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Multiple Realizability

In the philosophy of mind, multiple realizability is the contention that a given mental kind (property, state, event) is realized by distinct physical kinds. The classic example (presented below) is pain: a wide variety of physical states and events, sharing nothing in common at that level of description, can presumably realize the same pain state. This contention served as a premise in the most influential argument against early psychoneural identity theories. It also served indirectly in early arguments for functionalism. More recently, it has been adopted by nonreductive physicalists to challenge all varieties of psychophysical reduction. It has even been employed to challenge the functionalism it initially motivated. A variety of recent reductionist programs have either attacked the argument from multiple realizability to irreducibility or revised aspects of classical reductionism that made the latter susceptible to this challenge. Even the truth of the multiple realizability contention has been questioned.

What is meant by "realization" in this context? Typically a standard characterization is given. An event e's being F realizes e's being G just in case (i) e is F, (ii) e is G, (iii) for all e it is (physically) necessary that if e is F then e is G, and (iv) e's being F explains e's being G. The last condition requires extensive clarification, but the key point is that realization is stronger than "mere" (physical) necessity. This is because some (physically) necessary property connections are not explanatory. It should be noted that this standard characterization does not capture the relation championed by some functionalists, who hold that a physical state can realize a functional state contingently. The appropriate characterization of realization, like that of supervenience in related contexts, remains a contentious matter.

Putnam's Early Arguments

In a series of papers published throughout the 1960s (and reprinted in his 1975 anthology, Hilary Putnam introduced multiple realizability into the philosophy of mind. Against the "brain state theorist," who holds that every mental kind (like pain) is identical to some as-yet-undiscovered neural kind ("C-fiber firing" was a favorite expression), Putnam considers the wide variety of terrestrial creatures seemingly capable of the former. Humans, other primates, other mammals, birds, reptiles, amphibians, and even mollusks (e.g., octopi) seem reasonable candidates for pain-bearing. But then for the brain state theory to be true, there must be some physical-chemical kind common to this wide variety of neural structures, and correlated exactly with each occurrence of the mental kind. This is a necessary condition of the hypothesized type-identity. Comparative neuroanatomy and physiology, facts about convergent evolution, and the corticalization of function (especially sensory function) as cortical mass increases across species all speak against this consequence. Furthermore, early identity theories insisted that these identities, while contingent, hold by virtue of natural (scientific) law. But then any physically possible cognizer (e.g., pain-bearer) must also be capable of that physical-chemical kind. Here the well-known philosophers' fantasies enter the discussion: silicon-based androids, artificially intelligent electronic robots, Martians with green slime pulsating through their heads. Even further, these identity theories were supposed to be completely general: every mental kind was held to be identical to some neural kind. So the critic needed to find only one mental kind realized differently at the physical-chemical level. As Putnam admitted, the early identity theories were empirical hypotheses. But one consequence was "certainly ambitious," and (highly) probably false.

The argument from multiple realizability for functionalism is more indirect. Ned Block and Jerry Fodor (reprinted as Chapter 4 in Fodor 1981)once noted that this feature of the mental shows that any physical type-identity hypothesis will be insufficiently abstract. Functionalism, which seeks to identify mental kinds with functional kinds characterized exhaustively in terms of their causes and effects, seems to be the next level of abstraction up in the property hierarchy from physical mechanisms. Multiple realizability at the level of physical description is a common characteristic of functional kinds like mousetrap and valve lifter. Characterizing mental kinds as functional kinds thus appears to be a reasonable empirical hypothesis in light of multiple physical realizability.

Fodor's Elaboration and the Legacy of Multiple Realizability

One reply a physical type-identity theorist might make identifies mental kinds with the disjunction of the physical kinds realizing it. (Jaegwon Kim once defended this strategy; the article is reprinted as Chapter 8 in Kim 1993.) Putnam dismissed this strategy as unworthy of serious consideration, but Fodor saw the deep difficulty that the required disjunctions create. In Chapter 1 of his (1975) he argued that reductionism imposes too strong a constraint on acceptable theories in special sciences like psychology. Fodor characterized reductionism as the conjunction of "token physicalism" with the claim that there are natural kind predicates in an ideally completed physics corresponding to each natural kind term in any ideally completed special science. (He characterized "token physicalism" as the claim that all events that science talks about are physical events.) Fodor gave reductionists the best-developed theory of reduction at the time: in essence, Ernest Nagel's (1961) "derivability" account, which "connected" disparate elements of the reduced and reducing vocabularies via "bridge laws" and claimed a reduction when the laws of the reduced theory were derived from the laws of the reducing and the bridge laws. According to Fodor (1975), if reductionism is to establish physicalism, these cross-theoretic bridge laws must establish contingent identities of reduced and reducing kinds. But given multiple realizability, the only way this can obtain is if the physical science constituent of a psychophysical bridge law is a disjunction of all the terms denoting possible physical realizations of the mental kind. Given the extent and variety of the latter, it is overwhelmingly likely that the disjunctive component will not be a kind-predicate, nor the entire statement a law, of any physical science. Multiple realizability demonstrates that the additional component of reductionism (beyond token physicalism) is empirically untenable.

In a pair of famous examples illustrating multiple realizability in special sciences (economics and psychology), Fodor (1981, Chapter 5) implicitly distinguishes two types of the relation. Call the type Putnam emphasized multiple realizability "across physical structure-types." A more radical type would obtain when a token nervous system realizes a given mental kind via distinct neural events at different times. Call this sense multiple realizability "in a token system across times." (These terms are from John Bickle 1998, Chapter 4.) This second sense will typically increase the disjunctive components of psychophysical bridge laws, because there will be a disjunction of physical predicates realizing each mental kind for every token cognizer.

Following Fodor, psychologist Zenon Pylyshyn (1984) used multiple realizability to ground a methodological criticism of reductionism. He describes a pedestrian, having just witnessed an automobile accident, rushing into a nearby phone booth and dialing a 9 and a 1. What will this person do next? Dial another 1, with overwhelming likelihood. Why? Because of a systematic generalization holding between what he recognized, his background knowledge, his resulting intentions, and that action (intentionally described). But we won't discover that generalization if we focus on his neurophysiology and the resulting muscular contractions. That level of explanation is too weak, for it cannot tell us that this sequence of neural events and muscular contractions corresponds to the action of dialing a 1. A given physiological explanation only links one way of learning the emergency phone number to one way of coming to know that an emergency occurred to one sequence of neural events and resulting muscular contractions producing the behavior (nonintentionally described). However, the number of physical events constituting each of these cognitive classes--the learning, the coming to know, and the action of dialing--is potentially unlimited, with the constituents of each class often unrelated to each other at the physiological level of description. This is a consequence of multiple realizability. So if there is a generalization at the higher level of description available for capturing--and in the pedestrian example there surely is--an exclusively reductionist approach to psychological explanation will miss it. Thus because of multiple realizability, reductionism violates a tenet of scientific methodology: seek to capture all capturable generalizations. (Fodor 1975, Chapter 5, and Terence Horgan 1993 have also raised related methodological caveats about reductionism resting ultimately on multiple realizability. Bickle 1998, Chapter 4, has recently responded to these.)

Contemporary nonreductive physicalism is currently the dominant position in Anglo-American philosophy of mind. It accepts without alteration or amendment the multiple realizability challenge to all versions of reductive materialism. Ernest LePore and Barry Loewer (1989) have recently called the nonidentity of mental content and physical properties "practically received wisdom" among philosophers of mind. This generalization of the multiple realizability argument also traces back to Fodor (1975 and 1981, Chapter 5). While he targeted explicitly reductionism built on the classical logical empiricist account, he also suggested that his argument applied to more "liberal" versions of reduction then under development. Nonreductive materialists part company with functionalists over the latter's attempt to identify mental kinds with functional kinds. Most of the arguments hinge on issues about individualism in psychology. But a multiple realizability argument has surfaced here. In specifying the nature of mental kinds, many functionalists followed Putnam and Fodor by adopting "Turing machine functionalism": mental kinds are identical to the computational kinds of a suitably programmed universal Turing machine. Putnam (1988) has recently argued that mental kinds are both "compositionally" and "computationally" plastic. The first point is his familiar multiple realizability contention of the mental on the physical. The second contends that the same mental kind can be a property of systems which are not of the same (Turing) computational state. Multiple realizability strikes back at the very theory of mind it initially motivated!

Early Reductionist Replies

David Lewis (reprinted as Chapter 18 in Block 1980) offered the earliest influential reply to Putnam's multiple realizability argument. The inconsistency between the reductionist's thesis and multiple realizability evaporates when we note a tacit relativity to context. A common sense example illustrates Lewis's point. The following three claims appear inconsistent: (1) There is only one winning lottery number. (2) The winning lottery number is 03. (3) The winning lottery number is 61. These three claims seem similarly inconsistent: (1′) (the reductionist thesis) There is only one physical-chemical realization of pain. (2′) The physical-chemical realization of pain is C-fiber firing. (3′) The physical-chemical realization of pain is . . . (something else entirely). ((2′) and (3′) reflect the multiple realizability contention.) But there is no mystery in reconciling (1) -- (3). Append "per week" to (1), "this week" to (2), and "last week" to (3). Similarly, append "per structure-type" to (1′), "in humans" to (2′), and "in mollusks" to (3′). Inconsistency evaporates. Lewis's point is that reductive identities are always specific to a domain.

Many philosophers have elaborated on Lewis's point. Patricia Churchland (1986, Chapter 7), Clifford Hooker (1981), Berent Enç (1983), and other philosophers of science have described historical intertheoretic reductions where a given reduced concept is multiply realized at the reducing level. A common example is the concept of temperature from classical equilibrium thermodynamics. Temperature in a gas is identical to mean molecular kinetic energy. Temperature in a solid, however, is identical to mean maximal molecular kinetic energy, since the molecules of a solid are bound in lattice structures and hence restricted to a range of vibratory motions. Temperature in a plasma is something else entirely, since the molecular constituents of a plasma have been ripped apart. Even a vacuum can have a (blackbody) temperature, though it contains no molecular constituents. Temperature of classical thermodynamics is multiply realized microphysically in a variety of distinct physical states. Yet this is a "textbook" intertheoretic reduction and cross-theory identification. The reduction and identification are specific to the domain of physical state.

Lewis's insight also underlies Jaegwon Kim's recent appeal to structure-specific "local reductions" (reprinted as Chapters 14 and 16 in Kim 1993). Kim agrees that multiple realizability rules out a general reduction of (structure-independent) psychology to the physical sciences. But it permits (even sanctions) a local reduction to a theory of the physical mechanisms of a given structure-type. (Kim admits that the relevant structure-types here will probably be narrower than biological species.) Local reductions involve "structure-specific bridge laws" where the mental-physical biconditional occurs as the consequent of a conditional whose antecedent denotes a specific structure-type. Conditionals whose antecedents denote different structure types will typically have biconditionals as consequents whose mental term- constituents are coreferential but whose physical term- constituents denote different physical events. Multiple realizability forces this much revision to the bridge laws of classical reductionism. But according to Kim, local reductions are the rule rather than the exception in science generally, and are sufficient for any reasonable scientific or philosophical purpose. Kim's is yet another way to express the tacit specificity to a domain in scientific reductions.

Multiple Realizability Within Structure-Types and Token Systems

The scope of Lewis's strategy and its recent variations is limited, however. They only adequately address the "across structure-types" version of the multiple realizability argument. Recent anti-reductionists have stressed the more radical type. To capture that sense, the context or domain to which a reduction must be relativized is a token system of a structure-type at a time. This much "domain" or "context" specificity seems inconsistent with even a minimally acceptable degree of generality in scientific theorizing. This reply goes back to Ned Block's work in the late 1970s (reprinted as Chapter 22 in Block 1980). Block insisted that the necessary narrowing of psychological kinds renders psychology incapable of capturing whatever generalizations hold across species. Ronald Endicott (1993) gives Block's reply an interesting empirical twist by noting facts about plasticity in the human brain. The capacity for distinct neural structures and processes to subserve a given psychological function owing to trauma, damage, changing task demands, development, and other factors is extensive. A psychology narrowed enough to handle the more radical type of multiple realizability might not be sufficiently general to capture generalizations even within a species whose brains display human-like plasticity.

Against this reply, Kim (1993, Chapter 16) and Bickle (1998, Chapter 4) independently remind us that a guiding methodological principle in contemporary neuroscience assumes some continuity of underlying neural mechanisms. This assumption informs most experimental techniques and paradigms, and theoretical conclusions drawn from experimental data. Continuity is assumed both within and across species. If the radical sense of multiple realizability really obtained, to the extent necessary to circumvent the Lewis-inspired replies to the initial multiple realizability argument, contemporary neuroscientific experimental techniques should bear little fruit. (Why study the macaque visual system to investigate human visual processing, for example, if we can't safely assume some continuity across species? Why should PET scans reveal common areas of high metabolic activity across and within individual humans, down to less than a centimeter of resolution? Standard neuroscientific experimental procedures and even clinical diagnostic tools would be hopelessly naïve.) These procedures do work, however (and are not hopelessly naïve), and this is evidence that psychological functions might not be so radically multiply realized as recent anti-reductionists pretend. Even neural plasticity is systematic. It has a regular progression following damage to a principal structure; there are underlying neural mechanisms that subserve it. Furthermore, function following damage is often seriously degraded. Persons can still talk, manipulate spatial representations, or move their extremities, but their performance is often qualitatively and quantitatively less than normal. This fact gives rise to tricky questions about individuation of psychological function. Are these alternative neural structures realizing the same psychological function (the same mental kind) as before?

Still, one would like a more direct reply to this more radical type of multiple realizability. Following suggestions by Hooker (1981) and Enc (1983), Bickle (1998, Chapter 4) argues that this feature is common to scientific reductions generally. For example, it obtains in the "textbook" reduction of classical equilibrium thermodynamics to microphysics via statistical mechanics. For any token aggregate of gas molecules, there is an indefinite number of realizations of a given temperature, a given mean molecular kinetic energy. Microphysically, the most fine-grained theoretical specification of a gas is its microcanonical ensemble, in which the momentum and the location (and thus the kinetic energy) of each molecule is specified individually. Indefinitely many distinct microcanonical ensembles of a token volume of gas molecules can yield the same mean molecular kinetic energy. Thus at the lowest level of microphysical description, temperature is vastly multiply realizable in the same token system over time. So even multiple realizability in this more radical sense is not by itself a barrier to reducibility. (Bickle also argues that exactly this relation obtains within "connectionist" theories of representational content.)

Other Replies to Multiple Realizability Arguments

In searching for reductive unity underlying the variety of cognitive systems, Paul Churchland (1982) once suggested descending "below" neurobiology and even biochemistry to the level of nonequilibrium thermodynamics. He insisted that finding reductive unity there was more than a bare logical possibility, because of some parallels between biological processes, whose multiply realized kinds find reductive unity there, and cognitive activity (especially learning). Robert Richardson (1979) once suggested that the Putnam-Fodor challenge resulted from an incomplete understanding of Ernest Nagel's classic account of reduction. Although Nagel's examples involve biconditional cross-theory connections, one-way conditional connections expressing sufficient conditions at the reducing level were all his "principle of derivability" required. (Richardson cites the relevant passages from Nagel's classic exposition.) Multiple realizability only challenges the necessity of (nondisjunctive) reducing conditions, and so is not a challenge to even a projected Nagelian reduction of psychology to the physical sciences.

Besides his appeal to species-specific bridge laws and local reducibility, Kim (1993, Chapter 14) has recently offered two additional replies to the multiple realizability argument. His "projectability" reply starts from the familiar fact that the kind "jade" fragments into jadeite and nephrite. This renders jade incapable of passing the projectability test for nomicness because of its genuinely disjunctive nature. Multiple realizability of psychological kinds yields the same consequence. Instead of rendering psychology an autonomous special science, multiple realizability implies that there is no structure-independent scientific psychology. There are only "local" scientific psychologies reducible to the theory of the underlying physical mechanisms of the structure-type in question. Closely related is his "causal powers" reply. Scientific kinds are individuated by their causal powers, and the causal powers of each instance of some realized kind are identical to those of its realizer. From these principles it follows that instances of a mental kind with different physical realizations are distinct kinds. Thus (structure-independent) mental kinds are not causal kinds, and hence are disqualified as proper scientific kinds. Multiple realizability yields the failure of structure-independent mental kinds to meet the standards of scientific kinds. (Terence Horgan 1996 has mounted some interesting rejoinders to these related arguments.)

With regard to Pylyshyn's (1984) attack on reductionist methodology, Patricia Churchland (1986, Chapter 9) suggests that lower level sciences themselves can construct functional theories. This inserts a new level of theory between that of the structure of the lower level kinds and that of purely functional kinds: between, for example, the physiology of individual neurons and cognitive psychology. We might find a common neurofunctional property for a given type of psychological state. And if the scope of the macro-theory doesn't extend beyond that of its microfunctional counterpart, then reduction will be achieved despite vast multiple realizability at the microstructural level. Neurocomputational approaches that have blossomed recently give empirical credence to Churchland's suggestion. Bickle (1998, Chapters 3 and 4) has tried to explain how such a result is sufficient for reduction by building some suggestions from Hooker (1981, Part III) about "cross categorial" and "token-to-token" reductions into a general model of the intertheoretic reduction relation. The cross-classifications implied by multiple realizability might require that a special kind of reduction relation obtain between psychology and the physical sciences. But this will be reduction enough, with plenty of scientific precedent.

Finally, notice that all reductionist responses discussed so far refrain from attacking the multiple realizability contention itself. Even this has been attacked. Nick Zangwill (1992) insists that multiple realizability across biological species has not been proven. The multiple realizability contention assumes a type-identity of mental kinds across species. This assumption is problematic, given that the obvious sensory and motor differences alone will yield different cause-and-effect patterns at all but the grossest level of description. We are back to tricky issues about how psychology individuates types. It is interesting to note in closing that nobody has developed the argument that the multiple realizability contention rests precariously on "folk" intuitions about mental type-individuation.


Other Internet Resources

David Chalmers' Bibliography on Reduction and Multiple Realizability

Related Entries

functionalism | physicalism | reduction and reductionism

Copyright © 1998
John Bickle

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