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Plural Quantification

Ordinary English contains two sorts of object quantifiers. In addition to the usual singular quantifiers, as in
(1)There is an apple on the table
there are plural quantifiers, as in
(2) There are some apples on the table.
Ever since Frege, formal logic has favored the two singular quantifiers ∀x and ∃x over their plural counterparts ∀xx and ∃xx (to be read as for any things xx and there are some things xx). But in recent decades it has been argued that we have good reason to admit among our primitive logical notions also the plural quantifiers ∀xx and ∃xx (Boolos 1984 and 1985a).

More controversially, it has been argued that the resulting formal system with plural as well as singular quantification qualifies as ‘pure logic’ in particular, that it is universally applicable, ontologically innocent, and perfectly well understood. In addition to being interesting in its own right, this thesis will, if correct, make plural quantification available as an innocent but extremely powerful tool in metaphysics and philosophical logic. For instance, George Boolos has used plural quantification to interpret monadic second-order logic[1] and has argued on this basis that monadic second-order logic qualifies as “pure logic.” Plural quantification has also been used in attempts to defend logicist ideas, to account for set theory, and to eliminate ontological commitments to mathematical objects and complex objects.

1. The Languages and Theories of Plural Quantification

The logical formalisms that have dominated in the analytic tradition ever since Frege have no separate devices for plural quantification. In introductory logic courses students are therefore typically taught to paraphrase away plural locutions. For instance, they are taught to render ‘Alice and Bob are hungry’ as ‘Alice is hungry & Bob is hungry’, and ‘There are some apples on the table’, as ‘∃xy (x is an apple on the table & y is an apple on the table & xy)’. However, not only are such paraphrases often unnatural, but they may not even be available. One of the most interesting examples of plural locutions which resist singular paraphrase is the so-called Geach-Kaplan sentence:

(3) Some critics admire only one another

This sentence provably has no singular first-order paraphrase using only the predicates occurring in the sentence itself.[2]

How are we to formalize such sentences? The traditional view, defended for instance by Quine, is that all paraphrases must be given in classical first-order logic, if necessary supplemented with a theory of sets. In particular, Quine suggests that (3) should be formalized as

(3′) ∃S(∃u.uS & ∀uv[(uS & AuvvS & uv)])

where the quantifier ∃S ranges over sets and where for simplicity the domain of discourse is taken to consist only of critics (1973, p. 111 and 1982, p. 293).

In two important articles from the 1980s George Boolos challenges this traditional view (Boolos 1984 and 1985a). He argues that it is simply a prejudice to insist that plural locutions in natural language be paraphrased away. Instead he suggests that, just as the singular quantifiers ∀x and ∃x get their legitimacy from the fact that they represent certain quantificational devices in natural language, so do their plural counterparts ∀xx and ∃xx. For there can be no doubt that in natural language we use and understand the expressions ‘for any things’ and ‘there are some things’.[3] Since these quantifiers bind variables that take name (rather than predicate) position, they are first-order quantifiers, albeit plural ones.

1.1 Regimenting plural quantification

We will now describe a simple formal language which can be used to regiment plural quantification as it occurs in English and other natural languages.

The formal language LPFO. Let the formal language LPFO (for Plural First-Order) be as follows.

  1. LPFO has the following terms (where i is any natural number):
    • singular variables xi
    • plural variables xxi
    • singular constants ai
    • plural constants aai
  2. LPFO has the following predicates:
    • two dyadic logical predicates = and strict-preceq; (to be thought of as identity and the relation is one of)
    • non-logical predicates Rni (for every adicity n and every natural number i)
  3. LPFO has the following formulas:
    • Rni(t1, …, tn) is a formula when Rni is an n-adic predicate and tj are singular terms
    • t strict-preceq T is a formula when t is a singular term and T a plural term
    • ¬φ and φ&ψ are formulas when φ and ψ are formulas
    • v.φ and ∃vv.φ are formulas when φ is a formula and v is a singular variable and vv a plural one
    • the other connectives are regarded as abbreviations in the usual way.

In LPFO we can formalize a number of English claims involving plurals. For instance, (2) can be formalized as

(2′) ∃xxu (ustrict-preceqxxAu & Tu)
And the Geach-Kaplan sentence (3) can be formalized as
(3′′) ∃xxuv [(ustrict-preceqxxCu) & (Auvvstrict-preceqxx & uv)].

However, the language LPFO has one severe limitation. We see this by distinguishing between two kinds of plural predication. A predicate P taking plural arguments is said to be distributive just in case it is analytic that: P holds of some things xx if and only if P holds of each u such that ustrict-preceq xx.[4] For instance, the predicate ‘is on the table’ is distributive, since it is analytic that some things xx are on the table just in case each of xx is on the table. A predicate P that isn't distributive is said to be non-distributive.[5] For instance, the predicate ‘form a circle’ is non-distributive, since it is not analytic that whenever some things xx form a circle, each of xx forms a circle. Another example of non-distributive plural predication is the second argument-place of the logical predicate strict-preceq: for it is not true (let alone analytic) that whenever u is one of xx, u is one of each of xx. It is therefore both natural and useful to define a slightly richer language:

The formal language LPFO+. The language LPFO+ allows non-distributive plural predicates other than strict-preceq. We do this by modifying the definition of LPFO so as to allow predicates Rni that take plural arguments.[6]

Should we also allow predicates with argument places that take both singular and plural arguments? Lots of English predicates seem to work this way, for instance ‘ … is/are on the table’. So if our primary interest was to analyze natural language, we would probably have to allow such predicates. However, for present purposes it is simpler not to allow such predicates. We will anyway soon allow pluralities that consist of just one thing.

For now, the formal languages LPFO and LPFO+ will be interpreted only by means of a translation of them into ordinary English, augmented by indices to facilitate cross-reference (Boolos 1984, pp. 443-5 (1998a, pp. 67-9); Rayo 2002, pp. 458-9). (More serious semantic issues will be addressed in Section 4, where our main question will be whether our theories of plural quantification are ontologically committed to any sort of “set-like” entities.) The two clauses of this translation which are immediately concerned with plural terms are

(4) Tr(xi strict-preceq xxj) = iti is one of themj
(5) Tr(∃xxj.φ) = there are some thingsj such that Tr(φ)

The other clauses are obvious, for instance: Tr(φ & ψ) = (Tr(φ) and Tr(ψ)). By induction on the complexity of formulas one easily proves that this translation allows us to interpret all sentences of LPFO and LPFO+, relying on our intuitive understanding of English.

1.2 The Theories PFO and PFO+

We will now describe a theory PFO of plural first-order quantification based on the language LPFO. Let's begin with an axiomatization of ordinary first-order logic with identity. For our current purposes, it is convenient to axiomatize this logic as a natural deduction system, taking all tautologies as axioms and the familiar natural deduction rules governing the singular quantifiers and the identity sign as rules of inference. We then extend in the obvious way the natural deduction rules for the singular quantifiers to the plural ones. Next, we need some axioms which for suitable formulas φ(x) allow us to talk about the φs. In ordinary English, it seems that we are entitled to use an expression of the form ‘the φs’ just in case there are at least two objects satisfying φ(x). But given our present concerns, it is convenient to relax this requirement slightly and demand only that there be at least one object satisfying φ(x). (Most people who write on the subject make this concession.) This gives rise to the plural comprehension axioms, which are the instances of the schema

(Comp) ∃u φ(u) → ∃xxu (ustrict-preceqxx ↔ φ(u))
where φ is a formula in LPFO that contains ‘u’ and possibly other variables free but contains no occurrence of ‘xx’. Since this assures that all pluralities are non-empty, we may also adopt the axiom
(6) ∀xxu (u strict-preceq xx).
Let PFO+ be the theory based on the language LPFO+ which arises in an analogous way, but which in addition has the following axiom schema of extensionality:
(7) ∀xxyy [∀u(u strict-preceq xxu strict-preceq yy) → (φ(xx) ↔ φ(yy))]

This axiom schema ensures that all coextensive pluralities are indiscernible.

Note on terminology. For ease of communication we will use the word ‘plurality’ without taking a stand on whether there really exist such entities as pluralities. Statements involving the word ‘plurality’ can always be rewritten more longwindedly without use of that word. For instance, the above claim that “all pluralities are non-empty” can be rewritten as “whenever there are some things xx, there is something u which is one of the things xx.” Where an ontological claim is made, this will be signalled by instead using the locution ‘plural entity’.

1.3 The proof-theoretic strength of the theories PFO and PFO+

(Readers less interested in technical issues may want to skim this part.) PFO and PFO+ are very strong theories. As Boolos observed, PFO is strong enough to interpret monadic second-order logic.[7] Let MSO be some standard axiomatization of (full impredicative) monadic second-order logic in some suitable language LMSO (Shapiro 1991, ch. 3; Boolos et al. 2002, ch. 22). Boolos first defines a translation Tr′ that maps any formula of LMSO to some formula of LPFO. This definition, which is by induction on the complexity of the formulas of LMSO, has as its only non-trivial clauses the following two, which are concerned with the second-order variables:

(8) Tr′(Xjxi) = xi strict-preceq xxj

(9) Tr′(∃Xj.φ) = ∃xxj.Tr′(φ) v Tr′(φ*)

where φ* is the result of substituting xixi everywhere for Xixi. The idea behind these two clauses is to replace talk about properties (or whatever entities one takes the monadic second-order variables to range over) with talk about the objects having these properties. Thus, instead of saying that xi has the property Xj, we say that xi is one of xxj. The only difficulty is that some properties have no instances, whereas all pluralities must encompass at least one thing. But the possibility that a property be uninstantiated is accommodated by the second disjunct on the right-hand side of (9).

By induction on derivations in MSO one easily proves that each theorem of MSO is mapped to some theorem of PFO. Moreover, it is easy to define a “reverse” translation that maps formulas of LPFO to formulas of LMSO and to prove that this translation maps theorems of the former to theorems of the latter. This shows that PFO and MSO are equi-interpretable. A similar result can be proved about PFO+ and an extension MSO+ of MSO which allows predicates of (first-order) properties, provided MSO+ contains an axiom schema to the effect that coextensive properties are indiscernible.

1.4 Relations

Although plural quantification provides a fairly natural interpretation of quantification over (monadic) properties, it provides no natural interpretation of quantification over (polyadic) relations.

This limitation can be overcome if there is a pairing function on the relevant domain, that is, if there is a function π such that π(u, v) = π(u′, v′) just in case u = u′ and v = v′. For then quantification over dyadic relations can be represented by plural quantification over ordered pairs. Moreover, by iterated applications of the ordered pair function we can represent n-tuples and thus also quantification over n-adic relations. The question is how this pairing function is to be understood. One option is to proceed as in mathematics and simply postulate the existence of a pairing function as an abstract mathematical object. But this option has the obvious disadvantage of stepping outside of what most people are willing to call “pure logic.” A cleverer option, explored in the Appendix to Lewis 1991 and in Hazen 1997 and 2000, is to simulate talk about ordered pairs using only resources that arguably are purely logical. It turns out that talk about ordered pairs can be simulated in monadic third-order logic, given some plausible extra assumptions. Monadic third-order logic can in turn be interpreted either in a theory which combines plural quantification with mereology (Lewis 1991, Ch. 3; Burgess and Rosen 1997, II.C.1) or in terms of the higher-level plural quantification to be discussed in Section 5.

2. The Logicality Thesis

It is often claimed that the theories PFO and PFO+ qualify as “pure logic.” We will refer to this (admittedly vague) claim as the Logicality Thesis. Since the corresponding languages are interpreted by the translation Tr into ordinary English, this is a claim about the logicality of certain axioms and inferences rules of ordinary English.

Even before the Logicality Thesis is made more precise, it is possible to assess its plausibility for at least some of the axioms and inference rules of PFO and PFO+. First there are the tautologies and the inference rules governing identity and the singular quantifiers. There is broad consensus that these qualify as logical. Next there are the inference rules governing the plural quantifiers. Since these rules are completely analogous to the rules governing the singular quantifiers, it would be hard to deny that they too qualify as logical. Then there are the extensionality axioms and the axiom that all pluralities are non-empty. These axioms are unproblematic because they can plausibly be taken to be analytic. What remains are the plural comprehension axioms, where things are much less clear. For these axioms have no obvious singular counterparts, and their syntactical form indicates that they make existential claims. So it is not obvious that these axioms can be taken to be purely logical.

This is not to say that it has not struck people as obvious that the plural comprehension axioms are purely logical. For instance, Boolos asserts without argument that the translation of each plural comprehension axiom into English “expresses a logical truth if any sentence of English does” (Boolos 1985b, p. 342 (1998a, p. 167); his emphasis). And Keith Hossack first argues that the plural comprehension axioms are ontologically innocent, whence he concludes — with no further argument or explanation — that “the axioms of plural logic are genuine logical truths” (Hossack 2000, p. 422).

In order to assess the Logicality Thesis in a more principled way, more will have to be said about what it might mean for a theory to be “purely logical.” So we will now survey some of the features commonly thought to play a role in such a definition. Although people are free to use the word ‘logic’ as they please, it is important to get clear on what different usages entail; in particular, theories that qualify as purely logical are often assumed to enjoy a variety of desirable philosophical properties such as epistemic and ontological innocence. In the next section, where various applications of plural quantification will be discussed, we will carefully note which strains of the notion of logicality our theories PFO and PFO+ must possess for the various applications of them to succeed.

Perhaps the least controversial candidate for a defining feature of logic is its absolute generality. A logical principle is valid in any kind of discourse, no matter what kind of objects this discourse is concerned with. For instance, modus ponens is valid not only in physics and mathematics but in religion and in the analysis of works of fiction. Frege captures the idea nicely when he says that a logical principle is valid in “the widest domain of all; […] not only the actual, not only the intuitable, but everything thinkable” (Frege 1884, p. 21). Thus, whereas the principles of physics are valid only in the actual world and in worlds that are nomologically similar to it, the principles of logic govern everything thinkable. If one of these principles is denied, “complete confusion ensues” (ibid.).

Another feature widely believed to be defining of logic is its formality: the truth of a principle of logic is guaranteed by the form of thought and/or language and does not in any way depend upon its matter. What this feature amounts to will obviously depend on how the distinction between form and matter is understood. The most popular explication of the distinction between form and matter derives from the widely shared view that no objects exist by conceptual necessity (Field 1993; Yablo 2000). On this view it is natural to regard anything having to do with the existence of objects and with their particular characteristics as belonging to the matter of thought rather than to its form. This gives rise to two features that are often regarded as defining of logic. Firstly, logic has to be ontologically innocent; that is, a principle of logic cannot introduce any new ontological commitments (Boolos 1997; Field 1984). Secondly, the basic notions of logic must not discriminate between different objects but must treat them all alike. This latter idea is often spelled out as the requirement that logical notions must be invariant under permutations of the domain of objects (Tarski 1986).

A third feature which is often regarded as defining of logic is its (alleged) cognitive primacy. Primitive logical notions must be completely understood, and our understanding of them must be direct in the sense that it doesn't depend on or involve an understanding of notions that must be classified as extra-logical. Assume, for instance, that certain set theoretic principles must be regarded as extra-logical. Then our understanding of the primitive logical notions cannot depend on or involve any of these principles.

3. Applications of Plural Quantification

We will now outline some applications of the theories PFO and PFO+. In the previous section three strains of the notion of logicality were disentangled. Special attention will be paid to the question which of these three strains PFO and PFO+ must possess for the applications to succeed. (The reader may want to skip the discussion of applications in which he or she isn't interested.)

3.1. Establishing the Logicality of Monadic Second-Order Logic

Boolos defined an interpretation of the theory MSO of monadic second-order logic in the theory PFO of plural quantification (Section 1). He sought to use this to establish the logicality of MSO. Doing so will require two steps. The first step is to argue that PFO is pure logic, that is, to establish the full Logicality Thesis (however that is interpreted). The second step is to argue that the interpretation of MSO in PFO preserves logicality.

Some of the intricacies of the first step will be examined in Section 4. But the second step too should not be underestimated. Perhaps the greatest worry here is that Boolos's translation renders expressions from one syntactic category (that of monadic predicates) in terms of expressions from another category (that of plural referring expressions). For instance, ‘… is an apple’ is rendered as ‘the apples’. But these categories are very different; for instance, the former consists of expressions that are unsaturated (in Frege's sense) — that is, that contain gaps or argument places — whereas the latter consists of expressions that are saturated (Higginbotham 1998, Section 7; Oliver and Smiley 2001; Rayo and Yablo 2001, Section X; Yi forthcoming).

However, since the thesis that MSO is pure logic is very abstract, most of its cash value will presumably lie in its applications. And given the equi-interpretability of MSO and PFO (Section 1), it is likely that most applications of the logicality of the former can equally well be served by the logicality of the latter. This reduces the importance of carrying out the second step.

3.2. Logicism

Both Fregean and post-Fregean logicism make essential use of second-order quantification. Frege defined the various objects of pure mathematics as extensions of concepts, and his famous Basic Law V stated that two concepts F and G have the same extension just in case they are co-extensive:

(V) û.Fu = û.Gu ↔ ∀u(FuGu)

But as is well known, Russell's paradox shows that the second-order theory with (V) as an axiom is inconsistent.

Philosophers have attempted to rescue some ideas of Fregean logicism by using axioms weaker than (V). One of the most important such attempts is Bob Hale and Crispin Wright's neo-logicism, which gives up Frege's theory of extensions but holds on to the central idea of his definition of cardinal numbers, namely that the number of Fs is identical to the number of Gs just in case the Fs and the Gs can be one-to-one correlated. This has become known as Hume's Principle, and can be formalized as

(HP) Nu.Fu = Nu.GuFG

where FG says there is a relation that one-to-one correlates the Fs and the Gs. The second-order theory with (HP) as an axiom is consistent and allows us to derive all of ordinary (second-order Peano-Dedekind) arithmetic, using some very natural definitions (see the entry on Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic).

Even more modest is Boolos's sub-logicism, which rejects the idea (endorsed by both logicists and neo-logicists) that there are logical objects, but insists that Frege's definition of the ancestral of a relation can be used to show, as against Kant, that at least some non-trivial mathematics is analytic (Boolos 1985b). Recall that a relation R stands to its ancestral R* as the relation is a parent of stands to is an ancestor of. (More precisely, R* holds between two objects x and y just in case x and y are connected through a finite sequence of objects each of which bears R to its successor.) Frege gives a second-order definition of the ancestral relation R* by laying down that x and y are related by R* just in case y has every property that is had by x's R-successors and inherited under the R-relation:

(Def R*) xR*y ↔ ∀F[∀u(xRuFu) & ∀u(Fu & uRvFv) → Fy]

Using this definition, Frege 1879 proves some non-trivial mathematical truths, such as that the ancestral R* is transitive and that, for any functional relation R, the R-ancestors of any object are R*-comparable (that is, he proved: Functional(R) & xR*y & xR*zyR*z v zR*y).

It has been suggested that PFO be used to accommodate the post-Fregean logicists' need for second-order quantification. Since the ancestral of a dyadic predicate can be defined using only monadic second-order quantification, PFO does indeed serve the logical needs of Boolos's sub-logicism.[8] But since the neo-logicist definition of FG uses dyadic second-order logic, PFO alone does not have sufficient expressive power to accommodate the needs of neo-logicism. The neo-logicist may attempt to solve this problem by regarding equinumerosity as a primitive logical quantifier or by simulating dyadic second-order quantification in some suitable extension of PFO, as discussed in Section 1.4.

Which strains of the Logicality Thesis are needed for these applications to succeed? Since these logicists attempt to show that parts of mathematics are analytic (or at least knowable a priori), this would require that PFO be analytic (or at least knowable a priori), which in turn is likely to require that PFO enjoy some form of cognitive primacy. Moreover, PFO would have to be either ontologically innocent or committed only to entities whose existence is conceptually necessary (or at least establishable a priori).

3.3. Set Theory

Another application of the Logicality Thesis is concerned with set theory. One may for a variety of reasons want to talk about and quantify over collections of sets (Linnebo 2003, pp. 80-81). For instance, one may want to assert

(10) There are some sets which are all and only the non-self-membered sets.

If we formalize this as

(10′) ∃Rx (Rxxnot-inx),

how is the quantifier ∃R to be understood? It clearly cannot be taken to range over all sets, since this would lead straight to Russell's paradox: (10′) would then assert the existence of the Russell-set. Three other responses are prominent in the literature.

The first response is that ∃R ranges over classes but that some classes are too large (or otherwise unsuited) to be sets. In particular, (10) asserts the existence of the Russell-class, which isn't a set. This response has been found problematic because it postulates the existence of different kinds of “set-like” entities (Boolos 1984, p. 442 (1998a, p. 66) and 1998b, p. 35). It has also been objected that this response only postpones the problem posed by (10). For it would also be true that

(11) There are some classes which are all and only the non-self-membered classes.

What kind of entity would this collection of classes be? A super-class? If so, we will be forced to postulate higher and higher levels of classes. Lewis (1991, p. 68) argues that Russell's paradox is still inescapable because, when we consider all set-like entities, we realize that the following is true:

(12) There are some set-like things which are all and only the non-self-membered set-like things.

However, Hazen (1993, pp. 141-2) has forcefully responded to Lewis's objection that its attempt to talk about all set-like entities in one fell swoop violates essential type-restrictions: although we can quantify over each level of classes, we can never quantify over all levels simultaneously.

The second response is that (10) asserts the existence of a set R, but that R isn't in the range of the quantifier ∀x. This prevents us from instantiating the quantifier ∀x with respect to R, which means that we cannot draw the fatal conclusion that R is a member of itself just in case it isn't. However, this response entails that the quantifier ∀x cannot be chosen to range over absolutely all sets; for if it could be so chosen, we would not be able say that R isn't in this range of quantification. This means that the universe of sets has a certain inexhaustibility: whenever we have formed a conception of quantification over some range of sets, we can define a set which isn't in this range (Dummett 1981, ch. 15 and 1991, ch. 24; Glanzberg forthcoming; Parsons 1977). However, this response has been criticized for being, at best hard to state, and at worst self-refuting (Boolos 1998b, p. 30; Lewis 1991, p. 68; Williamson 2003, Section V).

Because of the difficulties involved in the first two responses, a third response has become popular in recent years (Boolos 1984 and 1985a; Burgess forthcoming; Cartwright 2001; Rayo and Uzquiano 1999; Uzquiano 2003). This is that the quantifier ∃R is a plural quantifier (and would thus be better written as ∃rr) and that plural quantification is ontologically innocent. (10) does therefore not assert the existence of any “set-like” entity over and above the sets in the range of the quantifier ∀x. But as we will see in Section 4, the claim about ontological innocence is controversial.

3.4. Mathematical Nominalism

Some of the most popular applications of the plural quantification are concerned with ontological economy. The idea is to pay the ontological price of a mere first-order theory and then use plural quantification to get for free (a theory with the force of) the corresponding monadic second-order theory. That would obviously be an ontological bargain. Applications of this sort fall into two main classes, which will be discussed in this sub-section and the next.

One class of applications of plural quantification aim to make ontological bargains in the philosophy of mathematics. In particular, a number of philosophers have attempted to use plural quantification as an ingredient of nominalistic interpretations of mathematics. A nice example is Geoffrey Hellman's modal nominalism, according to which mathematical statements committed to the existence of abstract objects are to be eliminated in favor of statements about the possible existence of concrete objects. For instance, instead of claiming, as the platonist does, that there exists an infinite collection of abstract objects satisfying the axioms of Peano arithmetic (namely the natural numbers), Hellman claims that there could exist an infinite collection of concrete objects related so as to satisfy these axioms (Hellman 1989 and 1996). However, even this modal claim appears to talk about collections of concrete objects and relations on these objects. To forestall the objection that this smuggles in through the back door abstract objects such as sets, Hellman needs some alternative, nominalistically acceptable interpretation of this talk about collections and relations. Plural quantification may offer such an interpretation.

For this application of plural quantification to work, PFO must be applicable to all kinds of concrete objects, and it must be ontologically innocent, or at least not committed to any entities that share those features of abstract objects that are found to be nominalistically objectionable. Moreover, in order to simulate quantification over relations, we will need not just PFO but a theory more like monadic third-order logic (Section 1.4).

3.5. Eliminating Complex Objects

Another class of applications attempt to eliminate the commitments of science and common sense to (some or all) complex objects. For instance, instead of employing usual singular quantification over tables and chairs, it is proposed that we use plural quantification over atoms (or whatever simple objects of which tables and chairs are composed) arranged tablewise or chairwise (Dorr and Rosen 2002; Hossack 2000; van Inwagen 1990). For instance, instead of saying that there is a chair in one's office, one should say that there are some atoms in one's office arranged chairwise. In this way one appears to avoid committing oneself to the existence of a chair. Note that such analyses require PFO+, not just PFO, since the new predicates ‘are arranged F-wise’ are non-distributive.

Let's set aside purely metaphysical worries about such analyses as irrelevant to our present concern. What we would like to know is what demands these analyses put on the theory PFO+, in particular, which strains of the Logicality Thesis are needed. The most obvious demands are that PFO+ be applicable to all kinds of simple objects and that it be ontologically innocent, or at least not committed to complex objects of the sort to be eliminated.

A less obvious demand has to do with the need to analyze ordinary plural quantification over complex objects, for instance

(13) There are some chairs arranged in a circle.

We have already “used up” ordinary plural quantification and predication to eliminate apparent commitment to individual chairs (Uzquiano 2004). In order to analyze (13), we will therefore need something like “super-plural” quantification — quantification that stands to ordinary plural quantification as ordinary plural quantification stands to singular — and corresponding non-distributive predication. The legitimacy of such linguistic resources will be discussed in Section 5.

4. Ontological Innocence?

The traditional view in analytic philosophy has been that all plural locutions should be paraphrased away, if need be, by quantifying over sets (Section 1). But George Boolos and others have objected that it is both unnatural and unnecessary to eliminate plural locutions: since such locutions are found in natural languages, they are unproblematic and perfectly well understood, and we should therefore extend our logical formalisms so as to accommodate these locutions. This led to the theories PFO and PFO+. Proponents of plural quantification claim that these theories allow plural locutions to be formalized in a way that is fundamentally different from the old set-theoretic paraphrases. In particular, they claim that these theories are ontologically innocent in the sense that they introduce no new ontological commitments to sets or any other kind of “set-like” entities over and above the individual objects that compose the pluralities in question. Let's call this latter claim Ontological Innocence.

Other philosophers question Ontological Innocence. For instance, Michael Resnik expresses misgivings about the alleged ontological innocence of the plural rendering (3′′) of the Geach-Kaplan sentence (3). For when (3′′) is translated into English as instructed, it reads:

(3′′′) There are some critics such that any one of them admires another critic only if the latter is one of them distinct from the former.

But (3′′′), Resnik says, “seems to me to refer to collections quite explicitly. How else are we to understand the phrase ‘one of them’ other than as referring to some collection and as saying that the referent of ‘one’ belongs to it?” (Resnik 1988, p. 77). Related worries have been expressed in Hazen 1993, Linnebo 2003, Parsons 1990, and Rouilhan 2002; see also Shapiro 1993.

4.1. Some Arguments in Favor of Ontological Innocence

We begin by observing that what is sometimes thought to be a knock-down argument in favor of Ontological Innocence is less conclusive than it appears. The argument begins by asking us to consider

(10) There are some sets which are all and only the non-self-membered sets.

and admit that it is true. It continues by arguing that, if plural expressions were committed to collections or any other “set-like” objects, then the truth of (10) would lead straight to Russell's paradox. However, as we saw in Section 3.3, Russell's paradox will follow only if two alternative views are ruled out. Since these views cannot be dismissed out of hand, a lot of work will remain before this argument can be said to be conclusive.

Let's therefore turn to what is probably the most popular argument for Ontological Innocence. Since this argument is based on our intuitions about ontological commitments, we will refer to it as the Argument from Intuitions. Consider for instance

(14) George Boolos ate some Cheerios for breakfast on January 1, 1985.

When you assert (14), you don't have the feeling that you are committing yourself ontologically to a collection or to any other kind of “set-like” object, or so the argument goes. Nor do you have any such feeling when you assert the Geach-Kaplan sentence or any other translation of a sentence of PFO or PFO+ into English.

However, in its current form the Argument from Intuitions is vulnerable to the objection that people's intuitions provide a poor ground for settling theoretical disputes about ontological commitments. We have seen that there are competent speakers of English, such as Michael Resnik, who don't share these intuitions. Moreover, as Davidson's popular analysis of action sentences in terms of events makes clear, ordinary people's intuitions about ontological commitments cannot always be trusted (Davidson 1967). For instance, someone may sincerely assert that Tom walked slowly, without being aware that he has committed himself to the existence of an event (namely a walking which is by Tom and which is slow). A better approach to questions about ontolological commitment would use our best linguistics and philosophy of language in an attempt to determine the real logical-semantic structure of the sentence in question (Section 4.2).

Although this objection has force, we will now consider two ways in which the Argument from Intuitions can be sharpened. The first way asks what forms of existential generalization are warranted on a sentence containing plurals (Boolos 1984, p. 447 (1998a, p. 70); McKay forthcoming, Chapter 2; Yi 2002, pp. 7-15). For instance, we may ask whether the following can be inferred from (14).

(15) There is an object such that Boolos ate all of its elements (or constituents) for breakfast on January 1, 1985.

This inference is, at the very least, very peculiar. So this provides evidence that (14) isn't committed to any kind of “set-like” entity that can be the value of a singular first-order variable.

A second sharpening of the Argument from Intuitions is suggested by Boolos's remark that “It is haywire to think that when you have some Cheerios, you are eating a set” (1984, pp. 448-9 (1998a, p. 72)). What Boolos is suggesting is that analyses that deny Ontological Innocence are likely to get the subject of plural predications wrong. To this it may perhaps be responded that the predicate has to be changed accordingly; for instance, instead of the ordinary relation x eats y, plural contexts such as (14) involve the related but different relation x eats-the-elements-of y. The problem with this response, however, is that natural language provides no evidence that the word ‘eat’ is ambiguous in this way. On the contrary, any such ambiguity seems unlikely given the possibility of ellipsis as in

(16) Boolos ate some Cheerios, but his guest, only a candy bar.

For if ‘eat’ were used ambiguously, this ellipsis would be disallowed. For instance, it is because ‘make’ is used ambiguously in ‘make breakfast’ and ‘make up one's mind’ that the following ellipsis is disallowed

(*17) Boolos made breakfast, but his guest, only up his mind.

So this second sharpening of the Argument from Intuitions has force as well: it shows that it would be highly artificial to take plural terms to denote any kind of “set-like” entities that can be values of singular first-order variables.

The upshot is that the two sharpened versions of the Argument from Intuitions succeed in placing strict constraints on the kinds of ontological commitment that plural locutions can have. If plural locutions incur ontological commitments (over and above the uncontroversial commitment to the individual objects which compose the plurality in question), these ontological commitments cannot be the kind of commitments that are incurred by singular first-order quantifiers. For instance, if (14) is ontologically committed to anything over and above individual Cheerios, this commitment cannot be of a sort that would allow us to make an inference from (14) to (15). More generally it follows that, if the only kind of ontological commitment there is is the kind incurred by singular first-order quantifiers, then Ontological Innocence will be true.

However, there is an influential philosophical tradition which holds that quantifiers of all syntactic categories incur ontological commitments, not just singular first-order quantifiers.[9] The most famous exponent of this tradition is Frege, who held that second-order quantifiers are committed to concepts, just as singular first-order quantifiers are committed to objects. In order to explain this tradition and assess its bearing on the issue of Ontological Innocence, we cannot rely on our intuitive understanding of English and other natural languages but need to consider the relevant semantic theories.

4.2. Semantic Values and Ontological Commitments

Semantic theories of the form with which we will be concerned are based on two core Fregean assumptions. First it is assumed that the significance of a sentence consists in its being true or false. Then it is assumed that each simple component of a sentence makes some definite contribution to the truth or falsity of the sentence; in particular, that the truth-value of the sentence is determined as a function of the semantic contributions of its various simple components. (This second assumption is known as compositionality.)

The semantic contribution made by an expression E is known as its semantic value and is symbolized as [E]. The semantic value of a sentence is normally taken to be its truth-value. As Frege observed, it will then be very natural to take the semantic value of a proper name to be its referent (that is, the object to which it refers); for the truth-value of a sentence S remains unchanged whenever a proper name occurring extensionally in S is replaced with some co-referring proper name. Once we have fixed the kinds of semantic values assigned to sentences and proper names, it is easy to determine what kinds of semantic values to assign to expressions of other syntactic categories. For instance, the semantic value of a monadic predicate will have to be a function from objects to truth-values. (Frege calls such functions concepts.)

As an example, let's consider the simple subject-predicate sentence

(18) Socrates is mortal.

The logical form of (18) is M(s), where M is the predicate ‘is mortal’ and s is the singular term ‘Socrates’. In accordance with the previous paragraph, the semantic values are as follows:

(19) [s] = Socrates
(20) [M] = the function f from objects to truth-values such that f(x) is the true if x is mortal and f(x) is the false otherwise

The truth-value of (18) is thus determined as

(21) [(18)] = [M(s)] = [M] ([s]) = f(Socrates) = the true if Socrates is mortal and the false otherwise.

Frege took the connection between semantic values and ontological commitments to be a very close one. For on the above analysis, (18) supports two kinds of existential generalizations: not just to ∃x.M(x) (which is true just in case there exists some object which is mortal) but also to ∃F.F(s) (which is true just in case there exists some concept under which Socrates falls). According to Frege, this shows that sentences such as (18) are ontologically committed not just to an object but also to a concept.

What matters for present purposes is not the truth or falsity of Frege's claim about concepts but whether a cogent argument of this sort can be developed for plural locutions. To investigate this, we need to understand the semantics of plural terms. Fortunately it suffices to consider a simple non-distributive plural predication such as

(22) These apples form a circle.

The logical form of (22) appears to be C(aa), where C is the predicate ‘form a circle’ and aa is the plural term ‘these apples’. (If you think complex plural demonstrative have internal semantic structure, use instead some plural name stipulated to refer directly to the apples in question.) The natural view will then be as follows.

(23) [aa] = a1 and … and an (where the ai are all and only the apples demonstrated)
(24) [C] = the function g from pluralities to truth-values such that g(xx) is the true if xx form a circle and g(xx) is the false otherwise

The truth-value of (22) will then be determined as

(25) [(22)] = [C(aa)] = [C] ([aa]) = g(a1 and … and an) = the true if a1 and … and an form a circle and false otherwise

which is what one would expect, given the syntactic similarity between (18) and (22).

Assume that this argument is sound and that each plural term thus has some objects as its semantic value(s), just as each singular term has one object as its semantic value. What will this mean for the issue of Ontological Innocence?

One answer is that it will mean that plural locutions are committed to plural entities and that Ontological Innocence thus is false. This answer is based on the following argument. A semantic theory assigns to each significant expression a unique semantic value which constitutes this expression's semantic contribution to the sentences in which it occurs. For instance, in (23) the plural term aa is assigned as its semantic value a certain plurality. The semantic theory regards this plurality as one entity: it is the contribution of one syntactic expression. Granted, this plural entity is not an object, if with Frege we mean by ‘object’ the referent of a singular first-order term. Nevertheless, this plural entity does represent an ontological commitment.

It may be objected that this argument is guilty of a “singularist prejudice” in the meta-language. For it is essential to this argument that it uses singular locutions in the meta-language to describe the semantic contribution of plural terms such as aa. It would be more neutral, the objection continues, to allow the meta-language to have the same expressive resources as the object language; in particular, the meta-language should be allowed to contain plural locutions. But once this is allowed, the semantic contribution of a plural term such as aa can be characterized by a relation of the form SemVal(aa, xx), where the first argument place is singular and the second is plural, and where the relation holds when xx collectively are the semantic value(s) of aa. A proponent of Ontological Innocence can then argue from the premise that plural quantification is innocent in the meta-language to the conclusion that it is innocent in the object language. This argument won't satisfy opponents of Ontological Innocence, who will reject its premise. But the argument does show that Ontological Innocence can be affirmed without semantic incoherence.

What have we achieved, then, by taking up the semantic perspective of this section? Have we just shifted the problem of Ontological Innocence from the object language to the meta-language? I will now suggest that our semantic perspective represents progress because it allows a more principled approach to the question of Ontological Innocence. In the meta-language we can specify, for each sentence of the object language, what is required of the world for this sentence to be true. Some of these requirements are expressed by means of quantifiers in the meta-language. Let's call such requirements commitments. If we allow the same expressive resources in the meta-language as in the object language, there will be as many forms of commitment as there are kinds of quantification in the object language: in addition to object commitments, recorded by first-order singular quantifiers in the meta-language, there may be concept commitments, recorded by monadic second-order quantifiers in the meta-language, and plurality commitments, recorded by plural first-order quantifiers in the meta-language. Once we realize that there are all these different but related forms of commitment, it becomes unclear why we should be more concerned with object commitments than with other kinds of commitment (Linnebo 2003; Parsons 1990; Shapiro 1993).

Unless a differential treatment of object commitments and other kinds of commitments can be justified, the most interesting notion of ontological commitment will be the umbrella notion that covers all the different forms of commitment. But on this understanding of ontological commitment, Ontological Innocence will be false, since plural quantifiers will then introduce ontological commitments over and above the commitments to the objects that compose the pluralities in question.

5. Beyond PFO+?

One way of going beyond PFO+ would be by allowing quantification into predicate positions, including those of predicates taking plural arguments. Doing so would result in an extension which stands to PFO+ as ordinary (singular) second-order logic stands to ordinary (singular) first-order logic. Such extensions will not be discussed here: for whether they are legitimate, and if so what axioms they may support, has less to do with plurals and plural quantification than it does with predication and quantification over the semantic values of predicates.[10]

What is relevant for present purposes is whether we can iterate the operation that takes us from a range of entities already accepted to plural quantification over this range. In other words, is there some form of “super-plural” quantification that stands to ordinary plural quantification as ordinary plural quantification stands to singular quantification? If so, let's call this second-level plural quantification. More generally, we may attempt to introduce plural quantification of any finite level. This would result in a theory just like a simple type theory (Hazen 1997, p. 247; Linnebo 2003, Section IV; Rayo forthcoming).

It is unproblematic to develop formal languages and theories of higher-level plural quantification. For instance, we can introduce variables of the form xxx to be thought of as ranging over second-level pluralities and the relation xx strict-preceq2 xxx to be understood in analogy with the relation x strict-preceq xx. But can these formal theories of higher-level plural quantification be justified by considerations similar to those that justify the theories PFO and PFO+?

Boolos and many other philosophers deny that higher-level plural quantification can be thus justified. Two kinds of arguments are given for this view. Firstly, it is argued that a plurality is always a plurality of things. But since plural quantification is ontologically innocent, there are no such things as pluralities. There is thus nothing that can be collected into a second-level plurality (McKay forthcoming, Ch. 2). Secondly, ordinary plural quantification is justified by the fact that it captures certain quantificational devices of English and other natural languages. But English and other natural languages contain no higher-level plural quantification (Lewis 1990, pp. 70-71; Uzquiano 2004).

Both arguments are controversial. Concerning the first, it is not clear why ontology should be relevant to the legitimacy of higher-level plurals quantification. It should be sufficient that the base-level objects can be organized in certain complex ways. For instance, the second-level plurality based on Cheerios organized as oo oo oo may be no more ontologically problematic than a first-level plurality based on the same objects organized as oooooo, although the former has an additional level of structure or articulation (Linnebo 2003, pp. 87-8).

The second of the above two arguments is also problematic. To begin with, the claim that there are no higher-level plural locutions in natural language appears to be false. In Icelandic, for instance, the number words have plural forms which count, not individual objects, but pluralities of objects that form natural groups. Here is an example:

einn skór means one shoe
einir skór means one pair of shoes
tvennir skór means two pairs of shoes

This allows us to talk about pairs of shoes as a second-level plurality rather than as a first-level plurality of objects such as pairs.

Moreover, the very idea that the legitimacy of higher-level plural quantification is decided by the existence or non-existence of higher-level plural locutions in English and other natural languages is problematic (Hazen 1993, p. 138 and 1997, p. 247; Linnebo 2003, p. 87). What really matters is presumably whether we can iterate the principles and considerations on which our understanding of ordinary first-level plural quantification is based: if we can, then higher-level plural quantification will be justified in much the same way as ordinary first-level plural quantification; and if not, not. Thus, even if there were no higher-level plural locutions in natural languages, this would at best provide some weak prima facie evidence that no such iteration is possible. And this prima facie evidence could be defeated by pointing to independent reasons why higher-level plural locutions are scarce in natural languages. One such independent reason may simply be that ordinary speakers aren't very concerned about their ontological commitments and thus find it more convenient to express facts involving second-level pluralities by positing objects to represent the first-level pluralities (for instance by talking about two pairs of shoes) rather than by keeping track of additional grammatical device for second-level plurals (as for instance in the above example from Icelandic).


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Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | generalized quantifiers | logic and ontology | mereology | neologicism | Russell's paradox | set theory


Thanks to Allen Hazen, Tom McKay, Frode Kjosavik, Agustín Rayo, and Gabriel Uzquiano for discussions and written comments on earlier drafts.

Copyright © 2004
Øystein Linnebo
Merton College/Oxford University

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