dao guide that can't dao guide us.

The Zhuangzi history where we find this account of Shen Dao's doctrine, seems critical of Shen Dao's position along similar lines. Still, it moves from Shen Dao to Laozi in it's explanation of the evolution of thought that leads to Zhuangzi. Laozi produces a different line of reasoning for "abandon knowledge." He abandons the fatalist grounds -- and implicitly, therefore, the concept of great dao as a guide (though he keeps a version of tian nature's dao). We can view Laozi as combining Song Xing and Shen Dao. His reason to "abandon knowledge" is that knowledge is a form of social control that instills unnatural desires, stimulates unnatural action and constrains and distorts natural freedom or spontaneity. The Zhuangzi ordering is theoretically coherent, though perhaps chronologically inaccurate.

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4. Dao and Names: The Laozi or Daode Jing

We will discuss, here, only the contributions the Laozi makes to the Daoist dialectic. For a more complete and detailed treatment of the philosophy of the text, see the entry under Laozi.

The Zhuangzi history lists Laozi (along with Guan Yin) between Shen Dao and Zhuangzi. Whatever its actual date and manner of composition, the Laozi plays a part in the development of Daoist thought that best fits there. The most famous line of Daoist meta-theory of dao opens the Daode Jing. "Dao that can be dao-ed is not constant dao." Though the text betrays no hint of exposure to the School of Names, this famous slogan is duplicated with ming name replacing dao. Thus it shifts the focus of meta-discourse about dao to the issue of the language used in dao -ing. Since language is not constant, no dao that can be conveyed using symbols can be.

What is being denied in saying such dao are not constant? The text does not explain this, but the issue in ancient Chinese thought can be traced back to the Confucian Analects’ notion of "rectifying names." A name is rectified when an instruction containing it (a ritual or a law) correctly guides peoples action. "If names are not rectified … people will not know how to move hand or foot."[6] The typical Confucian way of rectifying a name is to set an example -- either of correct use of the term or correct action in following a dao that contains the term.

So what is Laozi denying when he is made to say "names that can be named are not constant names?" The skepticism here can be read in two ways. One is there is no correct way to use a name and the other is, no pattern of right past use uniquely determines what counts as correct use here and now. So, as Mozi had argued, tradition cannot determine correctness, but the Laozi seems to add even if tradition is correct.

The negative result may be read in several ways.

  1. It may be pure nihilism -- there is no such thing as correct dao.
  2. It may be skepticism -- the correct dao can never be known,
  3. or as anti-language -- The correct dao cannot be put in words or conveyed as guidance to another.

The second and third are compatible with their being a correct dao and the third even with someone's knowing it. It simply cannot be conveyed. The rest of the text -- the very fact that there is more to the text -- makes these two readings, particularly the last, the most common ones. However the traditional story of Laozi undermines the argument for placing too much emphasis on the fact that after this opening stanza, he goes on to write a text. It suggests that he writes only because compelled to do so by the keeper of the pass.

Adopting the latter interpretations doesn't remove the paradox. Laozi is still left with a version of Shen Dao's "abandon knowledge" position. The text, however, does develop a different motivation for it. We find few traces of Shen Dao's stoic reasoning. Laozi's opposition to knowledge derives more from Song Xing's insights about how social knowledge shapes our values and desires. So we attribute to the Laozi a theory of pragmatics, how language shapes action.

Laozi talks mainly of name (word) pairs -- opposites. Naming is analogous to "carving." (The symbol of the nameless is pusimplicity an uncarved block of wood.) When we learn the way to use a word (e.g. watching teachers "rectify" names) we adopt an institutional practice of "cutting" things and assigning names to them in acting. With the names we acquire a value or desire for one of the discriminants. The desires then shape our wei deeming:action.

Much of the reasoning attributed to Laozi here follows that of Song Xing. The artificially created desires lead to unnecessary competition and strife. When we see that they are not natural, acquiring socialized desires (e.g. for status, reputation, for rare objects) starts to look ill advised. He hints at places that acquiring the system of names dulls our capacity for appreciation or reaction to nature ("the five colors blind the eye…").[7] And most important, acquiring knowledge in this way is losing the natural spontaneity and becoming subject to social control.

The text, accordingly, entices us to free ourselves from this system signified by the slogan wu-wei lack-action. We are to set about forgetting all our socialization and return to the state of a newborn babe. The slogan is famously paradoxical and is even formulated in the text in a paradoxical way -- "lack acting and yet lack ‘don't-act’."

The bulk of the Daode Jing is thus given over to motivating this paradoxical attitude. Its essential strategy for doing this centers on the notion of "reversal." In passage after passage, advice is given that reverses the values usually taken for granted in social (Confucian-Mohist) discourse -- either rejecting the usual positive value term or motivating valuing the opposite (non-being, water, the female, the lower position etc.).

The result is a fascinating exercise in normative advocacy even including a political theory -- which you can find elaborated more fully in the main entry. Clearly, the advocacy is inconsistent with the meta-theory and its purpose must be indirect -- perhaps to induce us to "see" one of the three negative positions considered above. Still it gives the text a tone that has come to be known as primitivism -- nullifying socialization and cultivating only the "natural" attitudes and actions.

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5. Impact of the School of Names

As noted above, one stark difference between the two main texts of Daoism is the relation to the School of Names. The Laozi, though clearly using a theory of naming, betrays no exposure to the doctrines nor the analytical terminology developed by the dialectical Mohists for dealing with theory of language. The Zhuangzi, just as clearly, does. So to understand this next phase in the reconstructed development of Daoism, we must note briefly what the issues were and how they were formulated so we can see the implications of Daoist responses -- particularly those found in the Zhuangzi.

The focus on analysis of language (ancient Chinese thinkers tended to treat all words as names) grows out of a recognition of the classical "rectifying names" problem we drew attention to above in explaining the Laozi. The disputes about dao are intimately tied to issues about language -- how it works and, in particular, what is to count as a correct use or interpretation of words found in familiar examples of guidance -- in discourse daos.

The early Mohists found themselves committed to using their utilitarianism in determining the correct use of words as well as in action. "Which dao should we follow" becomes "which words shall we use in socialization, in what order, and under what practical interpretation?" In effect, the early Mohist answer to all three questions is settled by reference to making an allegedly "natural" distinction between benefit and harm. Thus language conventions themselves should be governed by the utility principle.

Later Mohists formulated a more "realistic" theory of what counts as the normatively correct way to use names. We should mark the distinctions that underlie names in ways that trace patterns of objective similarity and difference in things. This realism governs the correct ways both to use terms and to interpret them. We rely on utility to determine how we structure terms into strings in guidance -- in discourse dao . So, for example, a thief is a man -- governed by the rules of similarity. But we still allow guidance that includes both the guiding strings "don't kill men" and "you may kill thieves."

This realism led the later Mohists to linguistic conclusions that challenged any anti-language attitude -- including those expressed by early Daoists. First, the later Mohists argued that in any disagreement about how to distinguish using a name, there was a right answer -- even though it may be hard to know or prove. So, for example, if we are disputing about whether to use "ox" or "non-ox" of some obscure object, one of the answers will be correct. This undermines both the nihilistic and the anti-language options to understanding Laozi. Second, Mohists argued that any attempt to formulate the anti-language position was self condemning. "All language is bad" must be a "bad" thing to say.

Other figures classified in the School of Names responded to the Mohist realists. Gongsun Long (mentioned sporadically in the Zhuangzi) took himself to be defending Confucian accounts of rectifying names and Hui Shi constructs what looks like a relativist challenge to Later Mohist accounts. We will look only at Hui Shi's account here because he plays such a significant role in the text of the Zhuangzi .

Hui Shi implicitly addressed the claim that the correct use of words depends on objective patterns of similarity and difference. What we know of his writings (which the Zhuangzi history suggests were truly prodigious) is mainly a sequence of theses cited in at same Zhuangzi history. These focused on propositions about comparative "names" -- e.g., large and small. Clearly some things properly termed ‘large’ are objectively smaller than other things properly called ‘small.’ A small elephant is considerably larger than a huge ant! So correct naming must not be based on objective distinctions in the world, but on our projections from a point of view or purpose in using them. Similarly, ‘tall’, ‘short’, and time words (e.g., ‘before’ and ‘after’, ‘today’ and ‘tomorrow’) are implausibly attributed to objective distinctions

From this, according to the list of propositions in the Zhuangzi history, Hui Shi apparently concluded that we can speak of a great "one" that is a kind of everything concept -- nothing lies outside it and of a small "one" which cannot be further distinguished or divided. Objectively there are no distinctions -- the cosmos is one, and we should direct the same guiding attitudes toward the whole -- "love all things equally."

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6. Mature Daoism: The Zhuangzi

From internal evidence, we would judge Hui Shi to have had much more influence on Zhuangzi than any knowledge of Laozi or of the contents of the Daode Jing as we know it. Hui Shi appears more often in dialogue with Zhuangzi than any other figure and in ways that suggest a long-term philosophical involvement and interaction, like relationship of philosophical friends.[8] And, as we observed, the inner chapters of the Zhuangzi show mastery of the technical terminology and state of the art theories of language in ancient China. Still the tone seems "Daoist" in the senses we've identified. Zhuangzi marks the high point of mature Daoist philosophical theory as he finds a better way to answer the later Mohist challenge than did Hui Shi.

Zhuangzi finds a "naturalist" position that explains and makes coherent use of the normative priority of dao over tian nature:sky. The way to avoid the anti-language trap is:

The first may superficially appear to give in to the Confucians and Mohists -- allowing them to claim that their respective ways have tian nature's endorsement. However, its Daoist thrust consists in depriving the absolutists of what they really want -- the ability to declare that their opponent violates tian nature:sky or lacks its similar approval. The strategy draws on the correct lesson to be learned from Shen Dao's notion of great dao -- that "follow nature" has no normative significance.

Normative questions must be answered from within dao, not from nature or authority. Thus Zhuangzi's first step does not warrant treating all discourse dao as right or as wrong -- or even as equal. All normative evaluative judgments can be made only against the background of a presupposed way of making, justifying and interpreting -- they depend on or presupposing some way .

The priority of dao over tian nature:sky underwrites the themes of dependency and relativism that pervade the Zhuangzi and ultimately the skepticism, the open-minded toleration and the political anarchism (or disinterest in political activity or involvement). Yet, while nature is not a standard, Daoism must acknowledge natural daos. Mohism had presupposed one (a natural impulse to benefit) as had the Confucian intuitionist, Mencius (a natural moral tendency in the heart-mind). Zhuangzi's does not deny natural or innate guides, but notes:

  1. There are many such natural ways, and
  2. We presuppose further ways when we choose among natural ones and when we cultivate them in one way rather than another.

So the dependence on dao goes "all the way down." The Zhuangzi summarizes in a famous image, humans live and act in ways as fish live and act in water. We don't notice how, and in how many ways, we depend on ways. Being in a sea of ways is what it is for humans to exist. We cannot get outside of dao to treat it as an object or find an ultimate source or base of its authority.

These meta-reflections inform relativist (perspectival and pluralist) and skeptical themes in the inner chapters of the Zhuangzi. Even the style furthers the two themes. Rather than speaking with an authorial voice, the text is filled with fantasy conversations between perspectives, including those of millipedes, convicts, musicians and the wind. A Zhuangzi reflective passage is likely to end with a double rhetorical question: "is it … or isn't it …?"

Does Zhuangzi then have anything to teach us? His is an example of the key lesson -- open-minded receptivity to all the different voices of dao -- particularly those who have run afoul of human authority or seem least authoritative. Each has insights that may be surprisingly valuable -- viewed from within our own ways. On the flip side, we gain nothing from trying to imagine a perfect or ultimate source of guidance. If there were a perfect man or ideal observer-actor, we probably could not understand him. Would his ways have any relevance for us with our limits? Perfection may well look like its opposite to us.

But the Zhuangzi differs in one important attitude from the Laozi -- we need not try to escape from social life and conventions. Conventions underlie the possibility of communication and are, thus, useful. So Zhuangzi's Daoism has less of the primitive thrust of the Daode Jing (the term wu-wei virtually disappears in the inner chapters).

The most dramatic message of the Zhuangzi is a theme that links Daoism to Zen (Chan -- the distinctively Daoist influenced branch of Buddhism) -- the "mysticism" of losing oneself in activity, particularly the absorption in skilled execution of a highly cultivated way . His most famous example concerns a butcher -- hardly a prestige or status profession -- who carves beef with the focus and absorption of a virtuoso dancer in an elegantly choreographed performance. The height of human satisfaction comes in achieving and exercising such skills with the focus and commitment that gets us "outside ourselves" and into such an intimate connection with our dao .

Other examples include lute players, cicada catchers, wheelwrights and logicians. Each description has a hint of realism in the recognition we must put in effort to acquire the skills and then to convert them to "second nature." We come to see them as natural and as ourselves being at one with nature. Yet in the throes of skillful performance, we still can perfect them more and no matter how good we may become at one thing, may be miserable at others -- particularly at conveying the skills to others.

Finally politically, Zhuangzi famously prefers fishing to high status and political office. He asks what a turtle would choose if offered the option of being nailed in a place of veneration an honor in some place of worship or staying at the lake and "dragging his tail in the mud." However this anti-political stance is unlikely to be simple self-preservation. The openness of Zhuangzi's pluralism does undermine the justification of political authority that was assumed in ancient China. Confucians and Mohists disagreed bitterly about what dao to follow in a society, but agreed without question that proper order was achieved only when a society followed a single dao . Zhuangzi's stance suggests that society could function with people following many ways of acting. Nothing requires suppressing or eliminating a dao that works from some point of view.

The Zhuangzi text, as we noted, contains the writings of a range of thinkers loosely allied with these Daoist themes. Large sections lean toward the primitivism of Laozi and others emphasize the relativism, and still others become eclectic and uncritical in their openness. For a more complete account see the entry on Zhuangzi and Texts and Textual Theory below.

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7. Neo-Daoism

The establishment of an authoritarian empire and the long-lived but philosophically dogmatic (Confucian) Han dynasty temporarily drained the quality from Chinese philosophical thought. Classical Daoist philosophy was successfully extinguished by the imperial suppression of thought that initiated China's philosophical "Dark Age." The institution of Confucianism as the official orthodoxy of the Han cemented the stagnation firmly in place. Only Huang-Lao thinking remained as a live influence mingled in the eclectic Confucian blend.

The fall of the Han saw the emergence a new form of Daoism -- Neo-Daoism (See Neo-Daoism). It's most influential writers, Wang Bi and Guo Xiang who wrote commentaries respectively on the Daode Jing and the Zhuangzi, were avowed Confucians. Their philosophy reinvested a stoic spirit in their new-Daoism embodied in the enduring slogan "Sage within, king without." They understood Daoism as a kind of inner emptiness or non-commitment coupled with a meticulous conformity to one's actual role in the times -- whatever it might be. Thus they were Confucians on the outside and Daoists inside. This elaborated, for them, the concept of wu-wei (non-deeming action).

They buttressed this social stoicism with metaphysical systems focused on the puzzle of "being and non-being" which formed the central issue for their "abstruse studies." Wang Bi (ca. 300) interpreted the Laozi alongside a Confucianized cosmological divination manual, The Book of Changes (I Ching or Yijing). The Book of Changes with its yin-yang account of change and its generational cosmology thus entered the list of Daoist texts and the Daode Jing was transformed in conventional wisdom into a detached cosmology.

Wang Bi identified dao with non-being while still treating it as the source of all creation -- the basic substance (which he associated with the taiji Great ultimate of the Yijing). While the basic substance is nothing, its "function" is being -- thus being depends on non-being, from which it is constantly produced as a kaleidoscopic function of an unchanging, paradoxical reality of nothing. (The ideal Daoist-Confucian person mirrors this cosmology in being a "Sage within; king without".)

The other Neo-Daoist, Guo Xiang commented on the Zhuangzi . His cosmology was an interesting twist on that of Wang Bi. Non-being, he argued, was finally, simply nothing and thus could not create anything. Simply put, there is no non-being -- there is only being. Being comes of itself and generates and changes itself constantly by the totality its own interrelations. These differences in emphasis partly reflect the differences in the original texts -- the Daode Jing's emphasis on wu non-being-values and the Zhuangzi's diverse pluralism and sense of freedom from ultimate cosmic control.

Pragmatically, the two pictures were not very different. Each still had nothing at the center and being around the edges, but with Guo Xiang we have less emphasis on lines of force from non-being to being and more on the relations within the realm of being. He similarly reads his cosmology as "realized" in someone who achieves "sage within, king without."

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8. Daoism and Buddhism

Buddhism came to China at a time when the intellectuals were hungry for fresh ideas, but with massive handicaps. It was saddled with the Indo-European focus on metaphysics and epistemology, with its emphasis on truth, experience, prepositional knowledge, representational belief, a belief-desire psychology with a logic-informed notion of "reason" as a human faculty as well as a property of beliefs. Its arguments had little purchase on Chinese intellectuals and the only available common form of discourse that could "domesticate" this system was the Neo-Daoist "abstruse learning," which focused on the metaphysical notions of being and non-being. That issue resonated well with a Buddhist puzzle about the nature of Nirvana. If Nirvana was the opposite of Samsara (the eternal cycle of rebirth or reincarnation) then was it a state of being or of non-being? Nirvana is the achievement of the Buddha -- the expression of Buddha-nature.

Meantime, Buddhism came armed with a paradox that would delight thinkers of a Daoist turn of mind -- the famous paradox of desire. Rebirth was caused by desire and Nirvana could be achieved only by the cessation of desire. That meant that in order to achieve Nirvana, one had to cease to want to achieve it. This level of the argument informs the Mahayana notion of a Boddhisattva -- the one who qualifies for Nirvana but voluntarily stays behind in the cycle of rebirth to help the rest of us. The Mahayana wing of Buddhism was the more successful in China because its implicit egalitarianism -- everyone could be Buddha, just as everyone can be a Daoist or Confucian Sage.

The other Buddhist philosophy that had the greatest appeal in China was Madyamika, which answered the question of the nature of Nirvana or the Buddha nature by not answering it. The realization was a kind of inexpressible, mystical, special-knowledge. This helped blend discussion of dao and Buddha-nature even more and fueled the conclusion that they were the same.

Meantime, the introduction of a more "Western" religious model (monasticism) to China and coincided with the launch of organized "Daoist" religions. Modeled thus in style and progressively in content, Daoism and Buddhism began to blend.

The two dominant Theoretical Chinese sects of Buddhism reflect the cosmological structures of the two Neo-Daoists. Tian-tai is "center dominated" with a single thought (the inexpressible Madyamika Buddha-nature) determining everything. Hua-yan shifts emphasis to the inter-relations of all "dharmas." It's a cosmos of interaction that constitutes the expression of Buddha nature.

The most Daoist of Chinese sects is famously the Chan (Japanese 'Zen') sect. We can understand its Daoist character by returning to the paradox of desire. Laozi's analysis says artificial desires are those created by learned distinctions. If we are to eliminate the desire for Nirvana, it must be by "forgetting" the dichotomy of Nirvana-Samsara. This corresponds to a mystical answer to the question of the nature of Nirvana and underwrites the Chan emphasis on practice here and now -- "every moment Zen" -- and the signature "realization" that we are already Buddha. The Buddha nature is your self-nature.

The Daoist abandonment of Buddhist theory is accompanied by another traditional Daoist feature -- the emphasis on total absorption in practice of a highly cultivated skill. Chinese Zen was dominated by the notion of "sudden enlightenment" which consists of the denial that any process leads anyone closer to the Buddha-nature. You can't get any closer -- you're just there. Pay attention!

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9. Important Daoist Concepts

Some important concepts that have played a role in the doctrines of Daoism are:

9.1 Dao and de : The Ethical Concepts

9.1.1 Dao (Way, Guide, Road)

Daoism has a reputation of being impenetrable mainly because of its central concept, dao. Yet surprisingly, the almost universal translation in English uses one of the smallest, simplest, most familiar and least consciously noticed terms of the language -- ‘way.’ This common translation, ‘way,’ is apt in several ways. Dao (Tao) is a pivotal concept of ancient Chinese thought. ‘Way’ is similarly primitive (it resists analytic definition). We can only offer synonyms: e.g., ‘course’, ‘method’, ‘manner’, ‘mode’, ‘style’, ‘means’, ‘practice’, ‘fashion’, ‘technique’ and so on. We discover the circularity when we try to analyze one of the synonyms without recourse to the term ‘way’ with which we began.

The partial synonyms, however, remind us of a second way in which ‘way’ is an apt translation of dao. A way is the answer to a "how" or "what-to-do" question. We typically use talk of ways in advising someone. Ways are practical (i.e., prescriptive or normative).

Dao is also used concretely to refer to a road or path in Chinese, e.g., Queen's Road. Again, ‘way’ fits -- as in highway and Broadway. In figurative English use they are interchangeable -- the road/way to salvation. Roads guide us and facilitate our arrival at a desired destination. The are, as it were, prescriptive structures.

Though practical, describing something as a dao or a way need not be to recommend it. The Zhuangzi reminds us that thievery has a dao . We can use both dao and ‘way’ mainly to describe -- as when a Confucian undertakes to pursue his father's dao for three years after his death or we say "I saw the way you did that."

Now for some interesting differences between dao and ‘way’. Chinese nouns lack pluralization, so dao functions grammatically like a singular term and semantically like a plural. The first tempts translators to render each occurrence as "the way." The advice is to treat dao as a collective noun -- as the sum of ways. What we think of as one way would be one part of dao.

Multiplicity emerges in ancient Chinese most clearly when we modify common nouns. So we can talk about, e.g., my-dao, Sage-King's-dao, natural-dao, past-time's-dao and so forth. This feature explains why dao appears more metaphysical than ‘way’ and invites the familiar Daoist spatial metaphors like "humans encounter each other in dao as fish do in water" (Zhuangzi Ch. 6). Dao is a little like the water -- an expanse constituting the realm in which humans live, work and play. To be human is to be in a realm of ways to act/go. Daoists are more likely to play with these metaphysical metaphors than Confucians or Mohists -- who mainly point to (their favored part of) dao.

Another difference is that while both dao and ‘way’ are almost ineliminable terms in their respective languages, Westerner philosophy has hardly noticed the word ‘way.’ It's barely visible in the history of Western philosophy – more like a bit of grammatical filler. Western philosophers have endlessly analyzed and dissected a cluster of terms thought to be central to our thinking, e.g., ‘good’, ‘right’, ‘being’ (to be), ‘know’, ‘believe’, ‘true’, ‘beautiful’, ‘reason’, ‘change’, ‘subject’, ‘mind’, ‘meaning’, ‘refer’, ‘object’, ‘property’, and so forth. Yet one looks in vain to find a Western philosopher showering her analytic attention on the concept of ‘way’.

Dao, by contrast, was the center of Chinese philosophical discussion. It occupies the position at the center of thought that in Western philosophy is filled by terms like ‘being’ or ‘truth’. The centrality tempts interpreters to identify dao with these central concepts of the Western philosophical agenda, but that is to lose the important difference between the two traditions. Metaphysics and epistemology dominated early Western philosophy while ethics, politics and philosophy of education/psychology dominated Chinese thought. Although it's insightful to say humans live in dao as fish do in water, the insight is lost if we simply treat dao as being. Dao remains essentially a concept of guidance, a prescriptive or normative term. In the late Classical period, dao paired with de virtuosity to form the Chinese term for ‘ethics’ "dao-de." Dao is the key to Chinese philosophy -- but it still translates as ‘way’, not ‘being’.

A third difference is that unlike ‘way’, dao may be used as a verb. The best known example is the famous first line of the Daode Jing. Literally "dao can be dao not constant dao." For the dao in the middle of the three daos in the passage, roughly one out of three translators uses ‘speak’, another third use ‘tell’ and the rest use near synonyms such as ‘expressed’, "defined in words", or ‘stated’. In a famous Confucian example of this use, Confucius criticizes dao-ing the people with laws rather than dao-ing them with ritual. (This verbal sense is now often marked by a graphic variation dao to direct).

Throughout classical texts, we find that daos are spoken, heard, forgotten, transmitted, learned, studied, understood and misunderstood, distorted, mastered, and performed with pleasure. Different countries and historical periods have different dao. Footprints of the linguistic component of the concept of dao are scattered through all kinds of modern Chinese compound words. ‘Preach’ is jiang-dao -- speak a dao. To know is to know a dao. The character dao is part of ‘doctrine’ ‘truth’ ‘principle’ ‘law’ and of course, ‘morality’ or ‘ethics’ ‘reason’, ‘religion’, ‘philosophy’ ‘orthodoxy’, ‘thank’ ‘apologize’ ‘tell’ ‘explain’ ‘inform’ and so on.

Is ‘speak’ the right way to translate these verbal uses of dao? It is in some ways too narrow and in others too broad. We can write, gesture, point, and exemplify as well as speak daos. On the other hand, not all speaking (writing etc.) is dao-ing -- particularly not if we think of language as describing, representing, picturing, expressing, defining, or "capturing" some reality. The Chinese verbal use, is more accurately translated normatively as "to guide" or to "recommend." The activity of dao-ing is primarily giving advice. To dao is to put guidance into language -- including body language.

Consider, again, the concrete translation for dao: ‘road’ or ‘path’. A woodsman with an ax daos when he chops bark from the trees as he enters the forest; He is dao-ing when "blazing" the trail. We must avoid regarding roads as simple natural objects -- they are, like the woodman's blazes, akin to texts that we "read" for guidance as we proceed on our way. Roads or paths are embodied in physical reality, but are not simply the reality. They are normative guides and "invitations" to "pass this way".

One feature that dao and speech share is the need for interpretation. But with dao the interpretation is in xing conduct, not in a theory or a belief. In this respect, the relevant notion of interpretation is the aesthetic one -- as when a conductor interprets a score or an actor a character in a play. A complete metaphysics of dao involves a distinction between normative way types and interpretive tokens . Daoist theory does so most dramatically with Shen Dao who focuses on the great way -- the actual history of the world past, present and future. That image draws our attention to a purely descriptive way -- a way that is not a way (not a guide).

To talk, however, about a way of interpreting a way, is to remind ourselves of Zhuangzi's point. That we can never make ways purely objective. In selecting it from the alternative "invitations" open to us, and then in interpreting in our actual "walking" we have relied on still some other dao from the one that has our attention. We forget we are in a sea of dao .

Besides the actual dao, we can speak of tian nature:sky ways that are also descriptive. We still presuppose dao in choosing not to "reform" or "compensate" for our nature (as we do in choosing to follow it). Whichever dao we rely on is, presumably, itself natural at least in the sense of being naturally available ways of choosing and interpreting -- as are all the real alternatives.

9.1.2 De (Virtuosity, Virtue, Power)

A Daoist formula for de is "dao within." Translators most commonly use "virtue" as a translation but hurry to remind us that it is ‘virtue’ in the ancient Greek sense of an excellence. ‘Power’ is an alternative translation that reflects the link between de and successful action or achievement for its possessor. Given the importance of aesthetics in Chinese accounts of dao, we may think of de as ‘virtuosity.’ Virtuosity exhibits itself in a performer by making his "interpretation" of the thing performed (a ceremony, chant or ritual) work in the context. Thus de links dao with correct performance. This explains the overtones of "power" as the performer's ability to respond to clues in the context that make the performance "work."

9.2 Ming (Name)

The character ming names really includes all words. (Grammatically, Chinese common nouns share more features with proper names than is the case in familiar Indo-European languages.) The translation ‘name’ is still close in content. The simple reason is that ancient Chinese theorists of language thought of all words as naming the segment of reality which the word "picked out" -- roughly what we think of as its denotation or range. Thus ‘white’ is a name and ‘horse’ is a name. Each names a scattered region of the world.

The most familiar statement of a widely shared implicit theory of names in ancient China is expressed beautifully in the Daode Jing . Call it the "contrast theory" of names. It treats all words (norms or values) as "coming with" a complement, converse of opposite. To learn and understand a word is to know what is and what is not picked out by it. In the Daode Jing, the theory tends toward a linguistic idealist conclusion. Names literally "create" things. This line of interpretation informs the "chaos" interpretation of Daoist metaphysics in which reality is an undifferentiated stuff which humans divide into "things" by the use of ming names.

An interesting near homonym is ming fate which is commonly used as a verbal form of ming names. It may be translated as ‘command’ (reminding us of the Chinese view that the role of language and names is guiding and coordinating behavior) and as ‘fate.’ Another is ming discern-discriminate which is typically rendered as "clarity" in the Zhuangzi.

9.3 Chang (Constant, Eternal)

There is little controversy about the meaning of chang constant, but its uses and importance in Chinese thought are not well understood. Someone familiar with causal reliability theories in philosophy will more easily appreciate the uses of chang constant in ancient Chinese. The Daode Jing has a famous example of such uses -- modifying dao and ming names. Hu Shih speculated that in this use, chang constant was a counterpart of ‘true.’ He pointed to a related use in the Mozi which advocates that we should chang constant language that promotes [good?] behavior.

Mohist use of the concept is instructive. Tian nature:sky is a paradigm of constancy. The Mohists alluded to its regularity and universality to contrast with the temporary and local authority of social conventions and guidance by authority. They cast their disagreement with Confucians in terms of who offered a constant dao. This seems to bridge two measures of constancy.

  1. A constant dao should apply equally to people of all cultures, times, and levels of social development.
  2. A constant dao should be operationally unambiguous -- like measurements operations. Its interpretation into action should not invite irregularity.
  3. A constant dao should be consistent with natural tendencies so it reinforces and draws reinforcement from them rather than resistance in practice.

Daoists, as the Laozi famously puts it, suggest that any dao that can dao (guide or be used as a guide) will not be a constant dao. It follows this claim with a parallel claims about ming names. Any name that can name is an inconstant name. This is arguably offered as the explanation of the inconstancy of dao asserted in the earlier sentence.

9.4 Wei & Wu-wei (Deeming Action & Non-deeming Action)

Laozi's famous slogan has puzzled interpreters for centuries and has given rise to numerous analyses. The first character is not the main problem. Wu is simply "does not exist." In this phrase, however, interpreters treat it as a negative prescription: "avoid wei." The harder problem is to understand wei.

Textbook interpretations say wei means "purpose." In modern Mandarin, the character has two different tones. The fourth tone reading is usually translated as "for the sake of." In the second tone reading, the character would normally be translated as ‘to act’. Thus, translators argue, wu-wei really means no purposive action. The second tone reading, however, has another important use. Some grammar textbooks call it the putative sense -- "to deem, regard or interpret." Wei functions in this sense in Literary Chinese belief ascriptions. Wei also figures in a related way in some knowledge contexts -- "know to deem as …".

Ancient Chinese has several meaning-related homonyms, including wei is-only, wei to be called, and wei artificial which adds a ‘human’ radical to wei do:deem. Typical translations of this character include ‘artificial’ or ‘false’. The cluster of concepts correspond to the pivotal Daoist contrast between tian (nature) and ren (the human). Wei is something done by human conceptualizing rather than something "natural." If we include this content in our explanation of Laozi's use of wei, we can explain its role more fully than simply lacking ‘purpose’ or deliberation. Little in the Laozi (or earlier Chinese thought) suggests any development of a distinction between voluntary, deliberate, or purposive action and its opposite. To act without wei is to remove the conceptual character from our behavior and act on "sheer" instinct or intuition.

As we noted, the "inner chapters" of the Zhuangzi rarely mentions the slogan. However, its use in the "outer chapters" invites us to construct a possible Zhuangzi version of the slogan. One tempting view associates wu-wei with the "inner chapter" discussions of skillful behavior that develops into a kind of satisfying and tranquil state of harmony with action that we might describe as "second nature." In effect one acts while in an aesthetic or performative trance. The most famous expression of this ideal comes in the paean to the butcher who carved oxen with the grace of a dancer. Such behavior requires a focus and absorption that is incompatible with ordinary self-consciousness, purpose and rehearsal of instructions. We experience mastery as "becoming one with the activity." In some sense, our weiing has become natural!

The wu-wei ideal also informs the Neo-Daoist slogan "Sage within; king without." It suggests (following Zhuangzi) that Daoist wu-wei may be consistent with being a good Confucian. Being a scholar-official is as much a skill as being a butcher and one may practice it with the same attitude of inner emptiness. As long as one takes the "right" attitude, one may pursue any activity consistent with Daoism. Neo-Daoists conform to Confucian roles without regarding or interpreting them as ultimately right -- or as anything else.

With the importation of Indo-European Buddhism from India, wu-wei started to be interpreted via the Western conceptual apparatus contrasting desire or purpose and reason. This shaped the modern Chinese interpretation and probably undermined the ideal. It became the target of attack among "modern" Chinese who regarded Daoist "non-striving" or "purposelessness" as the source of Chinese passivity. The activist 19th century reformer, Kang You-wei (Kang have-wei) took the denial of the slogan as his scholarly name.

9.5 Pu simplicity (Pre-linguistic Purity)

The Daoist "primitivist" ideal as expressed mainly in the Laozi. It stands for the result of forgetting ming names and desires (See Wu-wei). The most "detailed" translation is D. C. Lau's "nameless uncarved block." This translation captures Laozi's account of the Daoist contrast theory of language according to which names or language divides things. When societies adopt names or terms, it does so in order to instill and regulate desires for one of the pair created by the name-induced distinction. Thus Daoist forgetting requires forgetting names and distinctions, but in doing so, frees itself from the socially induced, unnatural desires that cause strife and unhappiness in society (e.g. status, rare objects, fame, authority). Thus, "The Nameless uncarved block thus amounts to freedom from desire." (Daode Jing 37)

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10. Texts and Textual History

Questions of textual theory are the focus of the bulk of modern scholarship. They include these kinds of questions.

Traditional "fantastic" textual stories dominated explanations of religious Daoism. This effectively replaces philosophical content with mythical narrative and claims of pedigree or status of the founder. This aversion to exposition is compounded with the traditional view that Daoist philosophy defies rational clarification. This philosophical site, accordingly, will give only abbreviated attention to these textual theories.

The traditional story centers on Laozi and the Daode Jing. It credits the text to Laozi who was stopped at the pass while attempting to leave China (to go to India and come to be known as Buddha). The keeper of the pass required him to leave his dao behind so Laozi dashed off 5000 quick characters of poetry. Zhuangzi inherited the insights and developed the Daoist outlook in parable form.

Modern text detectives, Chinese and Western, have successfully cast doubt on this traditional view. However, their alternative scenarios, while collectively more plausible than the traditional story, are diverse enough to lead a skeptic to conclude that no one knows the correct textual theories -- even if some of them out to be true. The time is too remote and the evidence too scarce to warrant using "know" of any detailed textual theory.

Textual theorists themselves tend more toward interpretive skepticism. They argue that textual theory is prior to and more certain than interpretation -- which they treat as subjective projection. They would reject textual skepticism as defeatism and as self-defeating for an interpretive theorist.

Current textual thinking tends toward the view that all the classical Chinese texts were being continuously edited and maintained in textual communities over sometimes hundreds of years. This editing and emendation often reflected interaction with other text communities as they worked out alternative answers to shared questions. Clearly such an accretion theory undermines the traditional goal of uncovering the "original" in the sense of the earliest version of the text. Text selection for interpretive and theoretical purposes becomes a more normative issue -- which text is best?

Textual theory was further complicated when archeologists unearthed new copies of the Daode Jing. The traditionally dominant text was named after one of the earliest commentators -- the Wang Bi version. Most translations deviated only slightly from that traditional version prior to the first archeological discovery in 1973. In that year, two versions of the Daode Jing were unearthed in a Mawang Dui tomb site. The discovery energized textual theorists who reasoned that as the earliest physically extant text, the Mawang Dui must be closer to the original should be treated as authoritative. The discovery was quickly followed by a rash of new translations of the Dedao Jing (the two parts of the text were reversed in the newly discovered manuscripts).

The argument for its authoritative status was weak. The enthusiasm rested on the traditional attachment to an "original" text (earlier in time). In fact, the discovery tended to confirm the evolutionary, multiple-editor view, while this enthusiasm treated textual evolution as if it took place by successive operations on a single physical text item. Like physiological evolution, text evolution more probably operated on a population or "stream" of copies, abridgements and additions.

Wang Bi probably had access to a range of that population in selecting his version. The archeological discovery was of a single instance -- a branch of the stream. The historical circumstances of the presumed time of burial further undermined the optimistic assumption that the Mawang Dui was the original. The tomb's date places the texts after a radical disruption of textual husbandry -- in 200 BC when the Qin "burned books and buried scholars."

The Qin had set out to destroy traditional learning. The later Han ostensibly cherished and tried to recover textual scholarship. In the succeeding Han, text collection, veneration preservation (and copying) became the norm. The theory that the Mawang Dui was the authoritative text assumes that the destructive political frenzy at the end of classical period had not affected the integrity of transmission that produced the Mawang Dui instances. Then it must insist that in the succeeding period of textual veneration and preservation, radical changes were introduced into the entire population of copies and versions of the text so that all those on which Wang Bi drew on after the Han were corrupted -- and in similar ways -- from the orthodox Mawang Dui version.

The opposite story is more probable -- the sample was a version written with punctuation and interpretive emendation for a member of the superstitious ruling class. Taking it as representing of the whole population of texts at the time is an elementary sampling error.

The Mawang Dui fervor was further undermined in 1993 more when another discovery of a still older pair of abridged texts (dating from about 300 BC) turned out to be more like the traditional text (the order of selection reflected the traditional daode arrangement). Even more notably, it strongly confirmed the gradual accretion view of the text suggesting that the Daode Jing was still in the process of being compiled at that late date. This locates the composition of the Daode Jing and the Zhuangzi almost side-by-side.

Laozi's existence is widely disputed partly because the traditional story seems impossible for one person to satisfy. That only entails, however, that not all the things in the story are true of him, not that he didn't exist. On the other hand, there is little positive evidence that he did and there are many alternative stories of how he came to be regarded as the author of the Daode Jing. It is common for theorists to treat ‘Laozi’ as a definite description referring to "whoever wrote the Daode Jing. -- "Many thus regard the question of his existence as equivalent to the question of his authorship of at least a part of the text -- hence improbable given current textual theory. The issues, however, are also separate. Laozi could have existed and not written any of the text attributed to him. On balance, the existence of Zhuangzi is considerably more probable, though little is known of him that is not from the text bearing his name -- many of whose stories are obviously fanciful.

In China today, parts of the traditional theory have been resurrected. Some scholars are arguing for a pre-Confucius date for Laozi on various textual grounds (especially poetic structure). Traditional as well as modern scholarship tends to attribute the first eight "inner" chapters to Zhuangzi and there has been little doubt about his existence. So far one important implication of modern textual theory has had little effect on popular interpretations. If we inevitably rely on the stories in the Zhuangzi -- for our knowledge about him, then the known chief intellectual influence on Zhuangzi should be treated as the sophist and linguistic theorist, Hui Shi, not Laozi or the Daode Jing.

Textual theories of the Zhuangzi are more elaborate and consistent. Though they differ in details and identification of parts, text scholars largely converge on attributing the chapters, outside of the eight assigned to Zhuangzi himself, to students of Zhuangzi, to primitivists who are associated with Yang Zhu (Yangists), and to other more eclectic and religious writers associated probably with the production of the other texts associated with Daoism. To be strict, however, despite the prevalence of the opinion, there is nothing resembling a convincing argument that Zhuangzi wrote all eight of the so called "inner chapters."

Probably the association of the two texts began when students of Zhuangzi noticed some shared or reinforcing themes expressed in a contemporary anonymous textual group working on the evolving Daode Jing. Perhaps both groups appreciated the affinity and began to exchange themes, expressions, and related lines of thought. Graham argued that the association of Laozi with the Daode Jing dates from a conspiratorial attempt to gain authority over Confucianism by claiming that the Daode Jing stemmed from Confucius' teacher who was known in legend as Laozi.

This is a rough table of the state of textual theories of the two defining texts of Daoism.

Question Traditional story Range of theories Most plausible answer
Existence Laozi and Zhuangzi like teacher-student or prophet-disciple Zhuangzi inspired the formulation of the myth of Laozi and the attribution Zhuangzi knew only the Confucian story of Laozi. Laozi's actual existence merely possible.
Authorship Laozi wrote the Daode Jing before' traveling to India to found Buddhism. Zhuangzi wrote the Zhuangzi. Zhuangzi wrote only chapter two. Daode Jing a product of Huang-Lao ruler-mysticism. Both books the product of textual communities who continually edit and add to the text. Zhuangzi wrote at most eight chapters.
Dating The Daode Jing was written before Confucius. Zhuangzi inspired to expand on its mystical insight. Daode Jing being edited well into the Han dynasty. Miscellaneous and Outer chapters of the Zhuangzi edited or composed into the Han. Both being edited through and beyond the classical period.
Relation Laozi prophet/teacher, Zhuangzi disciple/pupil. Zhuangzi formulated first and chief influence is his sophist friend Hui Shi. Textual communities began to borrow from each other after the inner chapters completed.

Other textual theories address the authorship, dating and relations to the two canonical Daoist texts to the later "religious" texts mentioned above. Essentially the upshot is that they borrowed heavily from the two classical texts, often changing the context and failing to understand the philosophical point. The quotations they used were embedded in popular cosmological and religious contexts.

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Daoism in Histories of Philosophy

The most influential treatments of Daoism are those that place their discussion in more general accounts of Chinese Philosophy. Some important ones are:

Focused Treatments

More focused treatments develop sometimes classic and sometimes controversial lines of interpretation of philosophical Daoism. These often disagree with each other so none is definitive but notable contributions include:


Collection of articles mainly focus on Zhuangzi. Some of the focused discussions are found in such collections which include:


Interpretive theories are presented most systematically in translations, but there are too many to list here (and most tend to religious lines of interpretation). Some of the more influential philosophical translations of the key texts include:

Religious Treatments

Religious treatments vastly outnumber the philosophical. Here, we will list only a representative sample.

Textual Issues

Discussion of textual issues is a major focus of scholarly activity. Modern textual theories have influenced interpretation particularly of the philosophical content. Some examples include:

Other Internet Resources

General Resources about Chinese Thought

Philosophical Daoism

Related Entries

Laozi | Mohism | School of Names | Zhuangzi

Copyright © 2003
Chad Hansen

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