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Personal Autonomy

To be autonomous is to be a law to oneself; autonomous agents are self-governing agents. Most of us want to be autonomous because we want to be accountable for what we do, and because it seems that if we are not the ones calling the shots, then we cannot be accountable. More importantly, perhaps, the value of autonomy is tied to the value of self-integration. We don't want to be alien to, or at war with, ourselves; and it seems that when our intentions are not under our own control, we suffer from self-alienation. What conditions must be satisfied in order to ensure that we govern ourselves when we act? Philosophers have offered a wide range of competing answers to this question.

1. Introduction

When people living in some region of the world declare that their group has the right to live autonomously, they are saying that they ought to be allowed to govern themselves. In making this claim, they are, in essence, rejecting the political and legal authority of those not in their group. They are insisting that whatever power these outsiders may have over them, this power is illegitimate; they, and they alone, have the authority to determine and enforce the rules and policies that govern their lives.

When an individual makes a similar declaration about some sphere of her own life, she, too, is denying that anyone else has the authority to control her activity within this sphere; she is saying that any exercise of power over this activity is illegitimate unless she authorizes it herself. Most of the reasons that can be offered in support of this claim have correlates in the case of demands for group autonomy. But there is one very important exception: a reason that takes us beyond politics, to the metaphysics of agency.

An agent is one who acts. In order to act, one must initiate one's action. And one cannot initiate one's action without exercising one's power to do so. Since nothing and no one has the power to act except the agent herself, she alone is entitled to exercise this power, if she is entitled to act. This means that insofar as someone is an agent — i.e., insofar as she is one who acts — she is correct to regard her own commitments to acting, her own judgments and decisions about how she should act, as authoritative. Indeed, if she were to challenge the authority that is an essential feature of her judgments and decisions, then they would cease to be her own practical conclusions. Their power to move her would cease to be a manifestation of her power to move herself; it would not be the power of her own agency.

In short, every agent has an authority over herself that is grounded, not in her political or social role, nor in any law or custom, but in the simple fact that she alone can initiate her actions. To be sure, it might be unwise for someone to follow the commands she gives to herself when she “makes up her mind.” The point, however, is that she has no conceivable option. In order to form an intention to do one thing rather than another, an agent must regard her own judgment about how to act as authoritative — even if it is only the judgment that she should follow the command or advice of someone else. This tight connection between being an agent and having authority has no correlate in cases where the authority at issue is political. Anyone can coherently (and often plausibly) challenge the political authority of some individual or group. Even a political leader herself can with good reason believe that her political power is illegitimate, and that exercising this power is unjustified.

Despite the special inalienable nature of our authority over ourselves, it is possible for us to fail to govern ourselves, just as it is possible for a political leader to fail to govern those who fall within her domain. Indeed, precisely because our authority over our own actions is a formal feature of agency, our deference to this authority is but the form of self-government. It does not imply that whenever we act, the forces that move us are manifestations of our power as agents; the power of our motives is not necessarily an expression of the decision-making power that is constitutive of our agency, and the basis of our authority to decide how to act. Just as a political leader's official status is compatible with her having no real power to call the shots, so too, a person can have an authoritative status with respect to her motives without having any real power over what she does. Though it is an agent's job to determine how she will act, she can do this job without really being in control. Of course, no one can govern herself without being subject to influences whose power does not derive from her own authority: everything we do is a response to past and present circumstances over which we have no control. But some of these influences are different. Some of the forces that move us to act do not merely affect which actions we choose to perform, nor how we govern ourselves in making these choices. They influence us in a way that makes a mockery of our authority over our actions. They undermine our autonomy.

What distinguishes autonomy-undermining influences on a person's will from those motivating forces that merely play a role in the self-governing process? This is the question that all accounts of autonomy try to answer. As the number and variety of these accounts indicate, the distinction is extremely elusive. There is certainly widespread agreement about the paradigm threats to personal autonomy: brainwashing and addiction are the favorite examples in the philosophical literature. But philosophers seem unable to reach a consensus about the precise nature of these threats. They cannot agree about how it is that certain influences on our behavior prevent us from governing ourselves.

This disagreement about the defining characteristics of autonomous agency reflects the fact that even as concrete examples call attention to a very real difference between those who govern themselves and those who do not, there are significant conceptual obstacles to making sense of this distinction. These obstacles are tied to the very feature of agency mentioned above — the feature that appears to support the demand that individuals be granted considerable political and legal power. If an agent fails to govern herself, this must be because, at the time, she lacks the power to do so. But in what can this powerlessness consist? If she necessarily has the authority to determine how she will act, and if this essential feature of agency is inseparable from the fact that she necessarily defers to herself whenever she initiates her action, then how can her behavior possibly escape her control? Intuitively, agents can fall under the sway of desires, or urges, or compulsions whose power is at odds with their power as agents; they can be moved by such impulses “in spite of themselves.” But in what sense, exactly, are such motives “external” to the agent herself? How can their power to cause her to act fail to be a manifestation of her power to act?

The puzzle at the heart of these questions is a puzzle about the relationship between the agent's power and the power of the forces that move her. And it is a puzzle about the relationship between the agent's authority and the status of these motivating forces. What distinguishes motives whose power is attributable to the agent herself from motives whose power is external to the agent's? What distinguishes motives on which the agent has conferred her authority from motives whose power has reduced her authorization to a mere formality? When the governing agent and the agent she governs are the very same self, we cannot answer either of these questions without answering the other. This is why it is so difficult to produce a satisfactory account of personal autonomy.

(Again, the perplexity to which these questions give voice does not have a correlate in the political case. We can easily grasp the idea of a country's army (or legislative body, or cabinet ministers) dictating to the president what legislation he must approve; for in this case there are (at least) two independently identifiable decision-makers — each with its own point of view, each with its own power. The difficulty in the case where the relevant powers are all within the psyche of the individual agent is that there is no such independently identifiable pair of standpoints in terms of which we can distinguish the powers that bully the agent from the powers that can be attributed to the agent herself. An account of the conditions under which an individual agent is bullied by her motives is, at the same time, an account of what makes a motive external to the agent's own standpoint.)

2. Four More or Less Overlapping Approaches to Personal Autonomy

Philosophers have proposed many different accounts of the autonomous agent's special relation to her own motives. According to one prominent approach, which one might call coherentist, the governing self in this relation is represented by reflexive attitudes — “higher-order” attitudes toward the mental states that move her to act.[1] Someone is an autonomous agent, the coherentists argue, if and only if she accepts her motives, or identifies with them, or approves of them, or believes that they make sense in terms of her long term commitments or plans. Intuitively, if someone repudiates the causal efficacy of her own motives, then their power is independent of her authority. If, on the other hand, she endorses these motives, then her actions occur with her permission, if not necessarily at her command. In the second case, the motives are truly her own; in the first case, they are external forces in conflict with her own causal powers.

On a strict coherentist approach to autonomy, autonomous agents can be moved by desires they are helpless to resist: though an addict fails to govern herself if she would rather resist her irresistible urge to take drugs, she is an autonomous agent if she has no objection to her addiction and its motivational effects. According to the coherentist, moreover, both the origin and the content of a person's higher-order attitudes are irrelevant to whether she is an autonomous agent. She need have done nothing to bring it about that she has these attitudes; and the attitudes need not be especially rational or well-informed. Coherentist accounts are thus doubly internalist. They express the intuition that whether we govern ourselves depends on neither how we came to be who we are (a fact that is external to the action itself) nor how our beliefs and attitudes relate to reality (a fact that is external to the beliefs and attitudes themselves). There need be no special relation between our autonomy-constituting attitudes and either the past circumstances that caused these attitudes or the present circumstances in response to which they move us to act.

Other accounts of autonomy introduce conditions that are externalist in one or both of these ways. According to those who advocate a reasons-responsive conception of autonomous agency, an agent does not really govern herself unless her motives, or the mental processes that produce them, are responsive to a sufficiently wide range of reasons for and against behaving as she does.[2] On accounts of this type, an agent who is unresponsive to the reasons for “standing behind,” or “backing up,” certain motives and not others is not in the proper position to authorize her own actions. Whether the relevant reasons are grounded in facts about her own desires and interests, or whether they have some independent source, the idea is that someone is not qualified to govern herself if she cannot understand what she has reason to do, or (if this is a distinct handicap) is incapable of being moved by these reasons. In effect, her exercise of authority is so ill-conceived that it is powerless to confer legitimacy on her motives.

The feature of this account that most distinguishes it from the coherentist account is the importance it attributes to an agent's ability to appreciate the reasons she has. (Once she appreciates these reasons, her inability to act accordingly is, essentially, the inability to conform her act to her (higher-order) desire to be moved accordingly.) What, exactly, is the connection supposed to be between being out of touch with (evaluative and nonevaluative) reality and failing to govern oneself? Clearly, a person who fails to appreciate a wide range of reasons for action is unlikely to govern herself well: she is likely to do things that will, in the long run, thwart her own purposes and interests. The reasons-responsiveness conception of autonomy thus appears to reflect the intuition that when we do something very poorly, we do not really do it at all. There is, however, another possible underlying rationale for regarding ignorance as a threat to self-government. If doing Y is constitutive of doing Z, then if I authorize myself to be moved by the desire to do Y because I mistakenly believe that doing Y is a way of not doing Z, then there is an obvious sense in which I have not authorized myself to do what I am now doing when I am moved by the desire to do Y. So, if I have a general desire to do what is right and prudent, or, even more generally, a desire to do what I can justify to others, then insofar as I am moved to act in ways that are incompatible with satisfying these desires, there is a sense in which I — who am committed to doing only what I have good (enough) reason to do — have not really authorized my action. Alternatively, we could say that, under these circumstances, something external to my power to guide myself by reasons has prevented me from exercising this power, and so has prevented me from governing myself.

An additional source of support for the reasons-responsive conception of autonomy comes from the thought that someone who cannot respond to the reasons there are must have a limited ability to reason. This brings us to a third popular approach to autonomous agency — an approach that stresses the importance of the reasoning process itself.[3] According to responsiveness to reasoning accounts, the essence of self-government is the capacity to evaluate one's motives on the basis of whatever else one believes and desires, and to adjust these motives in response to one's evaluations. It is the capacity to discern what “follows from” one's beliefs and desires, and to act accordingly. One can exercise this capacity despite holding false beliefs of all kinds about what one has reason to do. Being autonomous is not the same thing as being guided by correct evaluative and normative judgments.

The emphasis on an autonomous agent's responsiveness to her own reasoning reflects the intuition that someone whose education consisted of a method of indoctrination that deprived her of the ability to call her own attitudes into question would, in effect, be governed by her “programmers,” not by herself. So, too, someone whose practical reasoning was directly manipulated by others would not govern herself by means of this reasoning. And so, it seems, she would have no power over the motives that this reasoning produced.

Like the coherentists, advocates of responsiveness to reasoning accounts believe that the key to autonomous agency is the ability to distance oneself from one's attitudes and beliefs — to occupy a standpoint that is not constituted by whatever mental states are moving one to act. They agree that motives authorized from this reflective standpoint are internal to the agent herself in a way that her other motives are not. Unlike the coherentists, however, the reasoning-responsive theorists believe that there is more to the capacity for self-reflection than the capacity to hold higher-order attitudes. The authority of our higher-order attitudes is grounded, they claim, in the authority of the practical reasoning that supports these attitudes. So a self-governing agent does not merely endorse her motives: her endorsements are implicit claims about which motives have the support of her reason.

This fact is closely tied to another. Like many accounts that stress an autonomous agent's responsiveness to reasons, responsiveness to reasoning accounts often suggest that self-government requires the capacity for self-transformation. On this assumption, an autonomous agent is capable of changing her mind when she discovers good reason to do so.[4] In contrast, strict coherentists insist that it is possible to act autonomously while being moved by desires that are not only irresistible when they produce their effects, but so integral to one's identity that one could not possibly will to resist them, no matter how convincing one found the arguments in favor of doing so.

The conception of autonomous agency as responsiveness to reasoning clearly has a more internalist character than the conception of autonomous agency as responsiveness to reasons: according to those who stress the autonomous agent's ability to evaluate her own motives, what counts is not the relation between the agent's attitudes and external reality, but her ability to draw inferences from what she wants and believes, and by so doing, to reconsider — to rationally reflect upon — her other desires and beliefs. Insofar, however, as a responsiveness to reasoning account presupposes a particular conception of practical reasoning, it appeals to standards, or principles, that the agent herself might misapply, or fail to recognize altogether. Moreover, even if advocates of autonomy as responsiveness to reasoning have nothing in particular in mind when they speak of the process of “reflection,” “rational evaluation,” etc., reasoning is a norm-governed process that an agent might reject for reasons of her own. Responsiveness to reasoning accounts thus contain an externalist element that is absent from strict coherentist accounts. They imply that an agent can be mistaken about whether she is really reasoning — and so can be mistaken about whether the power of her motives reflects her authority over her own actions.

This weak externalism naturally expands into more robust varieties. In particular, it supports the idea that whether an agent's reasoning is really her way of authorizing her actions depends on which forces exert a nonrational influence on this reasoning. Even when indoctrination and other more or less imaginary forms of “mind control” do not prevent a person from reaching evaluative conclusions about her own motives, they can prevent her from thinking for herself. So, too, it seems, someone in the grip of compulsion or addiction can be so bullied by this condition that whatever facts she considers, and whatever conclusions she draws, cannot legitimately be attributed to her. One way to interpret these cases is to say that the person's reasoning falls so far short of the norms of “rational reflection” that she is not really reasoning at all. Alternatively, one can say that her reasoning does not guarantee her autonomy because it is under the control of external forces.

Insofar as accounts of autonomy simply stipulate that certain influences on an agent's intention-forming process “interfere with,” or “pervert” this process — insofar as they do not explain what distinguishes “internal” from “external” forces — these accounts are incomplete. For they leave it mysterious why certain influences, and not others, are a threat to self-government. One response to the mystery is offered by the reasons-responsive account: the autonomy-undermining influences are the ones that prevent the reasoning process from being sufficiently sensitive to the reasons there are. A fourth approach to autonomy, very different from the other three mentioned so far, rejects the mystery as a symptom of confusion. Thus some philosophers argue that cases of mind-control simply call our attention to the fact that whenever our motives are causally determined by events over which we have no control, their power does not depend on our authority. According to this incompatibilist conception of autonomy, autonomy is incompatible with determinism. If our actions can be fully explained as the effects of causal powers that are independent of us, then even if our beliefs and attitudes are among these effects, we do not govern them, and so we do not govern ourselves.[5]

The approaches just sketched have been developed in many subtly different ways. Some of these differences reflect disagreements over the extent to which the relevant conditions — coherence among higher- and lower-order attitudes, responsiveness to reasons, responsiveness to reasoning, freedom from determination by external causes — must actually be manifest when an agent determines her will, or whether it is enough that under certain specified circumstances the agent would relate to her motives in the stipulated manner. There is also a difference of opinion about the scope of the relevant capacities: Must an autonomous agent be able to respond to a wide range of reasons for and against her action? or is it enough that her motives are responsive to the “strongest,” “most compelling” reasons? and can these reasons include the sort of credible threats that figure in cases of coercion? What range of attitudes must an autonomous agent be capable of calling into question? How well must she be capable of reasoning? Does it matter whether she is guided by certain principles of rationality? Must it be possible for her to draw different conclusions on the basis of the reasons she considers? Is it essential that she could have considered a different set of reasons instead? Clearly, the many possible answers to these questions can be combined in many different ways. And, more generally, the basic approaches themselves often figure together as necessary or sufficient conditions in a single complex account.

3. Challenges to Identifying the Minimal Conditions of Personal Autonomy

Whatever specific form the competing proposals take, they all contribute to our understanding of the various ways in which agents can play a governing role in their own actions. They articulate an ideal that agents can realize to various degrees. And in so doing, they shed light on how, with the proper training, a very young child, whose deference to the authority of her own judgments is little more than the form of self-government, can develop into a fully autonomous agent.

This is a very important contribution. Nonetheless, it falls short of giving us everything we have reason to expect from an account of autonomy. In particular, challenges to the different approaches sketched above suggest that no account built from these materials can succeed in distinguishing autonomous from nonautonomous agency. In other words, none of these accounts seems to identify the minimal conditions under which a person can be said to act on her own authority — the conditions that must be satisfied if someone's exercise of authority over her action is to be, not a mere formality, but a way of relating to herself that renders her accountable for the forces that move her to act.

Consider, first, the alleged requirement of responsiveness to reasons. To many critics, there is an obvious problem with this requirement. A person, they argue, can govern herself even if she does not understand the significance of what she is doing. To govern oneself is to maintain a certain self-relation; and, many insist, the elements in this relation include one's own beliefs, however unreliable these may be. In killing Desdemona, Othello fails to accomplish his aim of doing what he has good reason to do. But this does not prevent him from being the author of his own misguided actions. So, too, an envious, vengeful, and very stubborn person does not fail to govern herself just because she is unresponsive to the wide range of reasons against trying to sabotage her colleague's career. An agent's failure to respond to certain reasons may be good evidence of the fact that she is not really the author of her actions. But being out of touch with (evaluative or nonevaluative) reality is not the same thing as lacking autonomy.

Nor does autonomous agency require that one's actions be compatible with one's long-term plans. Such plans often enable a person to exercise some measure of control over her life as a whole; they are her way of governing her more local exercises of self-government. But a person can govern herself at a particular time even while defying her earlier attempts to place constraints on how she will govern herself at this time. She can take it upon herself to abandon her plans, or to modify them in ways she did not anticipate when she first made them. She can even reject the counsel of her long-term values.

Even under such circumstances, an autonomous agent “identifies with” the mental states that move her to act. Many philosophers have thus embraced the coherentist position that the attitude of identification is the key to personal autonomy. But this approach, too, has problems that cannot be solved by combining it with other approaches, problems that become evident when we try to spell out what is involved in identifying with one's motives.

Without an account of identification, we have not advanced beyond our initial intuition that the actions of self-governing agents are caused by motives that are, in some sense, internal to the agents themselves. According to the most popular account, someone identifies with her motives if and only if she endorses, or approves of, them. This, allegedly, is what makes them internal; it is what ensures that their power is really her own. One obvious problem with such accounts is that a person could be brainwashed, or otherwise compelled, to endorse a given motive. Indeed, her brain could be manipulated in such a way that her endorsement is highly responsive to reasons. This has led many to supplement coherentist accounts of autonomy with additional conditions that place constraints on the causal history of an agent's endorsements. But there is reason to doubt that such endorsements are even a necessary condition of autonomous agency. In particular, if to endorse one's motive is, essentially, to judge that this motive — or acting from this motive — is good, then the endorsement account of autonomy does not appear to accommodate cases of weakness of will.

By definition, a weak-willed action is an action that someone performs against her best judgment, even while “acting of her own free will” in whatever sense suffices to render an agent accountable for her behavior. A weak-willed agent authorizes herself to act as she does, despite her belief that she has good reason to act otherwise. When someone asserts her authority in this way, she is criticizably irrational; and it is notoriously difficult to make sense of this form of irrationality.[6] For our purposes, however, it is enough to note that if weakness of will is a genuine phenomenon, then human agents have the capacity to govern themselves in a way that they themselves take to be unjustified. They can claim for themselves an authority that challenges the authority of their own reason.

Again, someone whose action is caused in this way does not govern herself as thoroughly as someone whose will is “strong.” For she acts for a reason that she herself deems inadequate; and so she is not (adequately) governed by the norms of her own thought. The point, however, is that even under these conditions, she is an autonomous agent. Self-conflicted though she may be, she is still accountable for what she does. This is not simply because what she does is the result of an earlier autonomous action. Rather, her accountability is intrinsic to her weak-willed action itself. She is a weak-willed self-governor.

