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Notes to The Hole Argument

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In general, the class of theories in which the hole argument is
mounted are "local spacetime theories." These are theories whose
models consist of *n*+1 tuples

(where theM,O_{1}, …,O_{n})

where the quantitiesL_{1}=0, …,L_{m}=0

2.
The distinction at issue here is between the passive and active
reading of general covariance. Passive general covariance allows use
of all coordinate charts of the differential manifold and is conferred
automatically on theories formulated by modern methods. Active general
covariance considers the dual point transformations induced by
coordinate transformations. These amount to diffeomorphisms on the
manifold *M* and the transformations of the fields correspond
to maps that associate an object field *O* with its carry along
*h*^{*}*O* under diffeomorphism *h*.

The need to convert Einstein's original analysis from passive to active transformations is awkward. I have argued that the distinction between them was not so clear cut when Einstein originally formulated the hole argument because of the more impoverished mathematical environment in which he worked and that this is responsible for much of the present confusion in interpreting Einstein's pronouncements on coordinate systems. See Norton (1989, 1992).

3.
That is, a hole transformation is a diffeomorphism on *M* that
is the identity outside some arbitrarily selected neighborhood but
comes smoothly to differ from the identity within that
neighborhood. For an explicit construction of such a transformation,
see Muller (1995).

The notion of general covariance has been the subject of a protracted dispute that extends to the earliest years of general relativity, when Kretschmann argued that the requirement of general covariance was merely a mathematical condition with no physical content. See Norton (1993) for an extensive survey. In my view, as explained in Norton (2003), Kretschmann's objection has merit, as long we allow reformulations of our theory. Then noting that a physical theory admits a generally covariant reformulation places no physical constraint on the theory. Once the formulation is fixed, however, then the general covariance of the theory, like most of its formal properties, will have some physical meaning. That physical meaning is what is at issue in the present discussion of the hole argument.

4.
More generally, manifold substantivalism asserts that the manifold
*M* of local spacetime theories is the mathematical structure
that represents spacetime.

5.
For any spacetime model (*M*, *O*_{1},
…, *O*_{n}) and any diffeomorphism on
*M*, Leibniz equivalence asserts that the two models

6. The general form of the argument is essentially identical. The first sentence is generalized to read:

1.If one has two models of a local spacetime theory (M,O_{1}, …,O_{n}) and (hM,h^{*}O_{1}, …,h^{*}O_{n}) related by a hole transformationh, manifold substantivalists must maintain that the two systems represent two distinct physical systems.

Note also that statements 1 and 2 are premises. Statement 3 is the conclusion drawn from them. There is a suppressed premise that it is inadmissible to load up a physical theory with hidden properties that outstrip both observation and the determining power of the theory.

John Norton jdnorton+@pitt.edu |

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy