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The Hole Argument

What is space? What is time? Do they exist independently of the things and processes in them? Or is their existence parasitic on these things and processes? Are they like a canvas onto which an artist paints; they exist whether or not the artist paints on them? Or are they akin to parenthood; there is no parenthood until there are parents and children? That is, is there no space and time until there are things with spatial properties and processes with temporal durations?

These questions have long been debated and continue to be debated. The hole argument arose when these questions were asked in the context of modern spacetime physics. In that context, space and time are fused into a single entity, spacetime, and we inquire into its status. One view is that spacetime is a substance, a thing that exists independently of the processes occurring within spacetime. This is spacetime substantivalism. The hole argument seeks to show that this viewpoint leads to unpalatable conclusions in a large class of spacetime theories. Spacetime substantivalism requires that we ascribe such a surfeit of properties to spacetime that neither observation nor even the laws of the relevant spacetime theory itself can determine which are the correct ones. Such abundance is neither logically contradictory nor refuted by experience. But there must be some bounds on how rich a repertoire of hidden properties can be ascribed to spacetime. The hole argument urges that spacetime substantivalism goes beyond those bounds.

The hole argument was invented for slightly different purposes by Albert Einstein late in 1913 as part of his quest for the general theory of relativity. It was revived and reformulated in the modern context by John3 = John Earman x John Stachel x John Norton.

1. Modern Spacetime Theories: A Beginner's Guide

Virtually all modern spacetime theories are now built in the same way. The theory posits a manifold of events and then assigns further structures to those events to represent the content of spacetime. A standard example is Einstein's general theory of relativity. As a host for the hole argument, we will pursue one of its best known applications, the expanding universes of modern relativistic cosmology.[1]

Manifold of Events. Consider our universe, which relativistic cosmologies attempt to model. Events in the universe correspond to the dimensionless points of familiar spatial geometry. Just as a geometric point is a particular spot in a geometrical space, an event is a particular point in a cosmological space at a particular time. To be a four-dimensional manifold, the events must be a little bit more organized than they are if they merely form a set. That extra organization comes from the requirement that we can smoothly label the events with four numbers — or at least we can do this for any sufficiently small chunk of the manifold. These labels form coordinate systems. Figure 1 shows how a set of events may be made into a two dimensional manifold.

Figure shows a set of points converted into a manifold by labeling with numbers.
Figure 1. Forming a manifold of events

Metrical Structure and Matter Fields. In specifying that events form a four dimensional manifold, we have still not specified which events lie in the future and past of which other events, how much time elapses between these events, which events are simultaneous with others so that they can form three dimensional spaces, what spatial distances separates these events and many more related properties. These additional properties are introduced by specifying the metric field.

Figure shows time elapsed along world lines and distance along curves in space.
Figure 2. The function of the metric field.

Imagine all the curves in some spacetime and an exhaustive catalog of all the distances in space and duration elapsed in time between any two events on any curve that connects them. The information carried by the metric is just that catalog, reduced to a very much more compact form.

The matter of the universe is represented by matter fields. The simplest form of matter — the big lumps that make galaxies — can be represented by worldlines that trace out the history of each galaxy through time. In standard models, the galaxies recede from one another and this is represented by a spreading apart of the galactic worldlines as we proceed to later times.

Figure shows diverging worldlines of galaxies
Figure 3. Galaxies in an expanding universe.

2. The Freedom of General Covariance

When Einstein first introduced his general theory of relativity in the 1910s, its novel feature was its general covariance. It was the first spacetime theory in which one was free to use arbitrary spacetime coordinate systems. This feature is now shared by virtually all modern formulations of spacetime theories, including modern versions of special relativity and Newtonian spacetime theory. In the modern context, the freedom of general covariance is expressed in a more vividly geometric manner.[2] When we assemble a relativistic universe, we spread the metrical structure and matter fields over a manifold:

Figure shows what caption says!
Figure 4. One way to spread metric and matter over the manifold.

What general covariance does is to license different spreadings of metric and matter fields. If the theory allows one spreading, such as that given in Figure 4, then through general covariance it allows any other that represents a smooth deformation of the original, such as shown in Figure 5:

Figure shows what caption says!
Figure 5. Another way to spread metric and matter over the manifold.

Figures 4 and 5 illustrate a hole transformation on the metric and matter fields. The dotted region is The Hole. The first distribution of metric and matter fields is transformed into the second in a special way. The transformation leaves the fields unchanged outside the hole; within it they have been spread differently on the manifold; the spreadings inside and outside the hole join smoothly.[3]

3. The Preservation of Invariants

The two different spreadings share one vital characteristic upon which the hole argument depends: the two spreadings agree completely on all invariant properties. These invariant properties are, loosely speaking, the ones that are intrinsic to the geometry and dynamics, such as distance along spatial curves and time along worldlines of galaxies, the rest mass of the galaxy, the number of particles in it, as well as a host of other properties, such as whether the spacetimes are metrically flat or curved. While the fields are spread differently in the two cases, in invariant terms, they are the same.

This last result actually explains the prevalence of general covariance. The laws of a spacetime theory are typically stated as relations between invariant properties. Therefore if they are satisfied by one spacetime, they must also be satisfied by a transform of that spacetime that shares all the original's invariant geometric properties.

All observables can be reduced to invariants. For example, if one makes a journey from one galaxy to another, all observables pertinent to the trip will be invariants. These include the time elapsed along the journey, whether the spaceship is accelerating or not at any time in its journey, the age of the galaxy one leaves at the start of the trip and the age of the destination galaxy at the end and all operations that may involve signaling with particles or light pulses.

Therefore, since the two spreadings or distributions agree on invariants, they also agree on all observables and are observationally indistinguishable.

4. What Represents Spacetime? Manifold Substantivalism

We want to know whether we can conceive of spacetime as a substance, that is, as something that exists independently. To do this, we need to know what in the above structures represents spacetime. One popular answer to that question is that the manifold of events represents spacetime. We shall see shortly that this popular form of the answer is the one that figures in the hole argument. This choice is natural since modern spacetime theories are built up by first positing a manifold of events and then defining further structures on them. So the manifold plays the role of a container just as we expect spacetime does.[4]

The notion that the manifold represents an independently existing thing is quite natural in the realist view of physical theories. In that view one tries to construe physical theories literally. If formulated as above, a spacetime is a manifold of events with certain fields defined on the manifold. The literal reading is that this manifold is an independently existing structure that bears properties.

Appealing as manifold substantivalism once was, after one sees what trouble it causes, it becomes tempting to insist that the manifold of events lacks properties essential to spacetime. For example, there is no notion of past and future, of time elapsed or of spatial distance in the manifold of events. Thus one might be tempted to identify spacetime with the manifold of events plus some further structure that supplies these spatiotemporal notions. In relativistic cosmologies, that further structure would be the metrical structure. Readers who pursue this issue further will find that this escape from the hole argument sometimes succeeds and sometimes fails. In certain important special cases, alternative versions of the hole argument can be mounted against the manifold-plus-further-structure substantivalists. (See Norton 1988.)

In general relativity, there is a further problem with arguing that the metric field properly belongs to spacetime since it carries essential spatiotemporal properties. The metric field of general relativity also carries energy and momentum — the energy and momentum of the gravitational field. This energy and momentum is freely interchanged with other matter fields in spacetimes. It is the source of the huge quantities of energy released as radiation and heat in stellar collapse, for example. To carry energy and momentum is a natural distinguishing characteristic of matter contained within spacetime. So the metric field of general relativity seems to defy easy characterization. We would like it to be exclusively part of spacetime the container, or exclusively part of matter the contained. Yet is seems to be part of both.

5. The Price of Spacetime Substantivalism

So far we have characterized the substantivalist doctrine as the view that spacetime has an existence independent of its contents. This formulation conjures up powerful if vague intuitive pictures, but it is not clear enough for interpretation in the context of physical theories. If we represent spacetime by a manifold of events, how do we characterize the independence of its existence? Is it the counterfactual claim that were there no metric or matter fields, there would still be a manifold of events? That counterfactual is automatically denied by the standard formulation which posits that all spacetimes have at least metrical structure. That seems too cheap a refutation of manifold substantivalism. Surely, there must be an improved formulation. Fortunately, we do not need to wrestle with finding it. For present purposes we need only consider a consequence of the substantivalist view and can set aside the task of giving a precise formulation of the substantivalist view.

In their celebrated debate over space and time, Leibniz taunted the substantivalist Newton's representative, Clarke, by asking how the world would change if East and West were switched. For Leibniz there would be no change since all spatial relations between bodies would be preserved by such a switch. But the Newtonian substantivalist had to concede that the bodies of the world were now located in different spatial positions, so the two systems were physically distinct.

Correspondingly, when we spread the metric and matter fields differently over a manifold of events, we are now assigning metrical and material properties in different ways to the events of the manifold. For example, imagine that a galaxy passes through some event E in the hole. After the hole transformation, this galaxy might not pass through that event. For the manifold substantivalist, this must be a matter of objective physical fact: either the galaxy passes through E or not. The two distributions represent two physically distinct possibilities.

Figure shows galaxy passes through E before the hole transformation but not after it.
Figure 6. Does the galaxy pass through event E?

That is, manifold substantivalists must deny an equivalence inspired by Leibniz' taunt and is thus named after him:[5]

Leibniz Equivalence. If two distributions of fields are related by a smooth transformation, then they represent the same physical systems.

6. Unhappy Consequences

We can now assemble the pieces above to generate unhappy consequences for the manifold substantivalist. Consider the two distributions of metric and matter fields related by a hole transformation. Since the manifold substantivalist denies Leibniz equivalence, the substantivalist must hold that the two systems represent distinct physical systems. But the properties that distinguish the two are very elusive.

We have already noticed that the two are observationally equivalent. So the substantivalist must insist that it makes a physical difference as to whether the galaxy passes through event E or not. But no observation can tell us if we are in a world in which the galaxy passes through event E or misses event E, for universes with either are observationally equivalent.

Worse, the physical theory of relativistic cosmology is unable to pick between the two cases. This is manifested as an indeterminism of the theory. We can specify the distribution of metric and matter fields throughout the manifold of events, excepting within the region designated as The Hole. Then the theory is unable to tell us how the fields will develop into The Hole. Both the original and the transformed distribution are legitimate extensions of the metric and matter fields outside The Hole into The Hole, since each satisfies all the laws of the theory of relativistic cosmology. The theory has no resources which allow us to insist that one only is admissible.

It is important to see that the unhappy consequence does not consist merely of a failure of determinism. We are all too familiar with such failures and it is certainly not automatic grounds for dismissal of a physical theory. The best known instance of a widely celebrated, indeterministic theory is quantum theory, where, in the standard interpretation, the measurement of a system can lead to an indeterministic collapse onto one of many possible outcomes. Less well known is that it is possible to devise indeterministic systems in classical physics as well. Most examples involves oddities such as bodies materializing at unbounded speed from spatial infinity, so called "space invaders." (Earman, 1986a, Ch. III; see also determinism: causal) Or they may arise through the interaction of infinitely many bodies in a supertask (Supertasks.) More recently an extremely simple example has emerged in which a single mass sits atop a dome and spontaneously sets itself into motion after an arbitrary time delay and in an arbitrary direction. ( Norton, 2003, Section 3)

The problem with the failure of determinism in the hole argument is not the fact of failure but the way that it fails. If we deny manifold substantivalism and accept Leibniz equivalence, then the indeterminism induced by a hole transformation is eradicated. While there are uncountably many mathematically distinct developments of the fields into the hole, under Leibniz Equivalence, they are all physically the same. That is, there is a unique development of the physical fields into the hole after all. Thus the indeterminism is a direct product of the substantivalist viewpoint. Similarly, if we accept Leibniz equivalence, then we are no longer troubled that the two distributions cannot be distinguished by any possible observation. They are merely different mathematical descriptions of the same physical reality and so should agree on all observables.

We can load up any physical theory with superfluous, phantom properties that cannot be fixed by observation. If their invisibility to observation is not sufficient warning that these properties are illegitimate, finding that they visit indeterminism onto a theory that is otherwise deterministic in this set-up ought to be warning enough. These properties are invisible to both observation and theory; they should be discarded along with any doctrine that requires their retention.

7. The Hole Argument in Brief

In sum the hole argument amounts to this:[6]

1. If one has two distributions of metric and matter fields related by a hole transformation, manifold substantivalists must maintain that the two systems represent two distinct physical systems.

2. This physical distinctness transcends both observation and the determining power of the theory since:

3. Therefore the manifold substantivalist advocates an unwarranted bloating of our physical ontology and the doctrine should be discarded.

8. The History of the Hole Argument

8.1 Einstein Falls into the Hole…

The hole argument was created by Albert Einstein late in 1913 as an act of desperation when his quest for his general theory of relativity had encountered what appeared to be insuperable obstacles. Over the previous year, he had been determined to find a gravitation theory that was generally covariant, that is, whose equations were unchanged by arbitrary transformation of the spacetime coordinates. He had even considered essentially the celebrated, generally covariant equations he would settle upon in November 1915 and which now appear in all the text books.

Unfortunately Einstein had been unable to see that these equations were admissible. Newton's theory of gravitation worked virtually perfectly for weak gravitational fields. So it was essential that Einstein's theory revert to Newton's in that case. But try as he might, Einstein could not see that his equations and many variants of them could properly mesh with Newton's theory. In mid 1913 he published a compromise: a sketch of a relativistic theory of gravitation that was not generally covariant. (For further details of these struggles, see Norton (1984).)

His failure to find an admissible generally covariant theory troubled Einstein greatly. Later in 1913 he sought to transform his failure into a victory of sorts: he thought he could show that no generally covariant theory at all is admissible. Any such theory would violate what he called the Law of Causality — we would now call it determinism. He sought to demonstrate this remarkable claim with the hole argument.

In its original incarnation, Einstein considered a spacetime filled with matter excepting one region, the hole, which was matter free. (So in this original form, the term "hole" makes more sense than in the modern version.) He then asked if a full specification of both metric and matter fields outside the hole would fix the metric field within. Since he had tacitly eschewed Leibniz Equivalence, Einstein thought that the resulting negative answer sufficient to damn all generally covariant theories.

8.2 …and Climbs out Again

Einstein struggled on for two years with his misshapen theory of limited covariance. Late in 1915, as evidence of his errors mounted inexorably, Einstein was driven to near despair and ultimately capitulation. He returned to the search for generally covariant equations with a new urgency, fueled in part by the knowledge that none other than David Hilbert had thrown himself into analysis of his theory. Einstein's quest came to a happy close in late November 1915 with the completion of his theory in generally covariant form.

For a long time it was thought that Hilbert had beaten Einstein by 5 days to the final theory. New evidence in the form of the proof pages of Hilbert's paper now suggests he may not have. More important, it shows clearly that Hilbert, like Einstein, at least temporarily believed that the hole argument precluded all generally covariant theories and that the belief survived at least as far as the proof pages of his paper. (See Corry, Renn and Stachel 1997.)

While Einstein had tacitly withdrawn his objections to generally covariant theories, he had not made public where he thought the hole argument failed. This he finally did when he published what John Stachel calls the "point-coincidence argument." This argument, well known from Einstein's (1916, p.117) review of his general theory of relativity, amounts to a defense of Leibniz equivalence. He urges that the physical content of a theory is exhausted by the catalog of the spacetime coincidences it licenses. For example, in a theory that treats particles only, the coincidences are the points of intersection of the particle worldlines. These coincidences are preserved by transformations of the fields. Therefore two systems of fields that can be intertransformed have the same physical content; they represent the same physical system.

Over the years, the hole argument was deemed to be a trivial error by an otherwise insightful Einstein. It was John Stachel (1980) who recognized its highly non-trivial character and brought this realization to the modern community of historians and philosophers of physics. (See also Stachel, 1986.) In Earman and Norton (1987), the argument was recast as one that explicitly targets spacetime substantivalism. For further historical discussion, see Howard and Norton (1993), Janssen (forthcoming), Klein (1995) and Norton (1987).

9. Responses to the Hole Argument

There are at least as many responses to the hole argument as authors who have written on it. One line of thought simply agrees that the hole argument makes acceptance of Leibniz equivalence compelling. It seeks to make more transparent what that acceptance involves by trying to find a single mathematical structure that represents a physical spacetime system rather than the equivalence class of intertransformable structures licensed by Leibniz equivalence. One such attempt involves the notion of a "Leibniz algebra." (See Earman, 1989, Ch. 9, Sect. 9) It has become unclear that such attempts can succeed. Just as intertransformable fields represent the same physical system, there are distinct but intertransformable Leibniz algebras with the same physical import. If the formalisms of manifolds and of Leibniz algebras are intertranslatable, one would expect the hole argument to reappear in the latter formalism as well under this translation. (See Rynasiewicz, 1992.)

Einstein's original hole argument was formulated in the context of general relativity. The hole argument as formulated in Earman and Norton (1987) applies to all local spacetime theories and that includes generally covariant formulations of virtually all known spacetime theories. One view is that this goes too far, that general relativity is distinct from many other spacetime theories in that its spacetime geometry has become dynamical and it is only in such theories that the hole argument should be mounted. (See Earman, 1989, Ch.9, Section 5; Stachel, 1993)

To critics, the hole argument presents a huge target. It consists of a series of assumptions all of which are needed to make good on its conclusion. The argument can be blocked by denying just one of its presumptions. Different authors have sought to sustain denial of virtually every one of them.

Perhaps the most promising of these attacks is one that requires the least modification of the ideas used to mount the hole argument. It is the proposal that spacetime is better represented not by the manifold of events alone but by some richer structure, such as the manifold of events in conjunction with metrical properties. (See, for example, Hoefer, 1996.) A slight and very popular variant allows that each event of the manifold represents a physical spacetime event, but which physical event that might be depends on the spreading of metric and matter fields on the manifold. Thus the indeterminism of the hole transformation can be eradicated since the metric and matter properties of an event can be carried with the transformation. (See, for example, Brighouse, 1994.)

More generally, we may well wonder whether the problems faced by spacetime substantivalism is an artifact of the particular formalism described above. Bain (1998) has explored the effect of a transition to other formalisms.

The simplest challenge notes that Leibniz equivalence is a standard presumption in the modern mathematical physics literature and suggests that even entertaining its denial (as manifold substantivalists must) is some kind of mathematical blunder unworthy of serious attention. While acceptance of Leibniz equivalence is widespread in the physics literature, it is not a logical truth that can only be denied on pain of contradiction. That it embodies non-trivial assumptions whose import must be accepted with sober reflection is indicated by the early acceptance of the hole argument by David Hilbert. If denial of Leibniz equivalence is a blunder so egregious that no competent mathematician would do it, then our standards for competence have become unattainably high, for they must exclude David Hilbert in 1915 at the height of his powers.

Another challenge seeks principled reasons for denying general covariance. One approach tries to establish that a spacetime can be properly represented by at most one of two intertransformable systems of fields on some manifold. So Maudlin (1990) urges that each spacetime event carries its metrical properties essentially, that is, it would not be that very event if (after redistribution of the fields) we tried to assign different metrical properties to it. Butterfield (1989) portrays intertransformable systems as different possible worlds and uses counterpart theory to argue that at most one can represent an actual spacetime.

These responses are just a few of a large range of responses of increasing ingenuity and technical depth. In the course of the scrutiny of the argument, virtually all its aspects have been weighed and tested. Is the indeterminism of the hole argument merely an artifact of an ill-chosen definition of determinism? Is the problem merely a trivial variant of the philosophical puzzle of inscrutability of reference? Or are there deep matters of physics at issue? The debate continues over these and further issues. To enter it, the reader is directed to the bibliography below.

Finally, the hole argument has had a broader significance in the philosophy of science in two ways. First it has presented a new sort of obstacle to the rise of scientific realism. According to that view, one should read the assertions of our mature theories literally. So, if general relativity describes a manifold of events and a metrical structure, then that is literally there for the (untutored) scientific realist. To do otherwise, it is asserted, would be to leave the success of these theories an unexplained miracle. If spacetime does not really have the geometrical structure attributed to it by general relativity, then how can we explain the theory's success? Appealing as this view is, the hole argument shows that some limits must be placed on our literal reading of a successful theory. Or at least that persistence in such literal readings comes with a high price. The hole argument shows us that we might want to admit that there is something a little less really there than the literal reading, lest we be forced to posit physically real properties that transcend both observation and the determining power of our theory.

Second, the hole argument has played a role in the growing recognition in philosophy of physics of the importance of gauge transformations. A gauge transformation arises whenever we have mathematically distinct structures in a physical theory that represent the same physical situation. The hole transformation that relates the two metric fields of the hole argument is an example of a gauge transformation (if we regard the two as physically equivalent). Gauge transformations have long been of importance in particle physics, where they have provided a powerful means of constructing theories of interaction fields. The philosophical problem is to know when two intertransformable structures do in fact represent the same physical situation, so that the transformation is a gauge transformation. The existence of a transformation that perfectly transforms one structure into the other is clearly insufficient. Consider a three dimensional Euclidean space. It hosts many two dimensional Euclidean surfaces, each of which can be transformed into any other. But to say that these transformations are merely gauge transformations is to collapse the three dimensional space into a two dimensional space. The decision as to whether a transformation is a gauge transformation cannot merely be decided by the mathematics; it is a physical issue that must be settled by physical considerations. The hole argument supplies an important illustration of how the decision might be taken. A hole transformation is credibly a gauge transformation since that assumption protects the theory from an apparently illicit form of indeterminism. Earman (2003) has generalized this approach and suggests that the constrained Hamiltonian formalism gives principled reason for deciding whether a transformation is a gauge transformation. (For an entry into philosophical problems associated with gauge transformations, see Symmetry and Symmetry Breaking, especially Section 2.5; and Brading and Castellani (2003).)


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Related Entries

determinism: causal | physics: symmetry and symmetry breaking | substance


I am grateful to Erik Curiel, Robert Rynasiewicz and Edward N. Zalta for helpful comments on earlier drafts; and to my subject editor Guido Bacciagaluppi for suggestions for revisions.

Copyright © 2004
John Norton

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