The possibility of weakness of will implies that the authorization an agent must give to her motives if she is to count as (minimally) governing their effects need not take the form of the judgment that no alternative action would be better. Some philosophers have lent support to this conclusion by arguing that there are other cases in which a person's authorizations can come apart from her evaluations. Sometimes, they claim, a person cannot follow the recommendations of her own reason without betraying herself. A woman, for example, may conclude that even though she has very good reason to give up her child for adoption, she cannot recognize herself in this action, and so cannot identify with the desire to perform it.[7] Reasonable people will surely disagree about how best to interpret any particular example. But human experience does seem to support the general point: the human capacity for self-reflection enables human agents to distance themselves in thought from every aspect of their own psyches — even their rational reflections. Given this possibility, a person's identification with her motives cannot be cashed out in terms of higher-order attitudes of approval and disapproval, or in terms of the rational reflections that typically ground these attitudes.

What is it, then, to “identify with” certain features of one's mental life? It would seem to be nothing more than to confer one's authority upon them, i.e., to authorize their influence. But if this is right, then the concept of identification cannot help us to distinguish autonomous agents from the rest. It does not provide us with the looked-for explanation of what distinguishes an autonomous agent from someone who exercises her authority at the bidding of external powers, and whose authorization of her motives is thus a mere formality.

Most philosophers fail to recognize the extent of this problem. They acknowledge the possibility of autonomy-undermining influences, like brainwashing, that exert their power behind the scenes. But they also believe that there are straightforward cases in which a person lacks autonomy because she performs an action without authorizing herself to perform it. They point to the case of someone who takes drugs when she would rather resist the motivating force of her addiction. They note that even if many people who fit this description are merely weak-willed, not all of them are. Some addicts, compulsives, and others suffering from emotional and psychic distress are the helpless victims of their own psychological states; and these unfortunate agents lack autonomy precisely because they repudiate their own motives.

Compelling as this diagnosis may be, however, it proves too much. It assimilates addicts to people like those with Tourette's Syndrome, whose behavior is not even voluntary. It reduces the distinction between autonomous and nonautonomous agents to the distinction between agents and nonagents. If someone's motives directly defy her authority (rather than ensuring that she exercises this authority on their terms), then her behavior does not reflect her deference to this authority, and so it fails to satisfy an essential feature of agency. Under such circumstances, a person's motives have a power that is not only unauthorized by the agent herself, and hence, distinct from — external to — her power as an agent; they produce their effects in a way that bypasses her (her agency) altogether. Even if she can acknowledge that there is something to be said for behaving as she does, she is a passive bystander to this behavior, as alienated from the causal efficacy of her own motives as she is from the causal efficacy of the physiological states that produce her reflex movements. She is not an autonomous agent because she is not an agent at all.

4. Agents as Causes and the Practical Point of View

If agents cannot initiate their own actions “on purpose” without authorizing themselves (their motives) to do so, then the distinguishing feature of autonomous agents is not that they identify with their motives but that the authority they assert in doing so is more than a mere formality. What does this difference come to? The incompatibilist, we saw, has a ready answer: in the case of autonomous agency, and only in the case of autonomous agency, there is more to the agent's assertion of authority than the expression of external power. The familiar problem with this answer is that there seems to be no way for an agent to gain an extra measure of control over her motives simply by acquiring attitudes or judgments or other mental states that are not determined by anything else. If someone's attitude toward her motives is not determined by any earlier state of affairs, then how can it be determined by her?

This question pushes those with incompatibilist intuitions to attribute a special causal power to agents — a power that is not reducible to the power one event transmits to another. A person, some incompatibilists argue, can agent-cause a certain response to earlier events in a way that is not itself the effect of these earlier events. Simply by virtue of being the particular person she is, she can bring it about that she is motivated in a certain way. And the explanatory fact that she is this particular person cannot be reduced to any more basic facts about her dispositions to respond in certain ways to certain inputs; her power over her actions cannot be reduced to the power of external motivating forces.[8]

The obscurities of agent-causation are enough to prevent most philosophers from embracing this conception of autonomous agency. To mention just a few familiar challenges: If agent-causing an event does not involve doing anything, then how does the agent exert her causal power? and why does this power produce its effects at one time rather than another? If, on the other hand, the agent must do something in order to agent-cause an action, then doesn't this require that she undergo some change? and isn't this change of state itself an event? On the basis of these and other difficulties, many conclude that the appeal to agent-causation provides no more insight into autonomy than the simple assertion that we can sometimes govern the effects of our own motives. Yet the agent-causation theorists call our attention to something important. The strong conviction that we are often autonomous agents is grounded in the basic experience of determining our own wills. We believe that we have the capacity for self-government because we believe that, whatever forces may be pressing us to act, it is ultimately “up to us” to determine what to “make of” the pushes and pulls that constitute our mental life.

The seeming incoherence of agent-causation, and more generally, the seeming impossibility of articulating a conception of agency according to which the capacity for self-government depends on the agent's freedom from determining causes, leads some to conclude that autonomous agency is an illusion: our deep conviction notwithstanding, we do not really know that we can govern ourselves. Others, however, see things differently. They argue that this pessimistic conclusion reflects a misunderstanding of the very nature of rational agency. In making their case, they take their lead from the philosopher who has contributed more than any other to our understanding of autonomy. Kant, they note, stresses the deep differences between the two points of view from which we can think about ourselves and our world.[9] We take up the theoretical point of view in order to gain knowledge about the nature of reality, and on this basis make predictions about which effects will follow from which causes. When we want to make up our minds about what to do, however, we take up the practical point of view. From this point of view, too, we survey the facts that are relevant to our decisions. But none of these facts, taken singly or together, is intrinsically action-guiding; none can free us from the task of drawing our own conclusions about what we have reason to do. This is true even of facts about reasons. Whatever the basis of these facts may be, the normative relations among them are far from determinate. We have to make the necessary determinations ourselves. Given everything we know about what is and what ought to be, we have to determine how we are going to act.

Necessarily, theoretical reasoners are passive bystanders to the events on the basis of which they predict future events. But practical reasoners are not mere observers of the passing scene. As practical reasoners, we have no choice but to determine our responses to what we observe — even if everything we do — and so, everything we decide to do — is determined by events in the past. To make up our minds, we need not be sophisticated reasoners. We need not even be capable of doubting the legitimacy of our most powerful motives. We must, however, find a reason to do one thing rather than another. And since no fact can play the role of a reason unless someone takes it to be a reason, practical reasoners necessarily have the ultimate authority over the powers that move them.


We are back where we started. The demand to be permitted to govern ourselves reflects the conviction that we are, in essence, self-governors. In essence, but not always in fact. Sometimes our authority over our actions is nothing but the form of self-government. Sometimes we are not autonomous agents. If, then, the structure of rational agency justifies our conviction that we are capable of governing our own actions, it does not hold the key to the distinction between those cases in which we fail to exercise this capacity and those in which we succeed. The conviction that there is such a distinction is grounded in the obvious fact that victims of brainwashing, compulsion, addiction, depression, anxiety, and many other conditions are prevented from governing themselves. If their lack of autonomy is not simply a function of the fact that their actions are causally determined by states of affairs over which they have no control, and if it is not equivalent to any fact about the considerations they are disposed to recognize and be moved by, then it would seem to be a more intrinsic feature of their agency. No particular attitude seems to be essential to autonomous agency, however — except, of course, the attitude of authorization that is essential to all action for a reason. Nor is it necessary that any particular principles of reasoning serve the autonomous agent as guides — except, again, whatever principles must guide the action of even nonautonomous agents. The content of our desire to govern ourselves when we act thus remains obscure to us, even as the legitimacy of this desire is clear.


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Related Entries

action | Aristotle | authority | causation: and manipulability | compatibilism | determinism: causal | free will | incompatibilism: (nondeterministic) theories of free will | Kant, Immanuel | moral motivation | moral responsibility | Plato | practical reason | Reid, Thomas | Schopenhauer, Arthur | weakness of will

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