This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

version history

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

This document uses XHTML/Unicode to format the display. If you think special symbols are not displaying correctly, see our guide Displaying Special Characters.
last substantive content change

Collapse Theories

Quantum mechanics, with its revolutionary implications, has posed innumerable problems to philosophers of science. In particular, it has suggested reconsidering basic concepts such as the existence of a world that is, at least to some extent, independent of the observer, the possibility of getting reliable and objective knowledge about it, and the possibility of taking (under appropriate circumstances) certain properties to be objectively possessed by physical systems. It has also raised many others questions which are well known to those involved in the debate on the interpretation of this pillar of modern science. One can argue that most of the problems are not only due to the intrinsic revolutionary nature of the phenomena which have led to the development of the theory. They are also related to the fact that, in its standard formulation and interpretation, quantum mechanics is a theory which is excellent (in fact it has met with a success unprecedented in the history of science) in telling us everything about what we observe, but it meets with serious difficulties in telling us what is. We are making here specific reference to the central problem of the theory, usually referred to as the measurement problem, or, with a more appropriate term, as the macro-objectification problem. It is just one of the many attempts to overcome the difficulties posed by this problem that has led to the development of Collapse Theories, i.e., to the Dynamical Reduction Program (DRP). As we shall see, this approach consists in accepting that the dynamical equation of the standard theory should be modified by the addition of stochastic and nonlinear terms. The nice fact is that the resulting theory is capable, on the basis of a unique dynamics which is assumed to govern all natural processes, to account at the same time for all well-established facts about microscopic systems as described by the standard theory as well as for the so-called postulate of wave packet reduction (WPR). As is well known, such a postulate is assumed in the standard scheme just in order to guarantee that measurements have outcomes but, as we shall discuss below, it meets with insurmountable difficulties if one takes the measurement itself to be a process governed by the linear laws of the theory. Finally, the collapse theories account in a completely satisfactory way for the classical behavior of macroscopic systems.

Two specifications are necessary in order to make clear from the beginning what are the limitations and the merits of the program. The only satisfactory explicit models of this type (which are essentially variations and refinements of the one, usually referred to as the GRW theory, proposed in refs. [Ghirardi, Rimini and Weber, 1985, 1986]) are phenomenological attempts to solve a foundational problem. At present, they involve phenomenological parameters which, if the theory is taken seriously, acquire the status of new constants of nature. Moreover, up to now, all attempts to build satisfactory relativistic generalizations of these models have met with serious mathematical difficulties due to the appearance of untractable divergences, even though they elucidate some crucial points and suggest that there is no reason of principle preventing to reach this goal.

In spite of the above remarks, we think that Collapse Theories have a remarkable relevance, since they represent a new way to overcome the difficulties of the formalism, to close the circle in the precise sense defined by Abner Shimony [Shimony, 1989], a way which until a few years ago was considered impracticable, and which, on the contrary, has been shown to be perfectly viable. Moreover, they have allowed a clear identification of the formal features which should characterize any unified theory of micro and macro processes.

1. General Considerations

As stated already, a very natural question which all scientists who are concerned about the meaning and the value of science have to face, is whether one can develop a coherent worldview that can accommodate our knowledge concerning natural phenomena as it is embodied in our best theories. Such a program meets serious difficulties with quantum mechanics, essentially because of two formal aspects of the theory which are common to all of its versions, from the original nonrelativistic formulations of the 1920s, to the quantum field theories of recent years: the linear nature of the state space and of the evolution equation, i.e., the validity of the superposition principle and the related phenomenon of entanglement, which, in Schrödinger's words:
is not one but the characteristic trait of quantum mechanics, the one that enforces its entire departure from classical lines of thought [Schrödinger, 1935, p. 807].
These two formal features have embarrassing consequences, since they imply

For the sake of generality, we shall first of all present a very concise sketch of ‘the rules of the game’.

2. The Formalism: A Concise Sketch

Let us recall the axiomatic structure of quantum theory:
1. States of physical systems are associated with normalized vectors in a Hilbert space, a complex, infinite-dimensional, linear vector space equipped with a scalar product. Linearity implies that the superposition principle holds: if |f> is a state and |g> is a state, then (for a and b arbitrary complex numbers) also
|K> = a|f> + b|g>
is a state. Moreover, the state evolution is linear, i.e., it preserves superpositions: if |f,t> and |g,t> are the states obtained by evolving the states |f,0> and |g,0>, respectively, from the initial time t=0 to the time t, then a|f,t> + b|g,t> is the state obtained by the evolution of a|f,0> + b|g,0>. Finally, the completeness assumption is made, i.e., that the knowledge of its statevector represents, in principle, the most accurate information one can have about the state of an individual physical system.
2. The observable quantities are represented by self-adjoint operators B on the Hilbert space. The associated eigenvalue equations B|bk> = bk|bk> and the corresponding eigenmanifolds (the linear manifolds spanned by the eigenvectors associated to a given eigenvalue, also called eigenspaces) play a basic role for the predictive content of the theory. In fact:
i. The eigenvalues bk of an operator B represent the only possible outcomes in a measurement of the corresponding observable.
ii. The norm (i.e. the length) of the projection of the normalized vector (i.e. of length 1) describing the state of the system onto the eigenmanifold associated to a given eigenvalue gives the probability of obtaining the corresponding eigenvalue as the outcome of the measurement. In particular, it is useful to recall that when one is interested in the probability of finding a particle at a given place, one has to resort to the so-called configuration space representation of the statevector. In such a case the statevector becomes a square-integrable function of the position variables of the particles of the system, whose modulus squared yields the probability density for the outcomes of position measurements.

We stress that, according to the above scheme, quantum mechanics makes only conditional probabilistic predictions (conditional on the measurement being actually performed) for the outcomes of prospective (and in general incompatible) measurement processes. Only if a state belongs already before the act of measurement to an eigenmanifold of the observable which is going to be measured, can one predict the outcome with certainty. In all other cases — if the completeness assumption is made — one has objective nonepistemic probabilities for different outcomes.

The orthodox position gives a very simple answer to the question: what determines the outcome when different outcomes are possible? Nothing — the theory is complete and, as a consequence, it is illegitimate to raise any question about possessed properties referring to observables for which different outcomes have non-vanishing probabilities of being obtained. Correspondingly, the referent of the theory are the results of measurement procedures. These are to be described in classical terms and involve in general mutually exclusive physical conditions.

As regards the legitimacy of attributing properties to physical systems, one could say that quantum mechanics warns us against requiring too many properties to be actually possessed by physical systems. However — with Einstein — one can adopt as a sufficient condition that one be able (without in any way disturbing the system) to predict with certainty the outcome of a measurement. In this case then, whenever the overall statevector factorizes into the product of a state of the Hilbert space of the physical system S and of the rest of the world, S does possess some properties (actually a complete set of properties, i.e., those associated to a maximal set of commuting observables).

Before concluding this section we must add some comments about the measurement process. Quantum theory was created to deal with microscopic phenomena. In order to obtain information about them one must be able to establish strict correlations between the states of the microscopic systems and the states of objects we can perceive. Within the formalism, this is described by considering appropriate micro-macro interactions. The fact that when the measurement is completed one can make statements about the outcome is accounted for by the already mentioned WPR postulate [Dirac, 1948]: a measurement always causes a system to jump in an eigenstate of the observed quantity. Correspondingly, also the statevector of the apparatus ‘jumps’ into the manifold associated to the recorded outcome.

3. The Macro-Objectification Problem

In this Section we shall clarify why the formalism we have just presented gives rise to the measurement or macro-objectification problem. To this purpose we shall, first of all, discuss the standard oversimplified argument based on the so-called von Neumann ideal measurement scheme. Then we shall discuss more recent results [Bassi and Ghirardi, 2000], which relinquish von Neumann's assumptions.

Let us begin by recalling the basic points of the standard argument:

Suppose that a microsystem S, just before the measurement of an observable B, is in the eigenstate |bj> of the corresponding operator. The apparatus (a macrosystem) used to gain information about B is initially assumed to be in a precise macroscopic state, its ready state, corresponding to a definite macro property — e.g., its pointer points at 0 on a scale. Since the apparatus A is made of elementary particles, atoms and so on, it must be described by quantum mechanics, which will associate to it the state vector |A0>. One then assumes that there is an appropriate system-apparatus interaction lasting for a finite time, such that when the initial apparatus state is triggered by the state |bj> it ends up in a final configuration |Aj>, which is macroscopically distinguishable from the initial one and from the other configurations |Ak> in which it would end up if triggered by a different eigenstate |bk>. Moreover, one assumes that the system is left in its initial state. In brief, one assumes that one can dispose things in such a way that the system-apparatus interaction can be described as:
(1) (initial state): |bk>|A0>
  (final state): |bk>|Ak>

Equation (1) and the hypothesis that the superposition principle governs all natural processes tell us that, if the initial state of the microsystem is a linear superposition of different eigenstates (for simplicity we will consider only two of them), one has:

(2) (initial state): (a|bk> + b|bj>)|A0>
  (final state): (a|bk>|Ak> + b|bj>|Aj>).

Some remarks about this are in order:

Nowadays, there is a general consensus that this solution is absolutely unacceptable for two basic reasons:

  1. It corresponds to assuming that the linear nature of the theory is broken at a certain level. Thus, quantum theory is unable to explain how it can happen that the apparata behave as required by the WPR postulate (which is one of the axioms of the theory).
  2. Even if one were to accept that quantum mechanics has a limited field of applicability, so that it does not account for all natural processes and, in particular, it breaks down at the macrolevel, it is clear that the theory does not contain any precise criterion for identifying the borderline between micro and macro, linear and nonlinear, deterministic and stochastic, reversible and irreversible. To use J.S. Bell's words, there is nothing in the theory fixing such a borderline and the split between the two above types of processes is fundamentally shifty. As a matter of fact, if one looks at the historical debate on this problem, one can easily see that it is precisely by continuously resorting to this ambiguity about the split that adherents of the Copenhagen orthodoxy or easy solvers [Bell, 1990] of the measurement problem have rejected the criticism of the heretics [Gottfried, 2000]. For instance, Bohr succeeded in rejecting Einstein's criticisms at the Solvay Conferences by stressing that some macroscopic parts of the apparatus had to be treated fully quantum mechanically; von Neumann and Wigner displaced the split by locating it between the physical and the conscious (but what is a conscious being?), and so on. Also other proposed solutions to the problem, notably certain versions of many-worlds interpretations, suffer from analogous ambiguities.

It is not our task to review here the various attempts to solve the above difficulties. One can find many exhaustive treatments of this problem in the literature. On the contrary, we would like to discuss how the macro-objectification problem is indeed a consequence of very general, in fact unavoidable, assumptions on the nature of measurements, and not specifically of the assumptions of von Neumann's model. This was established in a series of theorems of increasing generality, notably the ones by Fine [1970], Shimony [1974], Brown [1986] and Busch and Shimony [1996]. Possibly the most general and direct proof is given by Bassi and Ghirardi [2000], whose results we briefly summarize. The assumptions of the theorem are:

(i) that a microsystem can be prepared in two different eigenstates of an observable (such as, e.g., the spin component along the z-axis) and in a superposition of two such states;

(ii) that one has a sufficiently reliable way of ‘measuring’ such an observable, meaning that when the measurement is triggered by each of the two above eigenstates, the process leads in the vast majority of cases to macroscopically and perceptually different situations of the universe. This requirement allows for cases in which the experimenter does not have perfect control of the apparatus, the apparatus is entangled with the rest of the universe, the apparatus makes mistakes, or the measured system is altered or even destroyed in the measurement process;

(iii) that all natural processes obey the linear laws of the theory.

From these very general assumptions one can show that, repeating the measurement on systems prepared in the superposition of the two given eigenstates, in the great majority of cases one ends up in a superposition of macroscopically and perceptually different situations of the whole universe. If one wishes to have an acceptable final situation, one mirroring the fact that we have definite perceptions, one is arguably compelled to break the linearity of the theory at an appropriate stage.

4. The Birth of Collapse Theories

The debate on the macro-objectification problem continued for many years after the early days of quantum mechanics. In the early 1950s an important step was taken by D. Bohm who presented [Bohm, 1952] a mathematically precise deterministic completion of quantum mechanics (see the entry on Bohmian Mechanics). In the area of Collapse Theories, one should mention the contribution by Bohm and Bub [1966], which was based on the interaction of the statevector with Wiener — Siegel hidden variables. But let us come to Collapse Theories in the sense currently attached to this expression.

Various investigations during the 1970s can be considered as preliminary steps for the subsequent developments. In the years 1970-1973 L. Fonda, A. Rimini, T. Weber and myself were seriously concerned with quantum decay processes and in particular with the possibility of deriving, within a quantum context, the exponential decay law [Fonda, Ghirardi, Rimini and Weber; 1973, Fonda et al., 1978]. Some features of this approach are extremely relevant for the DRP. Let us list them:

Obviously, in these papers the reduction processes which are involved were not assumed to be ‘spontaneous and fundamental’ natural processes, but due to system-environment interactions.

Almost in the same years, P. Pearle [Pearle, 1976,1979], and subsequently N. Gisin [Gisin, 1984] and others, had entertained the idea of accounting for the reduction process in terms of a stochastic differential equation. However, they had not given any general suggestion about how to identify the states to which the dynamical equation should lead. Indeed, these states were assumed to depend on the particular measurement process one was considering. Without a clear indication on this point there was no way to identify a mechanism whose effect could be negligible for microsystems but extremely relevant for the macroscopic ones. N. Gisin gave subsequently an extremely interesting proof [Gisin, 1989] that nonlinear modifications of the standard equation without stochasticity are unacceptable since they imply the possibility of sending superluminal signals. Soon afterwards, R. Grassi and myself [Ghirardi and Grassi, 1991] showed that stochastic modifications without nonlinearity can at most induce ensemble and not individual reductions, i.e., they do not guarantee that the state vector of each individual physical system is driven in a manifold corresponding to definite properties.

5. The Original Collapse Model

As already mentioned, the Collapse Theory [Ghirardi, Rimini and Weber, 1986] we are going to describe amounts to accepting a modification of the standard evolution law of the theory such that microprocesses and macroprocesses are governed by a unique dynamics. Such a dynamics must imply that the micro-macro interaction in a measurement process leads to WPR. Bearing this in mind, recall that the characteristic feature distinguishing quantum evolution from WPR is that, while Schrödinger's equation is linear and deterministic (at the wave function level), WPR is nonlinear and stochastic. It is then natural to consider, as was suggested in the above papers, the possibility of nonlinear and stochastic modifications of the standard Schrödinger dynamics. However, the initial attempts to implement this idea were unsatisfactory for various reasons. The first, which we have already discussed, concerns the choice of the preferred basis: if one wants to have a universal mechanism leading to reductions, to which linear manifolds should the reduction mechanism drive the statevector? Or, equivalently, which of the (generally) incompatible ‘potentialities’ of the standard theory should we choose to make actual? The second, referred to as the trigger problem by Pearle [Pearle, 1989], is the problem of how the reduction mechanism can become more and more effective in going from the micro to the macro domain. The solution to this problem constitutes the central feature of the Collapse Theories of the GRW type. To discuss these points, let us briefly review the first consistent Collapse model [Ghirardi, Rimini and Weber, 1985] to appear in the literature.

Within such a model, originally referred to as QMSL (Quantum Mechanics with Spontaneous Localizations), the problem of the choice of the preferred basis is solved by remarking that the most embarrassing superpositions, at the macroscopic level, are those involving different spatial locations of macroscopic objects. Actually, as Einstein has stressed [Born, 1971, p. 223], this is a crucial point which has to be faced by anybody aiming to take a macro-objective position about natural phenomena: ‘A macro-body must always have a quasi-sharply defined position in the objective description of reality’. Accordingly, QMSL considers the possibility of spontaneous processes, which are assumed to occur instantaneously and at the microscopic level, which tend to suppress the linear superpositions of differently localized states. The required trigger mechanism must then follow consistently.

The key assumption of QMSL is the following: each elementary constituent of any physical system is subjected, at random times, to random and spontaneous localization processes (which we will call hittings) around appropriate positions. To have a precise mathematical model one has to be very specific about the above assumptions; in particular one has to make explicit HOW the process works, i.e. which modifications of the wave function are induced by the localizations, WHERE it occurs, i.e. what determines the occurrence of a localization at a certain position rather than at another one, and finally WHEN, i.e. at what times, it occurs. The answers to these questions are as follows.

Let us consider a system of N distinguishable particles and let us denote by F(q1, q2, … , qN) the coordinate representation (wave function) of the state vector (we disregard spin variables since hittings are assumed not to act on them).

(a) The answer to the question HOW is then: if a hitting occurs for the i-th particle at point x, the wave function is instantaneously multiplied by a Gaussian function (appropriately normalized)
G(qi, x) = K exp[−(1/2 d2)(qix)2],
where d represents the localization accuracy. Let us denote as
Li(q1, q2, … , qN ; x) = F(q1, q2, … , qN) G(qi, x)

the wave function immediately after the localization, as yet unnormalized.

(b) As concerns the specification of WHERE the localization occurs, it is assumed that the probability density P(x) of its taking place at the point x is given by the norm of the state Li (the length, or to be more precise, the integral of the modulus squared of the function Li over the 3N-dimensional space). This implies that hittings occur with higher probability at those places where, in the standard quantum description, there is a higher probability of finding the particle. Note that the above prescription introduces nonlinear and stochastic elements in the dynamics. The constant K appearing in the expression of G(qi, x) is chosen in such a way that the integral of P(x) over the whole space equals 1.

(c) Finally, the question WHEN is answered by assuming that the hittings occur at randomly distributed times, according to a Poisson distribution, with mean frequency f.

It is straightforward to convince oneself that the hitting process leads, when it occurs, to the suppression of the linear superpositions of states in which the same particle is well localized at different positions separated by a distance greater than d. As a simple example we can consider a single particle whose wavefunction is different from zero only in two small and far apart regions h and t. Suppose that a localization occurs around h; the state after the hitting is then appreciably different from zero only in a region around h itself. A completely analogous argument holds for the case in which the hitting takes place around t. As concerns points which are far from both h and t, one easily sees that the probability density for such hittings , according to the multiplication rule determining Li, turns out to be practically zero, and moreover, that if such a hitting were to occur, after the wave function is normalized, the wave function of the system would remain almost unchanged.

We can now discuss the most important feature of the theory, i.e., the Trigger Mechanism. To understand the way in which the spontaneous localization mechanism is enhanced by increasing the number of particles which are in far apart spatial regions (as compared to d), one can consider, for simplicity, the superposition |S>, with equal weights, of two macroscopic pointer states |H> and |T>, corresponding to two different pointer positions H and T, respectively. Taking into account that the pointer is ‘almost rigid’ and contains a macroscopic number N of microscopic constituents, the state can be written, in obvious notation, as:

(4) |S> = [|1 near h1> … |N near hN> + |1 near t1> … |N near tN>],

where hi is near H, and ti is near T. The states appearing in first term on the right-hand side of Eq. (4) have coordinate representations which are different from zero only when their arguments (1,…,N) are all near H, while those of the second term are different from zero only when they are all near T. It is now evident that if any of the particles (say, the i-th particle) undergoes a hitting process, e.g. near the point hi, the multiplication prescription leads practically to the suppression of the second term in (4). Thus any spontaneous localization of any of the constituents amounts to a localization of the pointer. The hitting frequency is therefore effectively amplified proportionally to the number of constituents. Notice that, for simplicity, the argument makes reference to an almost rigid body, i.e. to one for which all particles are around H in one of the states of the superposition and around T in the other. It should however be obvious that what really matters in amplifying the reductions is the number of particles which are in different positions in the two states appearing in the superposition itself.

Under these premises we can now proceed to choose the parameters d and f of the theory, i.e., the localization accuracy and the mean localization frequency. The argument just given allows one to understand how one can choose the parameters in such a way that the quantum predictions for microscopic systems remain fully valid while the embarrassing macroscopic superpositions in measurement-like situations are suppressed in very short times. Accordingly, as a consequence of the unified dynamics governing all physical processes, individual macroscopic objects acquire definite macroscopic properties. The choice suggested in the GRW-model is:

(5) f = 10-16 s-1
  d = 10-5 cm

It follows that a microscopic system undergoes a localization, on average, every hundred million years, while a macroscopic one undergoes a localization every 10-7 seconds. With reference to the challenging version of the macro-objectification problem presented by Schrödinger with the famous example of his cat, J.S. Bell comments [Bell, 1987, p.44]: [within QMSL] the cat is not both dead and alive for more than a split second . Besides the extremely low frequency of the hittings for microscopic systems, also the fact that the localization width is large compared to the dimensions of atoms (so that even when a localization occurs it does very little violence to the internal economy of an atom) plays an important role in guaranteeing that no violation of well-tested quantum mechanical predictions is implied by the modified dynamics.

Some remarks are appropriate. First of all, QMSL, being precisely formulated, allows to locate precisely the ‘split’ between micro and macro, reversible and irreversible, quantum and classical. The transition between the two types of ‘regimes’ is governed by the number of particles which are well localized at positions further apart than 10-5 cm in the two states whose coherence is going to be dynamically suppressed. Second, the model is, in principle, testable against quantum mechanics. As a matter of fact, an essential part of the program consists in proving that its predictions do not contradict any established fact about microsystems and macrosystems.

6. The Continuous Spontaneous Localization Model (CSL)

The model just presented (QMSL) has a serious drawback: it does not allow to deal with systems containing identical constituents because it does not respect the symmetry or antisymmetry requirements for such particles. A quite natural idea to overcome this difficulty would be that of relating the hitting process not to the individual particles but to the particle number density averaged over an appropriate volume. However, incorporating this idea in the QMSL scheme would require the introduction of a new constant besides the two which already appear in the model.

A more satisfactory solution to this problem (see however the remarks at the end of this subsection) can be obtained by injecting the physically appropriate principles of the GRW model within the approach of P. Pearle. This line of thought has led to a quite elegant formulation of a dynamical reduction model, usually referred to as CSL [Pearle, 1989; Ghirardi, Pearle and Rimini, 1990] in which the discontinuous jumps which characterize QMSL are replaced by a continuous stochastic evolution in the Hilbert space (a sort of Brownian motion of the statevector).

We will not enter into the rather technical details of this interesting development of the original GRW proposal, since the basic ideas and physical implications are precisely the same as those of the original formulation. Actually, one could argue that the above idea of tackling the problem of identical particles by considering the average particle number within an appropriate volume is correct. In fact it has been proved [Ghirardi, Pearle and Rimini, 1990] that for any CSL dynamics there is a hitting dynamics which, from a physical point of view, is ‘as close to it as one wants’. Instead of entering into the details of the CSL formalism, it is useful, for the discussion below, to analyze a simplified version.

7. A Simplified Version of CSL

With the aim of understanding the physical implications of the CSL model, such as the rate of suppression of coherence, we make now some simplifying assumptions. First, we assume that we are dealing with only one kind of particles (e.g., the nucleons), secondly, we disregard the standard Schrödinger term in the evolution and, finally, we divide the whole space in cells of volume d3. We denote by |n1, n2, … > a state in which there are ni particles in cell i, and we consider a superposition of two states |n1, n2, … > and |m1, m2, … > which differ in the occupation numbers of the various cells of the universe. With these assumptions it is quite easy to prove that the rate of suppression of the coherence between the two states (so that the final state is one of the two and not their superposition) is governed by the quantity:
(6) exp{−f[(n1m1)2 + (n2m2)2 + …]t},

the sum being extended to all cells in the universe. Apart from differences relating to the identity of the constituents, the overall physics is quite similar to that implied by QMSL. Obviously, there are interesting physical implications which deserve to be discussed. A detailed analysis has been presented in [Ghirardi and Rimini, 1990]. As shown there and as follows from estimates about possible effects for superconducting devices [Rae, 1990; Gallis and Fleming, 1990; Rimini, 1995], and for the excitation of atoms [Squires, 1991], it turns out not to be possible, with present technology, to perform clear-cut experiments allowing to discriminate the model from standard quantum mechanics [Benatti et al., 1995].

There is however an interesting aspect which might be relevant to idea of relating the suppression of coherence to gravitational effects. Given Eq. (6), notice that the worst case scenario (from the point of view of the time necessary to suppress coherence) is the superposition of two states for which the occupation numbers of the individual cells differ only by one unit. Indeed, in this case the amplifying effect of taking the square of the differences disappears. Let us then raise the question: how many nucleons (at worst) should occupy different cells, in order for the given superposition to be dynamically suppressed within the time which characterizes human perceptual processes? Since such a time is of the order of 10-2 sec and f = 10-16 sec-1, the number of displaced nucleons must be of the order of 1018, which corresponds, to a remarkable accuracy, to a Planck mass. This figure seems to point in the same direction as attempts such as Penrose's attempts to relate reduction mechanisms to quantum gravitational effects [Penrose, 1989].

8. Achievements of Collapse Theories

A. Pais famously recalls in his biography of Einstein:
We often discussed his notions on objective reality. I recall that during one walk Einstein suddenly stopped, turned to me and asked whether I really believed that the moon exists only when I look at it [Pais, 1982, p. 5].
In the context of Einstein's remarks in Albert Einstein, Philosopher-Scientist [Schilpp, 1949], we can regard this reference to the moon as an extreme example of ‘a fact that belongs entirely within the sphere of macroscopic concepts’, as is also a mark on a strip of paper that is used to register the outcome of a decay experiment, so that
as a consequence, there is hardly likely to be anyone who would be inclined to consider seriously […] that the existence of the location is essentially dependent upon the carrying out of an observation made on the registration strip. For, in the macroscopic sphere it simply is considered certain that one must adhere to the program of a realistic description in space and time; whereas in the sphere of microscopic situations one is more readily inclined to give up, or at least to modify, this program [p. 671].
the ‘macroscopic’ and the ‘microscopic’ are so inter-related that it appears impracticable to give up this program in the ‘microscopic’ alone [p. 674].

One might speculate that Einstein would not have taken the DRP seriously, given that it is a fundamentally indeterministic program. On the other hand, the DRP allows precisely for this middle ground, between giving up a ’realistic description in space and time’ altogether (the moon is not there when nobody looks), and requiring that it be applicable also at the microscopic level (as some kind of ‘hidden variables’ theory). It would seem that the pursuit of ‘realism’ for Einstein was more a program that had been very successful rather than an a priori commitment, and that in principle he would have welcomed attempts to give up or weaken microrealistic requirements, provided they allowed one to adopt a macrorealist position.

In the DRP, we can say of an electron in an EPR-Bohm situation that ‘when nobody looks’, it has no definite spin in any direction , and in particular that when it is in a superposition of two states localised far away from each other, it cannot be thought to be at a definite place. In the macrorealm, however, objects do have definite positions and are generally describable in classical terms. That is, the DRP program is not adding ‘hidden variables’ to the theory, but the moon is definitely there even if no sentient being has ever looked at it, or, in the words of J. S. Bell, the DRP

allows electrons (in general microsystems) to enjoy the cloudiness of waves, while allowing tables and chairs, and ourselves, and black marks on photographs, to be rather definitely in one place rather than another, and to be described in classical terms [Bell, 1986, p. 364].

Such a program, as we have seen, is realized by assuming only the existence of wave functions, and by proposing a unified dynamics that will govern both microscopic processes and ‘measurements’. As regards the latter, no vague definitions are needed in order to apply the theory. The equations are followed exactly, and the macroscopic ambiguities that would arise from the linear evolution are theoretically possible, but only of momentary duration, and thus arguably of no practical importance and no source of embarrassment.

We have not analyzed yet the implications about locality, but since in the DRP program no hidden variables are introduced, the situation can be no worse that in ordinary quantum mechanics: ‘by adding mathematical precision to the jumps in the wave function, it simply makes precise the action at a distance of ordinary quantum mechanics’ [Bell, 1987, p. 46]. Indeed, a detailed investigation of the locality properties of the theory becomes possible, and one can investigate whether the theory represents an approximation to a relativistically invariant theory. The analysis carried on so far, however, proves that at least in the non-relativistic version a program of dynamical reduction can be consistently developed. Moreover, as it will become clear when we will discuss the interpretation of the theory in terms of mass density, the QMSL and CSL theories lead in a natural way to attach definite properties in space and time to macroscopic objects, the main objective of Einstein's requirements.

The achievements of the DRP which are relevant for the debate about the foundations of quantum mechanics can also be concisely summarized in the words of H.P. Stapp:

The collapse mechanisms so far proposed could, on the one hand, be viewed as ad hoc mutilations designed to force ontology to kneel to prejudice. On the other hand, these proposals show that one can certainly erect a coherent quantum ontology that generally conforms to ordinary ideas at the macroscopic level [Stapp, 1989, p. 157].

9. Relativistic Dynamical Reduction Models

When confronted with a new theoretical scheme, particularly with one which, as we have seen [Bell, 1987], ‘makes precise the action at a distance of ordinary quantum mechanics’, one is naturally led to raise the question of whether it represents an approximation to a relativistically invariant theory. In this connection it is useful to mention, first of all, some interesting recent investigations of the non-local aspects of CSL.

As is well known, [Suppes and Zanotti, 1976; van Fraassen, 1982; Jarrett, 1984; Shimony, 1983; see also the entry on Bell's Theorem], Bell's locality assumption is equivalent to the conjunction of two other assumptions, viz., in Shimony's terminology, parameter independence and outcome independence. In view of the experimental violation of Bell's inequality, one has to give up either or both of these assumptions. The above splitting of the locality requirement into two logically independent conditions is particularly useful in discussing the different status of CSL and deterministic hidden variable theories with respect to relativistic requirements. In fact, as proved by Jarrett himself, when parameter independence is violated, if one had access to the variables which specify completely the state of individual physical systems, one could send faster-than-light signals from one wing of the apparatus to the other. Moreover, in ref. [Ghirardi and Grassi, 1994, 1996] it has been shown that it is impossible to build a genuine relativistically invariant theory which, in its nonrelativistic limit, exhibits parameter dependence and does not entail backward causation. On the other hand, if locality is violated only by the occurrence of outcome dependence then faster-than-light signaling cannot be achieved.

Now, it is well known that any deterministic theory (i.e., one in which the range of all probability distributions for outcomes is the set {0,1}) that reproduces quantum predictions must exhibit parameter dependence. This fact by itself suggest that such theories will certainly meet more serious difficulties with relativity than theories like standard quantum mechanics which violate only outcome independence and which do not allow faster-than-light signaling [Eberhard, 1978; Ghirardi, Rimini and Weber, 1980; Ghirardi, Grassi, Rimini and Weber, 1988]. What about CSL? It has been possible to prove [Ghirardi, Grassi, Butterfield and Fleming, 1993; Butterfield et al., 1993] that it, too, violates Bell's locality only by violating outcome independence. This is to some extent encouraging; even though, as we will be led to conclude, it seems extremely difficult to build a relativistic model inducing reductions, this result shows that there are no reasons of principle making such a project unviable.

Let us be more specific. The first attempt to obtain a relativistic generalization of dynamical reduction models was presented in ref. [Pearle, 1990]. It should be stressed that having individual reductions prevents the theory from being invariant at the individual level (note that QMSL and CSL are not even Galilei invariant at the individual level). Thus one is led to introduce a generalization of the invariance requirement: the theory must be stochastically invariant. This means that, even though the individual processes may look different to different observers, any two of them will agree on the composition of the final ensemble for (subjectively) the same initial conditions. We remark that it is precisely in this sense that both QMSL and CSL turn out to be Galilei invariant.

Pearle [1990] considered a fermion field coupled to a meson field and has put forward the idea of inducing localizations for the fermions through their coupling to the mesons and a stochastic dynamical reduction mechanism acting on the meson variables. He considered Heisenberg evolution equations for the coupled fields and a Tomonaga-Schwinger CSL-type evolution equation with a skew-hermitian coupling to a c-number stochastic potential for the state vector. This approach has been systematically investigated in refs. [Ghirardi, Grassi and Pearle, 1990a, 1990b] to which we refer the reader for a detailed discussion. Here we limit ourselves to stressing that, under certain approximations, one obtains in the non-relativistic limit a CSL-type equation inducing spatial localization. However, due to the white noise nature of the stochastic potential, novel renormalization problems arise: the increase per unit time and per unit volume in the energy of the meson field is infinite due to the fact that infinitely many mesons are created. For the reasons we have just discussed one cannot say that the possibility of generalizing CSL to the relativistic case has been established. Not even more recent attempts have succeeded in overcoming these difficulties.

Nevertheless, the efforts which have been spent on such a program have led to a better understanding of some points and have thrown light on important conceptual issues. First, they have led to a completely general and rigorous formulation of the concept of stochastic invariance [Ghirardi, Grassi and Pearle, 1990a]. Second, they have prompted a critical reconsideration, based on the discussion of smeared observables with compact support, of the problem of locality at the individual level. This analysis has brought out the necessity of reconsidering the criteria for the attribution of objective local properties to physical systems. In specific situations, one cannot attribute any local property to a microsystem: any attempt to do so gives rise to ambiguities. However, in the case of macroscopic systems, the impossibility of attributing to them local properties (or, equivalently, the ambiguity surrounding such properties) lasts only for time intervals of the order of those necessary for the dynamical reduction to take place. Moreover, no objective property corresponding to a local observable, even for microsystems, can emerge as a consequence of a measurement-like event occurring in a space-like separated region: such properties emerge only in the future light cone of the macroscopic event considered. Finally, recent investigations [Ghirardi and Grassi, 1994, 1996; Ghirardi, 1996, 2000] have shown that the very formal structure of the theory is such that it does not allow, even conceptually, to establish cause-effect relations between space-like events.

Having listed some interesting results obtained along these lines, in concluding this section it is necessary to stress once more the immense difficulties that the program of a relativistic generalization has met until now. The question of whether such a program will find a satisfactory formulation still remains ‘the big problem’ for this type of investigations.

10. Collapse Theories and Definite Perceptions

Some authors [Albert and Vaidman, 1989; Albert, 1990, 1992] have raised an interesting objection concerning the emergence of definite perceptions within Collapse Theories. The objection is based on the fact that one can easily imagine situations leading to definite perceptions, that nevertheless do not involve the displacement of a large number of particles up to the stage of the perception itself. These cases would then constitute actual measurement situations which cannot be described by QMSL, contrary to what happens for the idealized (according to the authors) situations considered in QMSL, i.e. those involving the displacement of some sort of pointer. To be more specific, the above papers considered a ‘measurement’ process whose output is the emission of a burst of photons. This can easily be devised by considering, e.g., a Stern-Gerlach set-up in which the two paths followed by the microsystem according to the value of its spin component hit a fluorescent screen and excite a small number of atoms which subsequently decay, emitting a small number of photons. The argument goes as follows: since only a few atoms are excited, since the excitations involve displacements which are smaller than the characteristic localization distance of QMSL, since QMSL does not induce reductions on photon states and, finally, since the photon states immediately overlap, there is no way for the spontaneous localization mechanism to become effective. The superposition of the states ‘photons emerging from point A of the screen’ and ‘photons emerging from point B of the screen’ will last for a long time. On the other hand, since the visual perception threshold is quite low (about 6-7 photons), there is no doubt that the naked eye of a human observer is sufficient to detect whether the luminous spot on the screen is at A or at B. The conclusion follows: in the case under consideration no dynamical reduction can take place and as a consequence no measurement is over, no outcome is definite, up to the moment in which a conscious observer perceives the spot.

We have presented a detailed answer to this criticism [Aicardi et al., 1991]. The crucial points of our argument are the following: we perfectly agree that in the case considered the superposition persists for long times (actually the superposition must persist, since, the system under consideration being microscopic, one could perform interference experiments which everybody would expect to confirm quantum mechanics). However, to deal in the appropriate and correct way with such a criticism, one has to consider all the systems which enter into play (electron, screen, photons and brain) and the universal dynamics governing all relevant physical processes. A simple estimate of the number of ions which are involved in the visual perception mechanism makes perfectly plausible that, in the process, a sufficient number of particles are displaced by a sufficient spatial amount to satisfy the conditions under which, according to QMSL, the suppression of the superposition of the two nervous signals will take place within the time scale of perception.

To avoid misunderstandings, this analysis by no means amounts to attributing a special role to the conscious observer or to perception. The observer's brain is the only system present in the set-up in which a superposition of two states involving different locations of a large number of particles occurs. As such it is the only place where the reduction can and actually must take place according to the theory. It is extremely important to stress that if in place of the eye of a human being one puts in front of the photon beams a spark chamber or a device leading to the displacement of a macroscopic pointer, or producing ink spots on a computer output, reduction will equally take place. In the given example, the human nervous system is simply a physical system, a specific assembly of particles, which performs the same function as one of these devices, if no other such device interacts with the photons before the human observer does. It follows that it is incorrect and seriously misleading to claim that QMSL requires a conscious observer to make definite the macroscopic properties of physical systems.

A further remark may be appropriate. The above analysis could be taken by the reader as indicating a very naive and oversimplified attitude towards the deep problem of the mind-brain correspondence. There is no claim and no presumption that QMSL allows a physicalist explanation of conscious perception. It is only pointed out that, for what we know about the purely physical aspects of the process, one can state that before the nervous pulses reach the higher visual cortex, the conditions guaranteeing the suppression of one of the two signals are verified. In brief, a consistent use of the dynamical reduction mechanism in the above situation accounts for the definiteness of the conscious perception, even in the extremely peculiar situation devised by Albert and Vaidman.

11. The Interpretation of the Theory

As stressed in the opening sentences of this contribution, the most serious problem of standard quantum mechanics lies in its being extremely successful in telling us about what we observe, but being basically silent on what is. This specific feature is closely related to the probabilistic interpretation of the statevector, combined with the completeness assumption of the theory. Notice that what is under discussion is the probabilistic interpretation, not the probabilistic character, of the theory. Also collapse theories have a fundamentally stochastic character, but, due to their most specific feature, i.e. that of driving the statevector of any individual physical system into appropriate and physically meaningful manifolds, they allow for a different interpretation. In fact, one could say (if one wants to avoid that they too, as the standard theory, speak only of what we find) that they impose a different interpretation, one that accounts for our perceptions at the appropriate, i.e. macroscopic, level.

The question of the correct interpretation of the theory has been the subject of debate, some of the principal approaches having originated with J. S. Bell. Given that the wavefunction itself is an object in the (higher-dimensional) configuration space, Bell was particularly keen to identify what could be taken as some kind of ‘local beable’, from which one could obtain a representation of the perceived reality in ordinary three-dimensional space. In the specific context of QMSL, Bell [1987, p. 45] suggested that the ‘GRW jumps’, which we called ‘hittings’ above, could play this role. Later, he suggested that the most natural interpretation for the wavefunction in the context of a collapse theory would be as describing the ‘density […] of stuff’ in configuration space [Bell, 1990, p. 30]. The interpretation which, in the opinion of the present writer, is most appropriate for collapse theories [Ghirardi, Grassi and Benatti, 1995, Ghirardi, 1997a, 1997b] was ultimately developed from this suggestion, together with the firm conviction that an acceptable interpretation should establish precise links between our formal description of physical processes and the events taking place in the three-dimensional space we ‘see’ around us.

First of all, various investigations [Pearle and Squires, 1994] had made clear that QMSL and CSL needed a modification, i.e., the characteristic localization frequency of the elementary constituents of matter had to be made proportional to the mass characterizing the particle under consideration. In particular, the original frequency for the hitting processes f = 10-16 sec-1 is the one characterizing the nucleons, while, e.g., electrons would suffer hittings with a frequency reduced by about 2000 times. Unfortunately we have no space to discuss here the physical reasons which make this choice appropriate; we refer the reader to the above paper, as well as to the recent detailed analysis by Peruzzi and Rimini [Peruzzi and Rimini, 2000]. With this modification, what the nonlinear dynamics strives to make ‘objectively definite’ is the average mass distribution in the whole universe (averaged over appropriate volumes associated with the characteristic localization accuracy of the theory). Second, a deep critical reconsideration [Ghirardi, Grassi and Benatti, 1995] has made evident how the concept of ‘distance’ that characterizes the Hilbert space is inappropriate in accounting for the similarity or difference between macroscopic situations. Just to give a convincing example, consider three states |h>, |h*> and |t> of a macrosystem (let us say a massive macroscopic bulk of matter), the first corresponding to its being located here, the second to its having the same location but one of its atoms (or molecules) being in a state orthogonal to the corresponding state in |h>, and the third having exactly the same internal state of the first but being differently located (there). Then, despite the fact that the first two states are practically indistinguishable from each other at the macrolevel, while the first and the third correspond to completely different and directly perceivable situations, the Hilbert space distance between |h> and |h*>, is equal to that between |h> and |t>.

When the localization frequency is related to the mass of the constituents, then, as above and completely generally (i.e. even when one is dealing with a body which is not almost rigid, such as a gas or a cloud), the mechanism leading to the suppression of the superpositions of macroscopically different states is fundamentally governed by the sum (or the integral) of the squared differences of the mass densities associated to the two superposed states, averaged over the characteristic volume of the theory, i.e., 10-15 cm 3 . This suggests taking the following attitude: what the theory is about, what is real ‘out there’ at a given space point x, is just the average mass density in the characteristic volume around x :

(7) M(x,t) = < F,t | M(x) | F,t >,

where M(x) is the mass density operator corresponding to the given volume around x and |F,t> is the statevector characterizing the system at the given time. It is obvious that within standard quantum mechanics such a function cannot be endowed with any objective physical meaning due to the occurrence of linear superpositions of macroscopically different mass distributions which give rise to values that do not correspond to what we find in a measurement process or what we perceive (typically the equal weight superposition of the states |h> and |t> will give rise to a mass density distribution which is 1/2 of the actual one both ‘here’ and ‘there’). But in a CSL model relating reductions to mass density differences, the dynamics, as we have seen, suppresses in extremely short times these embarrassing superpositions. In this case, if one considers only the states allowed by the dynamics one can give a description of the world in terms of M(x,t), i.e., one recovers a physically meaningful account of physical reality in the usual 3-dimensional space and time. Resorting to the quantity (7) one can also define an appropriate ‘distance’ between two states as the integral over the whole 3-dimensional space of the square of the difference of M(x,t) for the two given states, a quantity which turns out to be perfectly appropriate to ground the concept of macroscopically similar or distinguishable Hilbert space states. In turn this distance can be used as a basis to define a sensible psychophysical correspondence within the theory.

12. The Problem of the Tails of the Wave Function

In recent years, there has been a lively debate around a problem which has its origin, according to some of the authors which have raised it, in the fact that even though the localization process, which corresponds to multiplying the wave function times a Gaussian, and thus leads to wave functions strongly peaked around the position of the hitting, it leads to wave functions that are different from zero over the whole of space. The first criticism of this kind was raised by A. Shimony [Shimony, 1990] and can be summarized by his sentence,
one should not tolerate tails in wave functions which are so broad that their different parts can be discriminated by the senses, even if very low probability amplitude is assigned to them.
After a localization of a macroscopic system, typically the pointer of the apparatus, its centre of mass will be associated to a wave function which is different from zero over the whole space. If one adopts the probabilistic interpretation of the standard theory, this means that even when the measurement process is over, there is a nonzero (even though extremely small) probability of finding its pointer in an arbitrary position, instead of the one corresponding to the registered outcome. This is taken as inacceptable, as indicating that the DRP does not actually overcome the macro-objectification problem.

Let us state immediately that the (alleged) problem arises entirely from keeping the standard interpretation of the wave function unchanged, in particular assuming that its modulus squared gives the probability density of the position variable. However, as we have discussed in the previous section, there are much more serious reasons of principle which require to abandon the probabilistic interpretation and replace it either with one of those proposed by Bell, or, more appropriately in our opinion, with the mass density interpretation have outlined above.

Before entering into a detailed discussion of this subtle point we need to focus the problem better. We cannot avoid making two remarks. Suppose one adopts, for the moment, the conventional quantum position. We agree that, within such a framework, the fact that wave functions never have strictly compact spatial support can be considered puzzling. However this is a problem arising directly from the mathematical features (spreading of wave functions) and from the probabilistic interpretation of the theory, and not at all a problem peculiar to the dynamical reduction models. Indeed, the fact that, e.g., the wave function of the centre of mass of a pointer or of a table has not a compact support has never been taken to be a problem for standard quantum mechanics. When the wave function is extremely well peaked around a given point in space, it has always been accepted that it describes a table located at a certain position, and that this corresponds in some way to our perception of it. It is obviously true that, for the given wave function, the quantum rules entail that if a measurement were performed the table could be found (with an extremely small probability) to be kilometers far away, but this is not the measurement or the macro-objectification problem of the standard theory. The latter concerns a completely different situation, i.e., that in which one is confronted with a superposition with comparable weights of two macroscopically separated wave functions, both of which possess tails (i.e., have non-compact support) but are appreciably different from zero only in very narrow intervals. This is the really embarrassing situation which conventional quantum mechanics is unable to make understandable. To which perception of the position of the table does this wave function correspond?

The implications for this problem of the adoption of the QMSL theory should be obvious. Within QMSL, the superposition of two states which, when considered individually, are assumed to lead to different and definite perceptions of macroscopic locations, are dynamically forbidden. If some process tends to produce such superpositions, then the reducing dynamics induces the localization of the centre of mass (the associated wave function being appreciably different from zero only in a narrow and precise interval). Correspondingly, the possibility arises of attributing to the system the property of being in a definite place and thus of accounting for our definite perception of it. Summarizing, we stress once more that the criticism about the tails as well as the requirement that the appearance of macroscopically extended (even though extremely small) tails be strictly forbidden is exclusively motivated by uncritically committing oneself to the probabilistic interpretation of the theory, even for what concerns the psycho-physical correspondence: states assigning non-exactly vanishing probabilities to different outcomes of position measurements must correspond to ambiguous perceptions about these positions. Since neither within the standard formalism nor within the framework of dynamical reduction models a wave function can have compact support, taking such a position leads to conclude that it is just the Hilbert space description of physical systems which has to be given up.

It ought to be stressed that there is nothing in the GRW theory which would make the choice of functions with compact support problematic for the purpose of the localizations, but it also has to be noted that following this line would be totally useless: since the evolution equation contains the kinetic energy term, any function, even if it has compact support at a given time, will instantaneously spread acquiring a tail extending over the whole of space. If one sticks to the probabilistic intepretation and one accepts the completeness of the description of the states of physical systems in terms of the wave function, the tail problem cannot be avoided.

The solution to the tails problem can only derive from abandoning completely the probabilistic interpretation and from adopting a more physical and realistic intepretation relating ‘what is out there’ to, e.g., the mass density distribution over the whole universe. In this connection, the following example will be instructive [Ghirardi, Grassi and Benatti, 1995]. Take a massive sphere of normal density and mass of about 1 kg. Classically, the mass of this body would be totally concentrated within the radius of the sphere, call it r. In QMSL, after the extremely short time interval in which the collapse dynamics leads to a ‘regime’ situation, and if one considers a sphere with radius r + 10-5 cm, the integral of the mass density over the rest of space turns out to be an incredibly small fraction (of the order of 1 over 10 to the power 1015) of the mass of a single proton. In such conditions, it seems quite legitimate to claim that the macroscopic body is localised within the sphere.

However, also this quite reasonable position has been questioned and it has been claimed [Lewis, 1997], that the very existence of the tails implies that the enumeration principle (i.e. the fact that the claim ‘particle 1 is within this box & particle 2 is within this box & … & particle n is within this box & no other particle is within this box’ implies the claim ‘there are n particles within this box’) does not hold, if one takes seriously the mass density interpretation of collapse theories. This paper has given rise to a long debate which would be inappropriate to reproduce here. We refer the reader to the following papers [Ghirardi and Bassi, 1999; Clifton and Monton, 1999a, 1999b; Bassi and Ghirardi, 1999, 2001]. Various arguments have been presented in favour and against the criticism by Lewis.

We would like to conclude this brief analysis by stressing once more that, in our opinion, all the disagreements and the misunderstandings concerning this problem have their origin in the fact that the idea that the probabilistic interpretation of the wave function must be abandoned has not been fully accepted by the authors who find some difficulties in the proposed mass density intepretation of the Collapse Theories.


We hope to have succeeded in giving a clear picture of the ideas, the implications, the achievements and the problems of the DRP. We conclude by stressing once more our position with respect to the Collapse Theories. Their interest derives entirely from the fact that they have given some hints about a possible way out from the difficulties characterizing standard quantum mechanics, by proving that explicit and precise models can be worked out which agree with all known predictions of the theory and nevertheless allow, on the basis of a universal dynamics governing all natural processes, to overcome in a mathematically clean and precise way the basic problems of the standard theory. In particular, the Collapse Models show how one can work out a theory that makes perfectly legitimate to take a macrorealistic position about natural processes, without contradicting any of the experimentally tested predictions of standard quantum mechanics.


Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Bell's Theorem | quantum mechanics | quantum mechanics: Bohmian mechanics

Copyright © 2002
Giancarlo Ghirardi

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy