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Mental Causation

The concept of mental causation plays a central role in how we think of the mind and of human agency. Traditionally the problem of mental causation has been that of understanding how a mental substance (thought to be immaterial) could interact with the body, a physical substance. Many philosophers these days reject immaterial minds, but the problem of mental causation has not gone away. Now the focus is on how mental properties can be causally relevant to bodily behavior, how the mental can cause what it does qua mental. After briefly discussing the traditional problem of interaction, we survey various versions of the property-based problem and look at proposed solutions to them.

1. The Importance of the Issue

Mind-body interaction is a necessary part of our pretheoretic conception of agency. Gus's barking his shin produces a feeling of pain, and this feeling causes Gus to seek his mother's comfort. When Lilian deliberates over competing courses of action, settles on one of these, and forms an intention to act, it is her forming the intention, a mental occurrence, that leads to her subsequent behavior. Such examples are part of our commonsense picture of ourselves.

It's not surprising, then, that questions about mind-body interaction often accompany philosophical reflection about the nature of the mind. Indeed, mental causation sometimes figures explicitly in how the mind-body problem itself is formulated. Keith Campbell (1984, p. 14), for example, contends the problem is generated by the following four propositions:

(1) The human body is a material thing.
(2) The human mind is a spiritual thing.
(3) Mind and body interact.
(4) Spirit and matter do not interact.

These four give rise to a problem because (barring equivocation) they are jointly inconsistent: at least one of them is false. Whether one feels pressure to reject this or that proposition will depend, in part, on how one evaluates the causal claims in (3) and (4). In this sense, how one answers questions about mental causation can determine how one views the mind's place in nature.

The philosophical significance of mental causation goes beyond general concerns about the nature of mind. Some philosophers (e.g., Davidson 1963; Mele 1992) insist that the very notion of psychological explanation turns on the intelligibility of mental causation. If my mind and its states, such as my beliefs and desires, are causally isolated from my bodily behavior, then the mental cannot explain what I do. (For contrary views, see Anscombe 1963 and Ginet 1990, and for more discussion this issue, action, §3.) And if psychological explanation goes, so do the closely related notions of free will and moral responsibility. If my body's behavior is not explained by my mind's activities— its deliberations, decisions, and so on — then how could I be held responsible for what my body does? I would appear to be a mere passive observer of my body's activities. Such a picture would apparently require abandoning what P.F. Strawson (1962) calls our "reactive attitudes", the moral attittudes and feelings (e.g., gratitude, resentment) that are so central to our interpersonal lives.

Clearly, quite a bit rides on the question of mental causation. Or we should say questions, for as will become clear, there are several different ways in which puzzles about the mind's "causal relevance" to behavior (and to the physical world more generally) can arise.

2. The Traditional Problem of Interaction

René Descartes (1642/1986) set the tone for modern discussions of the mind-body relation. According to Descartes, minds and bodies are distinct kinds of substance. Bodies, Descartes thought, are spatially extended substances, incapable of feeling or thought; minds, in contrast, are unextended, thinking, feeling substances. Nevertheless, Descartes accepted the common belief that mind and body causally interact: "Everyone feels that he is a single person with both body and thought so related by nature that the thought can move the body and feel the things which happen to it" (in Cottingham et al. 1991, p. 228). Given that minds and bodies belong to radically different kinds, however, it is hard to see how they could causally interact. Descartes was well aware of the difficulty. It was put forcefully to him by Princess Elizabeth of Bohemia, who in a 1643 correspondence asked Descartes to tell her

how the human soul can determine the movement of the animal spirits in the body so as to perform voluntary acts — being as it is merely a conscious substance. For the determination of movement seems always to come about from the moving body's being propelled — to depend on the kind of impulse it gets from what sets it in motion, or again, on the nature and shape of this latter thing's surface. Now the first two conditions involve contact, and the third involves that the impelling thing has extension; but you utterly exclude extension from your notion of soul, and contact seems to me incompatible with a thing's being immaterial (in Anscombe and Geach 1954, pp. 274-5).

Elizabeth expresses the prevailing view as to how causation of bodies must work: it must involve the cause's impelling the body, where this requires (the ancestral of) contact between them. Since an immaterial soul can never literally come into contact with a body — souls are spatially unextended — an immaterial soul could never impel, and so could never causally interact with, a body. Elizabeth's objection is but one version of a more general worry about soul-body interaction, a worry that rests on the following general thesis about causation:

(C) Causation requires a nexus: When A causes B, there must be some connection, some interface, by means of which this causal relation occurs.

Elizabeth's view was that when the effect is the movement of a body, the nexus required by (C) is spatial contact. But even if she was wrong about this — perhaps action at a distance is possible — (C) might still cause trouble for the dualist. Suppose, for example, the causal nexus in any causal interaction consists in the literal transference of something (some sort of property, say) from cause to effect. This is so according to transference theories of causality (Ehring 1997). But if bodies and minds are radically different, as the substance dualist says, they have no properties in common. For Descartes, all of a body's properties are modes of extension, while all of a soul's properties are modes of something quite different: thought (or consciousness). Thus a Cartesian mind could not causally affect a body. The success of this application of (C) depends, of course, on the plausibility of the transference theory. (For discussion of this theory in relation to the problem of interaction, see Hart 1988; Hoffman and Rozenkrantz 1991.)

The lines of objection we've looked at so far invoke (C) directly in arguing against soul-body interaction. A more contemporary version of the problem of interaction invokes (C) indirectly. Imagine two qualitatively identical minds M1 and M2 and the bodies B1 and B2 to which they are "attached", that is, the bodies with which they causally interact. In virtue of what is it true that M1 is causally paired with B1 and M2 with B2? This is not the epistemological question of how we could know that these are the pairings (though this is troublesome too); rather, the question is metaphysical: in virtue of what are these the pairings? If the minds are, like the bodies, located in space, causal pairing could be achieved by the relative spatial locations of the substances. But if the minds are non-spatial souls, then relative spatial location is unavailable to fill the pairing role. And since M1 and M2 are, by hypothesis, qualitatively identical, we cannot appeal to the different intrinsic properties that they might possess. This "Pairing Problem" (Foster 1991; Kim 2001) invokes (C) indirectly, for it's the lack of an available nexus that makes causal pairing problematic here. If there were such a nexus, we could appeal to it to connect M1 to B1 and M2 to B2. (It should be noted that this line of argument assumes that a nonextended entity — a Cartesian mind — is not spatially locatable. But minds could resemble spatial points in being nonextended but locatable (cf. Chisholm 1978). In that case M1 might be paired with B1 by being located in B1.)

These versions of the problem of interaction appeal to (C), the claim that causation requires a nexus. But such a claim can be challenged. Philosophers inspired by David Hume's (1748/1993, §7) famous critique of causality will ask whether the notion of a causal nexus is intelligible (see, e.g., Blackburn 1990). If causation is at the most fundamental level merely a regular succession of events, if no connection is required, then the problem of interaction need not arise. (What would a regularity theorist say about the pairing case above? The example is perhaps underdescribed, but such a theorist might have to say that M1 and M2 are each causally connected to both bodies.) To the extent that one finds soul-body interaction metaphysically suspect, however, one will also find the regularity theory implausible. That is, a regularity theory of causality does not preserve the prima facie problems with soul-body interaction. For this reason, a Humean solution to the problem will strike many as too easy.

3. From Substance to Property

Mind-body causation is problematic for a substance dualist, but it appears to be less so for a materialist, someone who believes that the mind, if it is a substance at all, is a material substance such as the brain. While causation between brain and body can be quite complex, even to the point of being empirically inscrutable, it does not pose the same problems as soul-body interaction does: there are no philosophical problems with a brain-body causal nexus that are not general to the notion of a causal nexus.

However, even if the mind is the brain or some other physical substance, mental causation remains puzzling. Theoretical and commonsensical considerations leading us to think the mind causes behavior should also make us think that it does so in virtue of its mental properties. Properties, it seems, figure crucially in causal relations: When a causes b, it never does so simpliciter, but in virtue of the properties of both cause and effect. Using the "qua" locution, we can say that it is a qua F that causes b qua G. (Horgan (1989) calls this four-place relation "quausation".) It is qua square thing — that is, in virtue of being square — that a paperweight causes a square indentation when pressed into soft clay. A rock causes a nasty bump on my head qua thing of a certain mass. And it is qua mental — that is, in virtue of their mental properties — that minds cause behavior. Gus smiles because of the way his food tastes, that phenomenal property; Lilian walks to school in part because of what she believes, that intentional property; and so on.

By themselves, these observations pose no special problem for the philosopher of mind. While the notion of a causally relevant property is in need of philosophical analysis (Braun 1995), there is no reason at the outset for a materialist to be especially concerned about the causal relevance of mental properties. Why should a mind's causing behavior in virtue of its mental properties be any more puzzling than a paperweight's causing an indentation in virtue of its shape? Recent philosophical work on mental properties has revealed that matters are not so simple, however. Mental properties are alleged to have, not just one, but up to four features that make their causal relevance philosophically puzzling, no less problematic than mind-body interaction is for the substance dualist. These features, to be discussed in the following four sections, are ontological distinctness, anomalousness, multiple realizability, and externality. Each of them makes it appear as though mental properties, or some subset of them, are causally irrelevant to behavior: the mental never causes anything qua mental.

(Note: For convenience we usually speak below of mental events being causes. But the same sorts of problems arise whatever entities — events, substances, states of affairs, etc. — one takes to be the causal relata, and there is no need to take a stand on this particular issue (see causation: the metaphysics of, §1) for the purposes of this article. The focus below is not on the causal relata, but on their causally relevant properties.)

4. Problem I: Property Dualism

One version of the property-based problem arises immediately for those philosophers who believe that, even if mental substances are physical, mental properties are not. "Property dualism" has several contemporary defenders, including David Chalmers (1996) and at one time Frank Jackson (1982, 1986; but see his 1998, forthcoming). For the property dualist, mental properties — and here the mental properties taking center stage are the phenomenal properties of conscious experience — are sui generis, not reducible to the dispositional or structural properties recognized by the physical sciences (see dualism).

If mental properties are non-physical in this way, it seems that they could not be causally relevant to physical happenings. This charge of epiphenomenalism might be motivated by an appeal to (C) or something like it: basic, non-physical properties could not be "connected" to physical effects in the way required for causal relevance. But there's another, more popular argument behind the charge, one that will also appear in various forms in the sections that follow: We have good reason to think that every physical event has a physical cause. So non-physical mental properties can be causally relevant to what our bodies do only by working together with physical properties to overdetermine behavior. But this sort of systematic mental-physical overdetermination has struck many as implausible, even as absurd. Conclusion: if mental properties are not physical, mental properties are not causally relevant to what we do. While a pain may cause my hand to withdraw, it's not in virtue of how it feels, not qua pain, that it does so. Only my pain's physical (e.g., neurophysiological) properties can be causally relevant here. Note that a similar argument, appealing to substances rather than properties, could also be used against Cartesian soul-body interaction.

Some property dualists (e.g., Jackson 1982) embrace such epiphenomenalism, but others consider it too hard a bullet to bite. These latter dualists would be forced, then, to say that the above argument is not sound. There are two main premises to consider. First, there is a principle asserting the causal completeness of the physical world:

Completeness: Every physical event has a sufficient physical cause.

(To bring properties explicitly into the picture, say that a sufficient physical cause here is one whose physical properties are causally sufficient for the effect.) This principle in various forms appears frequently in the mental causation literature. It is called "Physical Determinism" in Yablo 1992, though as Yablo and others have pointed out, it's not committed to causal determinism. The principle can be modified, without affecting the soundness of the argument, to be compatible with indeterminism: for "sufficient physical cause", read "physical cause sufficient for the event's objective probability". Completeness also at times goes under the name of "Closure", though some (cf. Kim 1998, p. 40; Robb 1997) prefer to reserve this latter term for a stronger principle, one entailed by Completeness plus a ban on overdetermination. (For a survey of attempts to formulate the principle, whatever one chooses to call it, see Lowe 2000.)

Is Completeness true? Some may take it to be an an analytic truth, one falling out of the very concept of the physical. (For discussion, see Papineau 1993, pp. 30-1; Lowe 1996, p. 56.) But the principle looks more substantive than that. If so, its proponents may claim that it enjoys strong empirical support, perhaps taking the form of an inductive generalization from the following: In every case where natural science has found the cause of a physical event, it has found a sufficient physical cause of that event. