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Think of how you feel when your welfare depends on the decision of others and you have no come-back against that decision. You are in a position where you will sink or swim, depending on their say-so. And you have no physical or legal recourse, no recourse even in a network of mutual friends, against them. You are in their hands.

In any case of this kind you will be dominated by others, being in a position where those others have the power of interfering in your life in a certain way: and this, more or less arbitrarily; more or less at will and with impunity. If you do escape ill treatment, then, that will be by the grace or favour or the powerful, or by your own good fortune in being able to stay out of their way or keep them sweet. And even if you are lucky enough to escape such treatment, you will still live under the mastery of those others: they will occupy the position of a dominus -- the Latin word for master -- in your life (Pettit 1997).

If you understand the experience of exposure and  vulnerability to another -- the experience of domination -- and if you can see what is awful about it, then you are well on your way to understanding republicanism. This is republicanism, of course, as that doctrine has been understood in the long tradition, though not necessarily as it is understood in the manifestoes of contemporary political parties that go by that name. For the central theme in republican concerns throughout the ages -- the theme that explains all their other commitments -- has been a desire to arrange things so that citizens are not exposed to domination of this kind. They do not live, as the Romans used to say, in potestate domini: in the power of a master.

This republican concern was always expressed as a commitment to freedom, since freedom in the republican canon requires the absence, precisely, of domination. To enjoy republican freedom people have to be their own man or woman and that requires that they do not have a master or dominus who holds sway over them in any aspect of their lives.

Republican freedom is more demanding, then, than freedom in the contemporary sense of non-interference. For you may be lucky enough or wary enough to avoid interference by someone and yet live in the shadow of their power, whether they be an employer or spouse or local bully. According to the republican way of thinking you are unfree in such a situation, even before any actual interference occurs. Freedom requires the sort of immunity to interference -- the social and political status -- that would enable you to look every other in the eye. No one is free who has to keep a weather eye open for the whims of the more powerful, and if necessary adopt a servile attitude towards them.

1. An Old Theme

The themes just rehearsed have a long history, as scholars like Pocock, Skinner and Viroli have made clear to us (Pocock 1975; Skinner 1997; Viroli 2002). Republicanism was kindled in classical Rome, where Cicero and other thinkers gloried in the independence and non-domination of the Roman citizen. It was reignited in the Renaissance when the burghers of Italian cities like Venice and Florence prided themselves on how they could hold their heads on high and not have to beg anyone's favour. They were equal citizens of a common republic, so they felt, and were of a different political species from the cowed subjects of papal Rome or courtly France.

The republican flame passed to the English-speaking world in the seventeenth century when the ‘commonwealth’ tradition, which was forged in the experience of  the English civil war, established and institutionalised the view that king and people each lived under the discipline of the same law. Enthusiasts for the idea of a ‘commonwealth’ --  an English word for ‘republic’ -- argued that being protected by a fair law, no Briton had to depend on the arbitrary will of another, even the arbitrary will of the king.

This argument rebounded, of course, on Britain's own fortunes. For in the eighteenth century their American colonists became persuaded that they themselves were denied their due freedom: they had to depend on the arbitrary will of a foreign parliament. Perhaps they had to pay only one penny in taxes to the London government, as a contemporary writer put it, but the government that took that one penny had the power to take also their last penny. Perhaps their British master was kindly and well-disposed, in  other words used at the time, but the subjects of a kindly master were subjects still; they did not have the immunity to arbitrary power that true freedom requires.

Whether in classical Rome, renaissance Italy, seventeenth century England or eighteenth century America, all republicans saw domination as the great evil to be avoided in organising a community and a polity. They thought of freedom as the supreme political value and they equated freedom with not being stood over by anyone, even a benevolent and protective despot. To enjoy republican freedom was to be able to hold your head on high, to look others squarely in the eye, and to relate to your fellows without fear or deference.

2. From Republican Freedom to Republican Institutions

Republicanism in its Roman and neo-Roman guise has been distinguished, not just by the importance it accords to freedom as non-dependency, but also by the sorts of social and political institutions that it has generally preferred. Republicans have always argued that the state is required for promoting the freedom as non-dependency of its citizens, though in older days the citizens were restricted, as in every other tradition of thought, to mainstream, propertied males. Thus they have always held that the state is necessary to protect people from external and internal enemies, and to ensure against the abuse of private wealth or influence: this, for example, by ensuring a fair distribution of land or by legislating against certain forms of excessive wealth.

But if republicans have always defended the efficacy of the state in relation to such ends -- ends deriving, ultimately, from the goal of promoting people's freedom -- they have equally been insistent that the state is a two-edged sword. Unless it is restricted institutionally in various ways, it may itself prove a worse danger to people's freedom as non-domination than any danger it purports to guard against. If the state gives unfettered power to a single person, for example, as under an absolute monarchy or dictatorship, then that person will be able to interfere at will in people's lives and will dominate each and every one of them. Or if the state allows a particular faction or class to control what is done it its name, then the state will have that same dominating power in relation to those outside the class. If on the other hand, the state can be forced to track the avowed or readily avowable interests that citizens hold in common -- the common good, in the received phrase -- it will not represent an arbitrary power and will not dominate them.

The republican argument on this front has always been that in principle the state can be structured and constrained that it is forced to further only what is by all accounts in the common interest. The constraints generally favoured seek to divide up sovereignty between many bodies and offices, so that no one has absolute power -- this is the ideal of the mixed constitution -- and then to put in place pressures designed to discipline them into focusing on the common good.

The most constant points of emphasis, familiar ideas due to the influence of the tradition, are these:

  1. the importance of having a constitution, written or unwritten, within which government has to operate;
  2. the desirability of those in government being selected -- usually elected -- in such a way that different parts of the populace have their rival interests represented;
  3. the ideal of limiting the tenure of those in executive office, say by requiring their selection to be regularly renewed, as under periodic elections;
  4. the need for government to rule by law, not in a case-by-case fashion, and to ensure that its laws apply to everyone, legislators included, and are general, clear, well-understood, and so on;
  5. the indispensability of dividing up power, so that each authority is subject to checks and balances, and in particular the indispensability of separating out judicial power from executive and legislative power;
  6. the requirement that whatever decisions are made by government are backed up by reasons deriving from purportedly common interests, so that the relevance and strength of those reasons can be challenged in the legislature, the courts, or other forums;
  7. the inevitable reliance of this whole system on the existence of an active, concerned citizenry who invigilate the exercise of government power, challenge its abuses and seek office where necessary.

3. Conclusion

To sum up, then, republicanism is in the first place a theory of freedom and, in the second, a theory of government. It equates freedom with the enjoyment of non-domination: of living without a master in one's life. And it derives from the value of such freedom both an account of what the state ought to be doing and of how the state ought to be itself constrained; it provides a ground on which to elaborate both a substantive and a constitutional theory of the state. 

Two cautionary words, finally, about the account offered here. The first is that it articulates the sort of doctrine associated with republicanism in the mode in which it shaped European and American thought down to about the beginning of the nineteenth century when it was rapidly superseded by classical liberalism; this doctrine was more inclusive in its view of the citizenry but opted for a diluted view of freedom as non-interference (Pettit 1997, Ch.1).

But the liberalism that emerged in the nineteenth century -- together with its various derivates -- does not represent the only alternative to republicanism. The emergence of liberalism elicited in reaction a set of views that looked to the participatory Athenian polis -- a form of mob-rule in the view of neoRoman republicans -- as its model. While that approach is sometimes described as republicanism, it represents a rival to the position described here, not a variant, and a better name for the doctrine would probably be communitarianism (Sandel 1996). The emergence of this communitarian, participatory philosophy -- often romantic in character -- was greatly boosted by the influence of Jean Jacques Rousseau. While he incorporated many republican ideas in his philosophy -- in particular, the emphasis on the evil of dependency and the importance of a rule of law -- he had introduced the argument that the people as a collective body are the rightful sovereign and can never cede their sovereignty to representatives (Spitz 1995). This argument took republicanism in a radically new direction and made for a significant break with traditional doctrine.

The second cautionary word is that the account offered here does not attempt to explore the possibilities, philosophical and institutional, of developing republicanism as a contemporary political theory. The republican conception of freedom as non-domination offers an interesting counterpoint to the ruling idea of freedom as non-interference, and suggests a distinctive view of the state and its role. And, equally, the republican conception of the institutions needed for a free society offers something of a challenge to the one-eyed emphasis, prevalent in many circles, on majoritarian democracy. Republicanism promises to be a rich source of ideas on these fronts but the promise has not yet been fully explored (Honohan 2002; Maynor 2003). 

Republicanism is socially radical in indicting various forms of dependency, even dependency that does not give rise to actual interference. And equally, it is politically radical in suggesting that so far as the state is non-arbitrary, its coercive presence in people's lives will not deprive them of freedom proper -- freedom as non-domination; it will restrict their choices, but only in the manner of natural obstacles. This radicalism holds out a challenge in institutional design: to explore how far the state can guard people against domination in their lives -- on its own initiative, or in collaboration with elements of civil society -- and, in particular, how far it can do this without itself becoming a source of arbitary, dominating power (Richardson 2002; Brennan and Pettit 2003). If taken up seriously, that challenge could transform the direction of political theorizing.


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Philip Pettit

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