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Copenhagen Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics

As the theory of the atom, quantum mechanics is perhaps the most successful theory in the history of science. It enables physicists, chemists, and technicians to calculate and predict the outcome of a vast number of experiments and to create new and advanced technology based on the insight into the behavior of atomic objects. But it is also a theory that challenges our imagination. It seems to violate some fundamental principles of classical physics, principles that eventually have become a part of western common sense since the rise of the modern worldview in the Renaissance. So the aim of any metaphysical interpretation of quantum mechanics is to account for these violations.

The Copenhagen interpretation was the first general attempt to understand the world of atoms as this is represented by quantum mechanics. The founding father was mainly the Danish physicist Niels Bohr, but also Werner Heisenberg, Max Born and other physicists made important contributions to the overall understanding of the atomic world that is associated with the name of the capital of Denmark.

In fact Bohr and Heisenberg never totally agreed on how to understand the mathematical formalism of quantum mechanics, and none of them ever used the term “the Copenhagen interpretation” as a joint name for their ideas. In fact, Bohr once distanced himself from what he considered to be Heisenberg's more subjective interpretation (APHK, p.51). The term is rather a label introduced by people opposing Bohr's idea of complementarity, to identify what they saw as the common features behind the Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation as it emerged in the late 1920s. Today the Copenhagen interpretation is mostly regarded as synonymous with indeterminism, Bohr's correspondence principle, Born's statistical interpretation of the wave function, and Bohr's complementarity interpretation of certain atomic phenomena.

1. The Background

In 1900 Max Planck discovered that the radiation spectrum of black bodies occurs only with discrete energies separated by the value hv where v is the frequency and h is a new constant, the so-called Planck constant. According to classical physics the intensity of this continuous radiation would grow unlimitedly with growing frequencies, resulting in what was called the ultraviolet catastrophe. But Planck's suggestion was that if black bodies only exchange energy with the radiation field in a proportion equal to hv that problem would disappear. The fact that the absorption and the emission of energy is discontinuous is in conflict with the principles of classical physics. A few years later Albert Einstein used this discovery in his explanation of the photoelectric effect. He suggested that light waves were quantized, and that the amount of energy which each quantum of light could deliver to the electrons of the cathode, was exactly hv. The next step came in 1911 when Ernest Rutherford performed some experiments shooting alpha particles into a gold foil. Based on these results he could set up a model of the atom in which the atom consisted of a heavy nucleus with a positive charge surrounded by negatively charged electrons like a small solar system. Also this model was in conflict with the laws of classical physics. According to classical mechanics and electrodynamics one might expect that the electrons orbiting around a positively charged nucleus would continuously emit radiation so that the nucleus would quickly swallow the electrons.

At this point Niels Bohr entered the scene and soon became the leading physicist on atoms. In 1913 Bohr, visiting Rutherford in Manchester, put forward a mathematical model of the atom which provided the first theoretical support for Rutherford's model and could explain the emission spectrum of the hydrogen atom (the Balmer series). The theory was based on two postulates:

  1. An atomic system is only stable in a certain set of states, called stationary states, each state being associated with a discrete energy, and every change of energy corresponds to a complete transition from one state to another.
  2. The possibility for the atom to absorb and emit radiation is determined by a law according to which the energy of the radiation is given by the energy difference between two stationary states being equal to hv.

Some features of Bohr's semi-classical model were indeed very strange compared to the principles of classical physics. It introduced an element of discontinuity and indeterminism foreign to classical mechanics:

  1. Apparently not every point in space was accessible to an electron moving around a hydrogen nucleus. An electron moved in classical orbits, but during its transition from one orbit to another it was at no definite place between these orbits. Thus, an electron could only be in its ground state (the orbit of lowest energy) or an excited state (if an impact of another particle had forced it to leave its ground state.)
  2. It was impossible to predict when the transition would take place and how it would take place. Moreover, there were no external (or internal) causes that determined the “jump” back again. Any excited electron might in principle move spontaneously to either a lower state or down to the ground state.
  3. Rutherford pointed out that if, as Bohr did, one postulates that the frequency of light v, which an electron emits in a transition, depends on the difference between the initial energy level and the final energy level, it appears as if the electron must “know” to what final energy level it is heading in order to emit light with the right frequency.
  4. Einstein made another strange observation. He was curious to know in which direction the photon decided to move off from the electron.

Between 1913 and 1925 Bohr, Arnold Sommerfeld and others were able to improve Bohr's model, and together with the introduction of spin and Wolfgang Pauli's exclusion principle it gave a reasonably good description of the basic chemical elements. The model ran into problems, nonetheless, when one tried to apply it to spectra other than that of hydrogen. So there was a general feeling among all leading physicists that Bohr's model had to be replaced by a more radical theory. In 1925 Werner Heisenberg, at that time Bohr's assistant in Copenhagen, laid down the basic principles of a complete quantum mechanics. In his new matrix theory he replaced classical commuting variables with non-commuting ones. The following year, Erwin Schrödinger gave a simpler formulation of the theory in which he introduced a second-order differential equation for a wave function. He himself attempted a largely classical interpretation of the wave function. However, already the same year Max Born proposed a consistent statistical interpretation in which the square of the absolute value of this wave function expresses a probability amplitude for the outcome of a measurement.

2. Classical Physics

Bohr saw quantum mechanics as a generalization of classical physics although it violates some of the basic ontological principles on which classical physics rests. These principles are:

Due to these principles it is possible within, say, classical mechanics, to define a state of a system at any later time with respect to a state at any earlier time. So whenever we know the initial state consisting of the system's position and momentum, and know all external forces acting on it, we also know what will be its later states. The knowledge of the initial state is usually acquired by observing the state properties of the system at the time selected as the initial moment. Furthermore, the observation of a system does not affect its later behavior or, if observation somehow should influence this behavior, it is always possible to incorporate the effect into the prediction of the system's later state. Thus, in classical physics we can always draw a sharp distinction between the state of the measuring instrument being used on a system and the state of the physical system itself. It means that the physical description of the system is objective because the definition of any later state is not dependent on measuring conditions or other observational conditions.

Much of Kant's philosophy can be seen as an attempt to provide satisfactory philosophical grounds for the objective basis of Newton's mechanics against Humean scepticism. Kant showed that classical mechanics is in accordance with the transcendental conditions for objective knowledge. Kant's philosophy undoubtedly influenced Bohr in various ways as many scholars in recent years have noticed (Hooker 1972; Folse 1985; Honnor 1987; Faye 1991; Kaiser 1992; and Chevalley 1994). Bohr was definitely neither a subjectivist nor a positivist philosopher, as Karl Popper (1967) and Mario Bunge (1967) have claimed. He explicitly rejected the idea that the experimental outcome is due to the observer. As he said: “It is certainly not possible for the observer to influence the events which may appear under the conditions he has arranged” (APHK, p.51). Not unlike Kant, Bohr thought that we could have objective knowledge only in case we can distinguish between the experiential subject and the experienced object. It is a precondition for the knowledge of a phenomenon as being something distinct from the sensorial subject, that we can refer to it as an object without involving the subject's experience of the object. In order to separate the object from the subject itself, the experiential subject must be able to distinguish between the form and the content of his or her experiences. This is possible only if the subject uses causal and spatial-temporal concepts for describing the sensorial content, placing phenomena in causal connection in space and time, since it is the causal space-time description of our perceptions that constitutes the criterion of reality for them. Bohr therefore believed that what gives us the possibility of talking about an object and an objectively existing reality is the application of those necessary concepts, and that the physical equivalents of “space,” “time,” “causation,” and “continuity” were the concepts “position,” “time,” “momentum,” and “energy,” which he referred to as the classical concepts. He also believed that the above basic concepts exist already as preconditions of unambiguous and meaningful communication, built in as rules of our ordinary language. So, in Bohr's opinion the conditions for an objective description of nature given by the concepts of classical physics were merely a refinement of the preconditions of human knowledge.

3. The Correspondence Rule

The guiding principle behind Bohr's and later Heisenberg's work in the development of a consistent theory of atoms was the correspondence rule. Bohr had realized that according to his theory of the hydrogen atom, the frequencies of radiation due to the electron's transition between stationary states with large quantum numbers, i.e. states far from the ground state, coincide approximately with the results of classical electrodynamics. Hence in the search for a theory of quantum mechanics it became a methodological requirement to Bohr that any further theory of the atom should predict values in domains of large quantum numbers that should be a close approximation to the values of classical physics. The correspondence rule was a heuristic principle meant to make sure that in areas where the influence of Planck's constant could be neglected the numerical values predicted by such a theory should be the same as if they were predicted by classical radiation theory.

The correspondence rule was an important methodological principle. In the beginning it had a clear technical meaning for Bohr. It is obvious, however, that it makes no sense to compare the numerical values of the theory of atoms with those of classical physics unless the meaning of the physical terms in both theories is commensurable. The correspondence rule was based on the metaphysical idea that classical concepts were indispensable for our understanding of physical reality, and it is only when classical phenomena and quantum phenomena are described in terms of the same classical concepts that we can compare different physical experiences. It was this broader sense of the correspondence rule that Bohr often had in mind later on.

Bohr's practical methodology stands therefore in direct opposition to Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend's historical view that succeeding theories, like classical mechanics and quantum mechanics, are incommensurable. In contrast to their philosophical claims of meaning gaps and partial lack of rationality in the choice between incommensurable theories, Bohr believed not just retrospectively that quantum mechanics was a natural generalization of classical physics, but he and Heisenberg followed in practice the requirements of the correspondence rule. Thus, in the mind of Bohr, the meaning of the classical concepts did not change but their application was restricted. This was the lesson of complementarity.

4. Complementarity

After Heisenberg had managed to formulate a consistent quantum mechanics in 1925, both he and Bohr began their struggle to find a coherent interpretation for the mathematical formalism. Heisenberg and Bohr followed somewhat different approaches. Where Heisenberg looked to the formalism and developed his famous uncertainty principle or indeterminacy relation, Bohr chose to analyze concrete experimental arrangements, especially the double-slit experiment. In a way Bohr merely regarded Heisenberg's relation as an expression of his general notion that our understanding of atomic phenomena builds on complementary descriptions. At Como in 1927 he presented for the first time his ideas according to which certain different descriptions are said to be complementary.

Bohr pointed to two sets of descriptions which he took to be complementary. On the one hand there are those that attribute either kinematic or dynamic properties to the atom, that is “space-time descriptions” are complementary to “claims of causality.” On the other hand there are those that ascribe either wave or particle properties to a single object. How these two kinds of complementary sets of descriptions are related is something Bohr never indicated (Murdoch 1987). Even among people, like Rosenfeld and Pais, who claim they speak on behalf of Bohr, there is no agreement. The fact is that the description of light as either particles or waves was already a classical dilemma, which not even Einstein's definition of a photon really solved since the momentum of the photon as a particle depends on the frequency of the light as a wave. Furthermore, Bohr eventually realized that the attribution of kinematic and dynamic properties to an object is complementary because the ascription of both of these conjugate variables rests on mutually exclusive experiments. The attribution of particle and wave properties to an object may, however, occur in a single experiment; for instance, in the double-slit experiment where the interference pattern consists of single dots. So within less than ten years after his Como lecture Bohr tacitly abandoned “wave-particle complementarity” in favor of the exclusivity of “kinematic-dynamic complementarity” (Held 1994).

It was clear to Bohr that any interpretation of the atomic world had to take into account an important empirical fact. The discovery of the quantization of action meant that quantum mechanics could not fulfill the above principles of classical physics. Every time we measure, say, an electron's position the apparatus and the electron interact in an uncontrollable way, so that we are unable to measure the electron's momentum at the same time. Until the mid-1930s when Einstein, Podolsky and Rosen published their famous thought-experiment with the intention of showing that quantum mechanics was incomplete, Bohr spoke as if the measurement apparatus disturbed the electron. This paper had a significant influence on Bohr's line of thought. Apparently, Bohr realized that speaking of disturbance seemed to indicate—as some of his opponents may have understood him—that atomic objects were classical particles with definite inherent kinematic and dynamic properties. After the EPR paper he stated quite clearly: “the whole situation in atomic physics deprives of all meaning such inherent attributes as the idealization of classical physics would ascribe to such objects.”

Also after the EPR paper Bohr spoke about Heisenberg's “indeterminacy relation” as indicating the ontological consequences of his claim that kinematic and dynamic variables are ill-defined unless they refer to an experimental outcome. Earlier he had often called it Heisenberg's “uncertainty relation”, as if it were a question of a merely epistemological limitation. Furthermore, Bohr no longer mentioned descriptions as being complementary, but rather phenomena or information. He introduced the definition of a “phenomenon” as requiring a complete description of the entire experimental arrangement, and he took a phenomenon to be a measurement of the values of either kinematic or dynamic properties.

Bohr's more mature view, i.e., his view after the EPR paper, on complementarity and the interpretation of quantum mechanics may be summarized in the following points:

  1. The interpretation of a physical theory has to rely on an experimental practice.
  2. The experimental practice presupposes a certain pre-scientific practice of description, which establishes the norm for experimental measurement apparatus, and consequently what counts as scientific experience.
  3. Our pre-scientific practice of understanding our environment is an adaptation to the sense experience of separation, orientation, identification and reidentification over time of physical objects.
  4. This pre-scientific experience is grasped in terms of common categories like thing's position and change of position, duration and change of duration, and the relation of cause and effect, terms and principles that are now parts of our common language.
  5. These common categories yield the preconditions for objective knowledge, and any description of nature has to use these concepts to be objective.
  6. The concepts of classical physics are merely exact specifications of the above categories.
  7. The classical concepts—and not classical physics itself—are therefore necessary in any description of physical experience in order to understand what we are doing and to be able to communicate our results to others, in particular in the description of quantum phenomena as they present themselves in experiments;
  8. Planck's empirical discovery of the quantization of action requires a revision of the foundation for the use of classical concepts, because they are not all applicable at the same time. Their use is well defined only if they apply to experimental interactions in which the quantization of action can be regarded as negligible.
  9. In experimental cases where the quantization of action plays a significant role, the application of a classical concept does not refer to independent properties of the object; rather the ascription of either kinematic or dynamic properties to the object as it exists independently of a specific experimental interaction is ill-defined.
  10. The quantization of action demands a limitation of the use of classical concepts so that these concepts apply only to a phenomenon, which Bohr understood as the macroscopic manifestation of a measurement on the object, i.e. the uncontrollable interaction between the object and the apparatus.
  11. The quantum mechanical description of the object differs from the classical description of the measuring apparatus, and this requires that the object and the measuring device should be separated in the description, but the line of separation is not the one between macroscopic instruments and microscopic objects. It has been argued in detail (Howard 1994) that Bohr pointed out that parts of the measuring device may sometimes be treated as parts of the object in the quantum mechanical description.
  12. The quantum mechanical formalism does not provide physicists with a ‘pictorial’ representation: the ψ-function does not, as Schrödinger had hoped, represent a new kind of reality. Instead, as Born suggested, the square of the absolute value of the ψ-function expresses a probability amplitude for the outcome of a measurement. Due to the fact that the wave equation involves an imaginary quantity this equation can have only a symbolic character, but the formalism may be used to predict the outcome of a measurement that establishes the conditions under which concepts like position, momentum, time and energy apply to the phenomena.
  13. The ascription of these classical concepts to the phenomena of measurements rely on the experimental context of the phenomena, so that the entire setup provides us with the defining conditions for the application of kinematic and dynamic concepts in the domain of quantum physics.
  14. Such phenomena are complementary in the sense that their manifestations depend on mutually exclusive measurements, but that the information gained through these various experiments exhausts all possible objective knowledge of the object.

Earlier generations of philosophers have often accused the Copenhagen interpretation of being subjectivistic or positivistic. Today anyone who has studied Bohr's essays carefully agrees that his view is neither. There are, as many have noticed, both typically realist as well as antirealist elements involved in it, and it has affinities to Kant or neo-Kantianism.

Bohr thought of the atom as real. Atoms are neither heuristic nor logical constructions. A couple of times he emphasized this directly using arguments from experiments in a very similar way to Ian Hacking and Nancy Cartwright much later. What he did not believe was that the quantum mechanical formalism was true in the sense that it gave us a literal (‘pictorial’) rather than a symbolic representation of the quantum world. It makes much sense to characterize Bohr in modern terms as an entity realist who opposes theory realism (Folse 1987). It is because of the imaginary quantities in quantum mechanics (where the commutation rule for canonically conjugate variable, p and q, introduces Planck's constant into the formalism by pq - qp = ih/2π) that quantum mechanics does not give us a ‘pictorial’ representation of the world. Neither does the theory of relativity, Bohr argued, provide us with a literal representation, since the velocity of light is introduced with a factor of i in the definition of the fourth coordinate in a four-dimensional manifold (CC, p. 86 and p. 105). Instead these theories can only be used symbolically to predict observations under well-defined conditions. Thus Bohr was an antirealist or an instrumentalist when it comes to theories.

In general, Bohr considered the demands of complementarity in quantum mechanics to be logically on a par with the requirements of relativity in the theory of relativity. He believed that both theories were a result of novel aspects of the observation problem, namely the fact that observation in physics is context-dependent. This again is due to the existence of a maximum velocity of propagation of all actions in the domain of relativity and a minimum of any action in the domain of quantum mechanics. And it is because of these universal limits that it is impossible in the theory of relativity to make an unambiguous separation between time and space without reference to the observer (the context) and impossible in quantum mechanics to make a sharp distinction between the behavior of the object and its interaction with the means of observation (CC, p. 105).

In emphasizing the necessity of classical concepts for the description of the quantum phenomena, Bohr was influenced by Kant or neo-Kantianism. But he was a naturalized or a pragmatized Kantian. The classical concepts are merely explications of common concepts that are already a result of our adaptation to the world. These concepts and the conditions of their application determine the conditions for objective knowledge. The discovery of the quantization of action has revealed to us, however, that we cannot apply these concepts to quantum objects as we did in classical physics. Now kinematic and dynamic properties (represented by conjugate variables) can be meaningfully ascribed to the object only in relation to some actual experimental results, whereas classical physics attributes such properties to the object regardless of whether we actually observe them or not. In other words, Bohr denied that classical concepts could be used to attribute properties to a physical world in-itself behind the phenomena, i.e. properties different from those being observed. In contrast, classical physics rests on an idealization, he said, in the sense that it assumes that the physical world has these properties in-itself, i.e. as inherent properties, independent of their actual observation.

The Copenhagen interpretation is first and foremost a semantic and epistemological reading of quantum mechanics that carries certain ontological implications. Bohr's view was, to phrase it in a modern philosophical jargon, that the truth conditions of sentences ascribing a certain kinematic or dynamic value to an atomic object are dependent on the apparatus involved, in such a way that these truth conditions have to include reference to the experimental setup as well as the actual outcome of the experiment. Hence, those physicists who accuse this interpretation of operating with a mysterious collapse of the wave function during measurements do not understand a word of it. Bohr accepted the Born statistical interpretation because he believed that the ψ-function has only a symbolic meaning and does not represent anything real. It makes sense to talk about a collapse of the wave function only if, as Bohr put it, the ψ-function can be given a pictorial representation, something he strongly denied.

Indeed, Bohr, Heisenberg and many other physicists considered the Copenhagen Interpretation to be the only rational interpretation of the quantum world. They thought that it gave us the understanding of atomic phenomena that is in accordance with the conditions for any physical description and the possible objective knowledge of the world. Bohr believed that atoms are real, but it remains a much debated point in the recent literature what sort of reality he believed them to have, whether or not they are something beyond and different from what they are observed to be (Folse 1985 and 1994; and Faye 1991).


References to Work by Bohr

ATDN Bohr, N. (1934/1987), Atomic Theory and the Description of Nature, reprinted as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. I, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.
APHK Bohr, N. (1958/1987), Essays 1932-1957 on Atomic Physics and Human Knowledge, reprinted as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. II, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.
Essays Bohr, N. (1963/1987), Essays 1958-1962 on Atomic Physics and Human Knowledge, reprinted as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. III, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.
CC Bohr, N. (1998), Causality and Complementarity, supplementary papers edited by Jan Faye and Henry Folse as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. IV, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.

Other References

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

quantum mechanics | quantum theory: the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument in | Uncertainty Principle

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Jan Faye

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