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Supplement to Set Theory

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This axiom asserts that when setsExtensionality:

∀x∀y[∀z(z∈x≡z∈y) →x=y]

The next axiom asserts the existence of the empty set:

Null Set:

∃x¬∃y(y∈x)

Since it is provable from this axiom and the previous axiom that there is a unique such set, we may introduce the notation ‘Ø’ to denote it.

The next axiom asserts that if given any set *x* and
*y*, there exists a pair set of *x* and *y*,
i.e., a set which has only *x* and *y* as members:

Pairs:

∀x∀y∃z∀w(w∈z≡w=xw=y)

Since it is provable that there is a unique pair set for each given
*x* and *y*, we introduce the notation
‘{*x*,*y*}’ to denote it.

The next axiom asserts that for any given set *x*, there is a
set *y* which has as members all of the members of all of the
members of *x*:

Unions:

∀x∃y∀z[z∈y≡ ∃w(w∈x&z∈w)]

Since it is provable that there is a unique ‘union’ of
any set *x*, we introduce the notation
‘∪*x*’ to denote it.

The next axiom asserts that for any set *x*, there is a set
*y* which contains as members all those sets whose members are
also elements of *x*, i.e., *y* contains all of the
subsets of *x*:

Power Set:

∀x∃y∀z[z∈y≡ ∀w(w∈z→w∈x)]

Since every set provably has a unique ‘power set’, we
introduce the notation
‘(*x*)’
to denote it. Note also that we may define the notion *x is a
subset of y* (‘*x* ⊆ *y*’) as:
∀
*z*(*z*∈*x* →
*z*∈*y*).
Then we may simplify the statement of the Power Set Axiom as
follows:

∀x∃y∀z[z∈y≡z⊆x)

The next axiom asserts the existence of an infinite set, i.e., a set with an infinite number of members:

Infinity:

∃x[Ø∈x& ∀y(y∈x→ ∪{y,{y}}∈x)]

We may think of this as follows. Let us define *the union of x and
y* (‘*x*∪*y*’) as the
union of the pair set of *x* and *y*, i.e., as
∪{*x*,*y*}. Then the Axiom
of Infinity asserts that there is a set *x* which contains
Ø as a member and which is such that, anytime *y* is a
member of *x*, then *y*∪{*y*} is a member of
*x*. Consequently, this axiom guarantees the existence of a
set of the following form:

{Ø, {Ø}, {Ø, {Ø}}, {Ø, {Ø}, {Ø, {Ø}}}, … }

Notice that the second element, {Ø}, is in this set because (1) the fact that Ø is in the set implies that Ø ∪ {Ø} is in the set and (2) Ø ∪ {Ø} just is {Ø}. Similarly, the third element, {Ø, {Ø}}, is in this set because (1) the fact that {Ø} is in the set implies that {Ø} ∪ {{Ø}} is in the set and (2) {Ø} ∪ {{Ø}} just is {Ø, {Ø}}. And so forth.

The next axiom asserts that every set is ‘well-founded’:

Regularity:

∀x[x≠Ø → ∃y(y∈x& ∀z(z∈x→ ¬(z∈y)))]

A member *y* of a set *x* with this property is called
a ‘minimal’ element. This axiom rules out the existence of
circular chains of sets (e.g., such as
*x*∈*y* &
*y*∈*z* & and
*z*∈*x*) as well as infinitely
descending chains of sets (such as …
*x*_{3} ∈
*x*_{2} ∈
*x*_{1} ∈
*x*_{0}).

The final axiom of ZF is the Replacement Schema. Suppose that
φ(*x*,*y*,) is a
formula with *x* and *y* free, and which may or may not
have free variables
*z*_{1},…,*z*_{k}. Furthermore,
let φ_{x,y,
}[*s*,*r*,]
be the result of substituting *s* and *r* for
*x* and *y*, respectively, in
φ(*x*,*y*,). Then
every instance of the following schema is an axiom:

Replacement Schema:

∀z_{1}…∀z_{k}[∀x∃!yφ(x,y,) → ∀u∃v∀r(r∈v≡ ∃s(s∈u& φ_{x,y,}[s,r,]))]

In other words, if we know that φ is a functional
formula (which relates each set *x* to a unique set *y*),
then if we are given a set *u*, we can form a new set
*v* as follows: collect all of the sets to which the members
of *u* are uniquely related by φ.

Note that the Replacement Schema can take you ‘out of’ the set
*u* when forming the set *v*. The elements of
*v* need not be elements of *u*. By contrast,
the well-known Separation Schema of Zermelo yields
new sets consisting only of those elements of a given set *u*
which satisfy a certain condition
ψ. That is, suppose that
ψ(*x*,) has
*x* free and may or may not have
*z*_{1},…,*z*_{k} free.
Then the Separation Schema asserts:

Separation Schema∀z_{1}…∀z_{k}[∀u∃v∀r(r∈v≡r∈u& ψ_{x,}[r,])]

In other words, if given a formula ψ and a set *u*,
there exists a set *v* which has as members precisely the members
of *u* which satisfy the formula ψ.

Thomas Jech jech@math.cas.cz |

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy