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Lord Shaftesbury [Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of Shaftesbury]

Anthony Ashley Cooper, the third Earl of Shaftesbury, lived from 1671 to 1713. He was one of the most important philosophers of his day, and exerted an enormous influence throughout the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries on British and European discussions of morality, aesthetics and religion.

Shaftesbury's philosophy combined a powerfully teleological approach, according to which all things were part of a harmonious cosmic order, with sharp observations of human nature (see section 2 below). Shaftesbury is often credited with originating the moral sense theory, although his own views of virtue are not as thoroughly anti-rationalist as those of later sentimentalists such as Hutcheson and Hume (section 3). While he argued that virtue leads to happiness (section 4), Shaftesbury was also a fierce opponent of psychological and ethical egoism (section 5) and of the egoistic social contract theory of Hobbes (section 6). Shaftesbury's view of aesthetic judgment was both sentimentalist and objectivist, in that he thought that correct moral judgment was based in human sentiments that reflected accurately the harmonious cosmic order (section 7). Shaftesbury's belief in an harmonious cosmic order also dominated his view of religion, which was based on the idea that the universe clearly exhibited signs of divine design (section 8); according to Shaftesbury, the ultimate end of religion, as well of virtue, beauty and philosophical understanding (all of which are turn out to be one and the same thing), is to identify completely with the universal system of which one is a part.

1. Shaftesbury's Life and Works

Shaftesbury lived from 1671 to 1713. His grandfather, the first Earl of Shaftesbury, oversaw Shaftesbury's early upbringing, and put John Locke in charge of his education. Shaftesbury would eventually come to disagree with many aspects of Locke's philosophy (such as the latter's empiricism, his social contract theory, and what Shaftesbury perceived to be his psychological and ethical egoism), but Locke was clearly a crucially important influence on Shaftesbury's philosophical development, and the two men remained friends until Locke's death.

Shaftesbury served in Parliament and the House of Lords, but ill health curtailed his political career when he was 30 years old. From then on, he concentrated most of his energies on his philosophical and literary writings.

The first work Shaftesbury published was an edited collection of sermons by Benjamin Whichcote, which came out in 1698. Shaftesbury wrote an unsigned preface to the sermons in which he praised Whichcote's belief in the goodness of human beings and urged his readers to use Whichcote's “good nature” as an antidote to the poisonous egoism of Hobbes.

In 1699, John Toland published an early version of Shaftesbury's Inquiry concerning Virtue. But Shaftesbury renounced this version of the Inquiry, claiming (probably truthfully) that it was produced without his authorization.

Most of the works for which Shaftesbury is famous were written between 1705-1710. It was during this period that he rewrote the Inquiry concerning Virtue and completed versions of A Letter concerning Enthusiasm, Sensus Communis: An Essay on the Freedom of Wit and Humour, The Moralists and Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author.

In 1711, he collected his mature works into a single volume and added to them extensive notes and commentary, naming the book Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times. He revised the Characteristics over the course of the next two years, up until his death in 1713. A revised edition came out in 1714.

The Characteristics is a remarkable volume. It covers a great many topics, ranging freely over morality, art, politics, religion, aesthetics, culture and politeness, and it is written in many different styles, including epistles, soliloquys, dialogues and treatises. The overarching goal of the book, as Klein has put it in his very helpful introduction, is to make its readers “effective participants in the world” (Characteristics viii). Shaftesbury saw the Characteristics as an exercise in practical (and not merely speculative) philosophy -- as a work that would enable people to live better lives.

The Characteristics was extremely popular in Britain and Europe throughout the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. It was a book that was closely studied by numerous philosophers and artists, as well as widely read by educated people in general.

In addition to the Characteristics, there are two other major posthumous collections of Shaftesbury's writings: the Second Characteristics, which is concerned chiefly with the visual arts, and his philosophical notebooks, which Rand has collected in The Life, Unpublished Letters and Philosophical Regimen of Anthony, Earl of Shaftesbury. The notebooks are particularly interesting, as they offer a view of Shaftesbury's private ruminations and of his profound commitment to elements of stoicism.

2. Shaftesbury's View of Human Nature: Teleology and Observation

Shaftesbury's view of human nature is both teleological and observation-based. Indeed, he believes that teleology and observation must go hand-in-hand -- that accurate observation of human psychology requires a teleological conception of humanity, and that one needs to observe human beings to learn about the human telos. He is very critical of philosophers who examine human beings without placing their findings within a teleological context, comparing them to someone who examines the individual parts of a watch without taking into account the purpose for which the watch was designed: just as the latter person will never really come to a proper understanding of the watch, Shaftesbury argues, so too the former will never come to a proper understanding of human nature. Shaftesbury thought that Descartes and Locke were guilty of this narrow non-teleological type of philosophizing.

3. Moral Sentimentalism and Moral Rationalism

Shaftesbury, like most teleologically-minded philosophers, contends that the end or telos of human nature is virtue, and much of his writing is devoted to an explication of his conception of virtue. The account of virtue Shaftesbury proposes has often been taken to be the origin of moral sentimentalism or the moral sense theory, which Hutcheson and Hume would later develop. But while there are parts of Shaftesbury's account of virtue that are undeniably sentimentalist, there are also rationalist elements that defy the sentimentalist or moral sense label. Let us first note the most conspicuously sentimentalist aspects of Shaftesbury's view, and then note the more rationalist aspects.

The place in Shaftesbury in which the moral sense theory most clearly begins to take shape is his Inquiry concerning Virtue or Merit, Book I, Part II, Section 3, where he explains his view of “virtue or merit.” When other beings “offer themselves” to our senses, Shaftesbury explains in that section, we perform actions and feel affections. So much we have in common with other animals. But we humans also consider our own actions and affections, and form affections about them. As Shaftesbury puts it, “[T]he very actions themselves and the affections of pity, kindness, gratitude and their contraries, being brought into the mind by reflection, become objects. So that, by means of this reflected sense, there arises another kind of affections towards those very affections themselves, which have been already felt and have no become the subject of a new liking or dislike” (Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, edited by Lawrence Klein [Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999], 172).

This reflected sense, Shaftesbury contends, is the origin of virtue, by which he means both that a being can form a judgment about what is virtuous and vicious only if it has this reflected sense, and that a being can be judged virtuous and vicious only if its actions are influenced by its own reflected sense.

So that if a creature be generous, kind, constant, compassionate, yet if he cannot reflect on what he himself does or sees others do so as to take notice of what is worthy or honest and make that notice or conception of worth and honesty to be an object of his affection, he has not the character of being virtuous. For, thus and no otherwise, he is capable of having a sense of right or wrong, a sentiment or judgment of what is done through just, equal and good affection or the contrary. (Characteristics 173)

These passages from Book I, Part II, Section 3 of the Inquiry seem to give us all we need to attribute to Shaftesbury a sentimentalist or moral sense view or virtue. The fact that Shaftesbury attributes to humans a “sense of right or wrong” is not on its own enough to make the attribution, since that phrase is general enough to refer to a rational capacity as well as a sentimentalist one. But earlier in the section Shaftesbury has called the response from which virtue originates an “affection” and a “liking or dislike.” He has also maintained that the response that is essential to virtue is similar to (or perhaps the same as) the “heart”-based pleasure we feel when we see or hear something beautiful. Later in the Inquiry, moreover, Shaftesbury says that “this sense of right and wrong ... must consist in a real antipathy or aversion to injustice or wrong and in a real affection or love towards equity and right” (Characteristics 178). And in the passage quoted above from Characteristics 173, he seems to equate moral judgment with “a sentiment.” All of this looks to be conclusive evidence that at the core of Shaftesbury's view of morality is something emotional, sentimental or passionate -- not rational.

Further evidence of a sentimentalist moral theory in Shaftesbury occurs in his discussion of how a person can come to lose his sense of right and wrong. He argues (in a manner that anticipates Hume) that because our sense of morality is a sentiment, it can be opposed only by another sentiment, and not by reason or belief. “Sense of right and wrong,” he writes, “therefore being as natural to us as natural affection itself, and being a first principle in our constitution and make, there is no speculative opinion, persuasion or belief which is capable immediately or directly to exclude or destroy it... [T]his affection being an original one of earliest rise in the soul or affectionate part, nothing beside contrary affection, by frequent check and control, can operate upon it so as either to diminish it in part or destroy it in the whole” (Characteristics 179).

There are other passages, however, in which Shaftesbury sounds a more rationalist note. He speaks, for instance, of the “eternal measures and immutable independent nature of worth and virtue” (Characteristics 175) and of “a fitness and decency in actions” (Characteristics 327) -- phrases that are touchstones for the rationalists of the period and which Hutcheson and Hume would later attack. And he contends that “partial affection, or social love in part, without regard to a complete society or whole, is in itself an inconsistency, and implies an absolute Contradiction,” as well as maintaining that an affection that is “applied only to some one part of society, or of a species, not to the species of society itself ... has no foundation or establishment in reason” (Characteristics 205). Moreover, Shaftesbury often links worth and virtue to a “universal system” (Characteristics 167-170) yet another idea that Hutcheson and Hume would eschew.

How are the rationalist-sounding passages in Shaftesbury to be reconciled with his sentimentalist-sounding ones? Shaftesbury seems to think that value exists independently of human affections but that our affections are what enable us to make value judgments (which in turn is what makes us capable of virtue or merit). Shaftesbury's “sense of right and wrong” is, then, truly a sentiment, but it is a sentiment that accurately represents an objective reality -- i.e., a reality that is independent of human sentiments. Shaftesbury tells the same story about aesthetics: there is, he maintains, an eternal and immutable standard of beauty, one that is independent of human affections, but our affections are what enable us to learn about beauty and make aesthetic judgments.

Does this combination of rationalism and sentimentalism constitute a coherent view? Butler might have thought so, and it's just possible that Hutcheson did as well (although Hutcheson's views of this matter are very difficult to pin down). But Balguy, Hume and most twentieth century meta-ethicists would contend that all of Shaftesbury's statements about morality cannot be consistently combined with each other -- that something has to go. However that may be, it is worth keeping in mind that Shaftesbury himself was probably unconcerned about the problem of reconciling aspects of moral rationalism with aspects of moral sentimentalism. This is partly due to the fact that the sharp distinction between rationalism and sentimentalism had not yet been drawn at the time at which Shaftesbury was writing. It is also partly due to the fact that Shaftesbury did not have as a goal for all of his writings the construction of a single systematic theory. His underlying purpose was to improve the character of his readers, and toward this end he was quite willing to write in different styles and different voices, and to use different arguments from one writing to the next. That is not to say that Shaftesbury was happy to contradict himself. But he did seem to think that one could advance the cause of virtue in different ways and that a strict adherence to systematic rigor could frustrate the higher ends to which philosophy should be put.

4. Virtue and Happiness

One point on which Shaftesbury never wavers is that virtue promotes the good of all humankind. As he says, “To love the public, to study universal good, and to promote the interest of the whole world, as far as lies within our power, is surely the height of goodness” (Characteristics 20). Or as he puts it elsewhere, the virtuous person is the one who strives to develop an “equal, just and universal friendship” with all humankind. This view of the content of virtue -- that to be virtuous is to promote the good of all humankind -- fits well with Shaftesbury's teleological approach. For he believes that every thing is designed to promote the good of the system of which it is a part. And he also believes that every human being is a part of the system that is the human species as a whole. It is natural for him to think, therefore, that every human being is designed to promote the good of the human species as a whole. (It is important to note, however, that this view of a system and its parts explains only Shaftesbury's view of the content of goodness, which is something that non-human can also attain. Virtue or merit, which humans alone can attain, involves not merely acting for the good of the system but performing such actions in a self-aware or reflective manner.)

Shaftesbury also consistently maintains that in addition to promoting the good of humanity, virtue promotes the happiness of the virtuous person him or herself, just as vice harms humanity as a whole as well as making the vicious person unhappy. On Shaftesbury's view, in other words, “virtue and interest may be found at last to agree” (Characteristics 167). Or as he puts it in the conclusion of the Inquiry, “And thus virtue is the good and vice the ill of everyone” (Characteristics 229-330). The coincidence of virtue and happiness is just what Shaftesbury's teleological approach should lead us to expect. For teleological thinking generally includes the idea that the best life for a being is one that fulfills the being's natural end or purpose, and being virtuous is the end or purpose for which humans were designed.

Shaftesbury corroborates this teleological connection between virtue and happiness by investigating the pleasures and pains of which human happiness and unhappiness consist. He begins this investigation by drawing a broad distinction between pleasures of the body and pleasures of the mind. He next contends that a person's happiness depends more on mental pleasures than on bodily pleasures. And he then seeks to show that living virtuously is by far the best way to gain the crucially important mental pleasures. Shaftesbury bases much of his “mental pleasures” argument for the connection between virtue and happiness on the idea that the mental pleasures are within one's own control, insulated from the vicissitudes of “fortune, age, circumstances and humour.” As one of Shaftesbury's characters rhetorically asks, “How can we better praise the goodness of Providence than in this, ‘That it has placed our happiness and good in things we can bestow upon ourselves’?” The importance Shaftesbury places on our control over our mental pleasures grows directly out of his appreciation for the Stoics. And indeed, it can be plausibly maintained that Stoicism is one of the strongest and most fundamental commitments of Shaftesbury's thought overall.

5. Attacks on Egoism

But although Shaftesbury believes that being virtuous makes a person happy, it would be wrong to label him an egoist. In fact, he launches many attacks on both psychological egoism and ethical egoism, attacks that have as their main target Hobbes and which clearly anticipate the influential anti-egoist arguments in Butler, Hutcheson and Hume.

Shaftesbury argues, first of all, that psychological egoism does a simply terrible job of explaining the wide spectrum of observable activities humans engage in. He ridicules, for instance, egoistic interpretations of things as “civility, hospitality, humanity towards strangers or people in distress,” maintaining that it is much easier to explain such phenomena simply by positing real sociability and benevolence. He also points out that humans are often motivated by “caprice, zeal, faction and a thousand other springs, which are counter to self-interest” and suggests that the only way psychological egoism can be plausibly maintained is at the expense of becoming tautologous.

Against ethical egoism, Shaftesbury argues that virtue can exist only if it's possible for people to be motivated by something other than self-interest. For a person's virtue, according to Shaftesbury, consists not of the actions he performs but of the motives he has for performing them. And the motive with which we identify virtue is benevolence, not self-interest. Shaftesbury emphasizes this point by drawing attention to the difference between a knave and a saint. We judge the saint virtuous, he explains, because we think he is motivated by something other than the selfishness of the knave. And if we came to believe that the saint's motive were mere selfishness, we would no longer judge him to be virtuous. As he puts it, “If the love of doing good be not of itself a good and right inclination, I know not how there can possibly be such a thing as goodness or virtue”(Characteristics 46).

Shaftesbury's belief that true virtue must flow from non-egoistic motives leads him to criticize sharply the emphasis many religious moralists place on reward and punishment in the afterlife. As one of his characters explains when summarizing the goal of the Inquiry, “[The author of the Inquiry] endeavors chiefly to establish virtue on principles by which he is able to argue with those who are not as yet induced to own a god or future state. If he cannot do thus much, he reckons he does nothing” (Characteristics 266). Shaftesbury eschews considerations of the afterlife in his case for virtue because he believes that persons who perform virtuous actions only because they desire reward and fear punishment have no real virtue in them at all. And persons who are constantly made to dwell on reward and punishment are likely to become overly concerned with their own “self-good and private interest,” which must “insensibly diminish the affections towards public good or the interest of society and introduce a certain narrowness of spirit” (Characteristics 184). So an emphasis on reward and punishment cannot make people more virtuous, and it may very well make them less so (Characteristics 45-46).

Shaftesbury's anti-egoistic view also leads him to an interesting consideration of what we should say to someone who asks for a reason to be virtuous when he knows he will not be punished for vice, or, as Shaftesbury puts the question, “Why should a man be honest in the dark?” (Characteristics 58). At times Shaftesbury suggests that a person who asks this question is already lost to virtue -- that someone who cares about virtue for its own sake won't need another reason to act virtuously, and that someone who needs another reason doesn't have what it takes to be truly virtuous in the first place. At other times, Shaftesbury suggests that we should be honest even in the dark (i.e., virtuous even when we will not be punished for vice) because such conduct is a necessary condition for having a unified self at all (Characteristics 127). These suggestions of how to deal with the question “Why be moral?” are almost certainly antecedents of Hume's response to the sensible knave at the end of his Enquiry concerning Morals.

6. Attacks on Social Contract Theory

Another point on which Hume seems to be indebted to Shaftesbury is criticism of social contract theories. Shaftesbury argues the selfish beings Hobbes describes in his state of nature bear no resemblance to humans as they actually are. For naturally, Shaftesbury contends, humans are sociable. And society is thus humankind's natural condition. “In short, if generation be natural, if natural affection and the care and nurture of the offspring be natural, things standing as they do with man and the creature being of that form and constitution he now is, it follows that society must be also natural to him and that out of society and community he never did, nor ever can, subsist” (Characteristics 287). Shaftesbury also argues that if Hobbes's description of an amoral state of nature were correct, then it would be impossible for Hobbes ever to establish a duty to obey the laws of society. For if there is no duty to keep one's promises in the state of nature, then the original contract cannot create a duty. And if the original contract does give rise to a duty, then there must have been a duty to keep one's promises even in the state of nature (Characteristics 51). Shaftesbury was not the first to criticize social contract theories in this way, but his version of this criticism is stated very clearly and was probably among the most influential.

7. Aesthetics

Shaftesbury's views on aesthetics were also very influential in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. The conception of beauty Shaftesbury proposes is very similar to his conception of virtue. Indeed, Shaftesbury contends that proper taste in morals and proper taste in art turn out to be much the same thing, and that this is because the beautiful and the good (“natural beauty” and “moral beauty” [Characteristics 65]) are themselves “one and the same” (Characteristics 330). Or as he puts it elsewhere, “Thus are the arts and virtues mutually friends and thus the science of virtuosos and that of virtue itself become, in a manner, one and the same” (Characteristics 150). Shaftesbury believes that we judge beauty through our affections, but that the beautiful itself is not dependent upon our affections. There is, he contends, a real aesthetic standard that is affection-independent. And what we must do is try to develop and improve our affections in order to acquire taste that is in line with that real aesthetic standard -- just as we must try to develop and improve our affections in order to acquire a character in line with the reality of virtue. Shaftesbury's teleology is crucial to his aesthetics as well, in that he equates beauty with the harmony of the universe. “For all beauty is truth” (Characteristics 65). In addition to these general aesthetic claims, Shaftesbury makes a great many specific stylistic points about literature, criticism, music and the visual arts.

8. Religion

Although he resisted complete identification with them, Shaftesbury's religious views share much with the English Deists, and he, like them, was a strong proponent of natural religion. Shaftesbury repeatedly advances versions of the argument from Design for the existence of God, and his general teleological approach is deeply theistic (it could perhaps be said that his teleology and his religion were one and the same thing). At the same time, Shaftesbury places little stock in the institutions and rituals of organized religion, and he maintains that the Scriptures are not self-verifying but must always submit to the judgment of our natural understanding. Shaftesbury argues that a truly religious frame of mine -- a frame of mind attuned to the harmonious workings of the universe as a whole -- bolsters one's commitment to virtue. But he also maintains that an atheist can be virtuous, and that bad religion is more destructive to virtue than no religion at all. Shaftesbury criticized certain kinds of fanatical religious enthusiasm, but he also believed that the pinnacle of religious-moral-aesthetic experience consisted of an enthusiastic embrace of the spirit of the entire world.


Shaftesbury's Works

Secondary Literature

Biography of Shaftesbury with extensive discussion of his thought as a whole:

Book length treatment of Shaftesbury's thought as a whole:

Detailed discussions of many aspects of Shaftesbury's philosophy and its historical context:

Specifically on Shaftesbury's views of morality:

Specifically on Shaftesbury's views of religion:

Specifically on Shaftesbury's views of aesthetics:

Specifically on Shaftesbury's views of personal identity:

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

contractarianism | creationism | deism | egoism | Hobbes, Thomas | Hume, David | Locke, John | Stoicism

Copyright © 2002
Michael Gill
University of Arizona

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