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Singular Propositions

Singular propositions (also called ‘Russellian propositions’) are propositions that are about a particular object or individual in virtue of having the object or individual as a constituent of the proposition. Alleged examples of singular propositions are the propositions that Mont Blanc is more than 4,000 meters high, that Socrates was wise, and that she [pointing to someone] lives in New York. Singular propositions are to be contrasted with general propositions and (what we can call) particularized propositions. The former are propositions that are not about any particular item (as opposed to a class or kind of item) and the latter are propositions that are about particulars or individuals but do not contain those individuals as constituents. Examples of the former are the propositions that most Americans favor a tax cut and that some music is great; examples of the latter are the propositions that the inventor of bifocals was bald and that the tallest spy is a man. The acceptance or rejection of singular propositions lies at the center of many issues in semantics, the philosophy of language, and metaphysics.

1. Sense and Reference

There are, roughly speaking, two kinds of theories in the philosophy of language and many versions of these theories. There are the Fregean theories that employ some version of Frege's distinction between sense and reference and the Russellian theories that employ some version of Russell's theory of scope and incomplete symbols. (One can, of course, combine the two views in various ways but generally such combinations tend to side with Frege over Russell on the nature of propositions and hence count as Fregean in the present context.) Again roughly speaking, Frege distinguished between the referent of an expression or term and the sense of that expression or term. For example, the referent of the term ‘human’ is the set of humans while the sense of the term might be described as the property of being homo sapiens (although, strictly speaking, senses are not properties). For complex expressions, such as the inventor of bifocals, the sense of the whole expression is a function of the sense of its parts and the referent of the whole expression is a function of the referent of the parts. This is also true for complete sentences. The proposition that is expressed by a sentence is the sense of the sentence which in turn is a function of the senses of the parts of the sense. Thus for Frege objects are not constituents of propositions. Propositions are composed of the senses of terms and expressions that refer to objects, but not the objects themselves.

Russell, on the other hand, rejected senses and attempted to solve the problems that senses were introduced to solve by logical analysis and scope distinctions. The result was that propositions expressed by sentences such as "The inventor of bifocals was bald" did not have senses as constituents. However, they did not have objects as constituents either. Roughly speaking, Russell had propositional functions--functions from objects to propositions-- in place of senses. Yet at the bottom level such a view seems to require singular propositions. These are the basic or atomic propositions upon which the complex propositions are built. Frege's atomic propositions are composed of senses while Russell's require individuals.

Recently, David Kaplan has argued that essential difference between Frege's and Russell's theories of language is nothing more nor less than the acceptance of singular propositions. If we were to add singular propositions to Frege's theory then with some modifications we could reduce Frege's view to Russell's view. Hence, if Kaplan is correct and there are singular propositions as well, then we need not introduce the complexities of a Fregean theory of sense and we can focus our semantical attention on the simpler Russellian theories.

2. Reasons for Singular Propositions

The primary reasons offered in favor of accepting singular propositions are semantical or linguistic in nature. (Although David Lewis argues that if we accept that there are individuals and properties and pairs of things we accept, then we must accept that there are singular propositions.) Perhaps the strongest of the semantical reasons for singular propositions are those associated with the development of an adequate theory of demonstratives or indexicals. David Kaplan, for example, has argued that indexical expressions (e.g., ‘I’, ‘now’) are what he calls ‘directly referential’ expressions. An expression is directly referential if the expression (relative to a context of use) directly refers to its object and the referent is not determined or fixed in virtue of the fact that the object in question is characterized by a descriptive property or a Fregean sense.

Let us assume without argument that there are propositions. We make this assumption knowing that many philosophers have serious doubts about the existence of propositions. However, our current purpose is to ask whether there are any positive reasons that can be given in favor of singular propositions even granting that there are propositions. We will use an argument that was originally presented by David Kaplan to show that demonstratives are directly referential expressions (and hence are used to express singular propositions). Suppose David is standing at a table with two men; Charles on his left and Paul on his right. Paul lives in New Jersey and Charles lives in Illinois. David points to the person on his right and says (at time t)

(1) He lives in New Jersey.
David has expressed a proposition that we can label p that is about Paul. Is p a singular proposition; that is, is it a proposition that has Paul as a constituent? Let us begin by assuming that pis not a singular proposition. If it is not a singular proposition then it does not have Paul as a constituent, but is about Paul is another way. (If p is a singular proposition then it is about Paul by having Paul as a constituent.) Consider then the proposition expressed by
(2) The person on David's right (at t) lives in New Jersey ,
which we can label p*. p* is a proposition about Paul but it does not have Paul as a constituent. Perhaps p* (or something similar to p*) is p. However, consider a counterfactual circumstance where David had been tricked into thinking that Paul is to his right and that Charles is to his left. That is, suppose, contrary to the facts, Paul and Charles switched places. In such a case p* would not be true, but p would be true. p* would not be true because the person on David's right, namely Charles, does not live in New Jersey. p on the other hand is still true, for though in the counterfactual circumstance Paul and Charles have switched locations relative to David they still live in their respective states in the counterfactual circumstance.

It is important here to be clear about what we are supposing. We are asking what the truth value of the propositions p and p* would be in the described counterfactual circumstance. We are not asking what proposition would David express by uttering (1) in the counterfactual circumstance. It is true that the proposition expressed by (1) will differ in different circumstances of utterance or different contexts. Paul can utter (1) pointing to Charles or Charles can utter (1) pointing to David. In these different contexts different propositions will be expressed.

Nonetheless since p and p* differ in truth value in the described counterfactual circumstance, p* cannot be p. (It is an axiom of propositional theory that if p = p* then p and p* have the same truth value in all counterfactual circumstances.) A similar argument can be presented for any proposition that is in fact about Paul, but could be about someone else in a different counterfactual circumstance. So, for example, if we replaced (2) with

(3) The person David is pointing to lives in New Jersey,
we will run into the same problem.

One might suppose that one can avoid singular propositions by claiming, along lines similar to what David Lewis has argued, that it is a mistake to place any philosophical importance on the question of what is true in a counterfactual circumstance simplicter. Counterfactual circumstances are merely one parameter among many that are necessary to determine truth. What we should say is that (1) is true relative to a complex or structure that contains a context and a counterfactual (or factual) circumstance among other parameters. Viewed in this light it appears that (1) and (3) have the same truth value given the same parameters. One result with this way of looking at things is that either propositions are identified with sentences (types) or sets of items containing all the necessary parameters (such as sets of possible worlds). David Lewis accepts the latter and in so doing accepts that there are singular propositions. So Lewis's way of looking at things does not avoid commitment to singular propositions. If one accepts that propositions are sentences then one must give up the view that they can be about particulars. For on such a view the proposition David expresses when he says

(4) I am bored.
is the same proposition that Paul, Charles, or anyone else would express were they to utter (4). So it would be a mistake to say that (4) as uttered by David is about David. But then p would not be about Paul as we assumed. There are, of course, other reasons to deny that sentences are propositions that properly belong to a general discussion of propositions. Besides it is not completely clear that there is no philosophical significance in dividing things up the way Kaplan does. After all, there is something rather plausible in Kaplan's suggestion that context is used to help determine which proposition is expressed as opposed to being part of a complex that determines the truth of an already present proposition.

Still, given what we have said thus far, it is possible that Paul is not a constituent of p but the singleton set of Paul or the property of being Paul is a constituent of p. The reason in favor of Paul over his singleton as a constituent of p concerns issues of reference in the philosophy of language. Can we directly refer to an individual or property? Can we directly refer to the singleton of Paul? If the answer is yes, then we could run into a problem if we claimed that p has Paul's singleton as a constituent. Let a be an expression that directly refers to Paul's singleton. Sets, of course, do not live in states so the proposition expressed by the following is false

(5) a lives in New Jersey.
Yet, the proposition expressed by (5) appears to have the same constituents as p if Paul's singleton, as opposed to Paul, is a constituent of p. This argument is not conclusive since it depends on the assumption that one can refer directly to an item with the use of some linguistic expression and not via some representative of the item. In the end it may not matter whether Paul or some representative of Paul is a constituent of p provided that the representative is an essential representative of Paul (i.e., something that represents Paul in all (and only) counterfactual circumstances where Paul can represent himself).

3. A Modal Argument against Singular Propositions

Although there are some reasons for thinking that there are singular propositions there are also reasons for thinking that there are no singular propositions. Alvin Plantinga, for example, has raised the following objection. Consider the proposition:
(6) Socrates did not exist.
While (6) is false, it might have been true (here the number designates the proposition (if there is one) as opposed to the sentence). That is, it is possibly true. If (6) had been true, then (6) would have existed. After all, (6) cannot have the property of being true without existing, so had (6) been true then Socrates would not have existed, but (6) would have existed. But if Socrates is a constituent of (6), then (6) cannot exist without Socrates's existing. Therefore, Socrates is not a constituent of (6).

Basically, Plantinga argues that ordinary objects such as persons cannot be constituents of propositions because the propositions can exist without the individual's existing. There are different replies to Plantinga's argument one can make depending on the metaphysical position one takes with respect to modality. If one is a possibilist then one makes a distinction between something's being actual and something's existing (or subsisting or having being of some sort). So Socrates can be a constituent of a proposition even in circumstances where Socrates is not an actual object. On the other hand, if one is an actualist (and accepts singular propositions) then one must deny Plantinga's claim that (6) can exist without Socrates's existing. Here one must argue that (6)'s being possibly true does not imply that (6) can be true without Socrates's existing. As an analogy consider John's assertion "It is possible I do not exist." John can describe or represent a circumstance or world where John does not exist. So, too, (6) can represent a circumstance or world where (6) does not exist. For (6) to be possibly true is for (6) to represent a circumstance or world that could obtain. It is not required that (6) be a part of the world or circumstance that (6) represents any more than it is required that John be a part of the world that he describes with his assertions.

4. Temporal Problems for Singular Propositions

Another objection that one can raise with respect to singular propositions concerns a fundamental problem of combining so-called abstract objects (such as propositions) with ordinary individuals. Ordinary individuals change over time including coming into and going out of existence. Propositions, on the other hand, are usually taken to be eternal objects--things that do not change over time. Consider then the following proposition:
(7) Socrates exists.
Does (7) exist? Socrates is long gone; he no longer exists. But if (7) does not exist how can it be false? Moreover, if (7) does exist then exactly what age is the constituent of (7)? 21? 37? It seems a bit absurd to say that the age of a constituent of a proposition is thus and so, yet if Socrates himself is a constituent of (7), then he must be a certain age. No human person exists without being a certain age.

Again the reply that one makes to the temporal modal objection is like the reply that one makes to the alethic modal objection in that it depends on one's metaphysical views concerning time and individuals. If, for example, one accepts the 4D view of objects then as far as age (and other issues involving change of existing objects) goes there is no problem. The object that is a constituent of a proposition is a complete object in that all the temporal stages or parts of the object in question are involved. So part of Socrates is 21 and part is 37.

On the other hand, if one holds to a 3D view where the object is wholly present at each time that it exists, then matters become a bit more complex. There are different ways to go. For example, one could hold that at each time, t, at which Socrates existed there is a singular proposition involving Socrates and t (and perhaps the property of existence if it is a property). On one such view there is no such proposition as (7). So the question of the age (and other features of changing existing objects) will depend on the time involved in the proposition under consideration. On another view (7) expresses the conjunction of all such propositions, hence the question of age does not arise.

When we ask (on either view) how can an object that no longer exists be a constituent of a proposition, we need to consider the various metaphysical views concerning ordinary individuals. If we can think of (or refer to) Socrates even though Socrates does not exist, then Socrates can be a constituent of a proposition though Socrates does not exist. What then shall we say of the proposition that Socrates exists? Does it exist or not? If it does not exist, then that does not prevent us from thinking of it (as with Socrates). On the other hand if we are prevented from thinking of Socrates because he no longer exists, then there are no singular propositions about Socrates. But that does not prevent there from being singular propositions about currently existing objects. One must simply give up the view that propositions are eternal.

The question of whether there are singular propositions, like the general question of whether there are propositions at all, has not been settled. Different philosophers take different positions on this issue. However, there remains a major advantage for accepting some form of singular propositions, namely, on such a view is clear how propositions represent or describe the world.


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Related Entries

actualism | atomism: logical | existence | facts | Frege, Gottlob | indexicals | logic: classical | names | propositions: structured | reference | Russell, Bertrand | semantics | sense/reference distinction | time

Copyright © 2002
Greg Fitch
Arizona State University

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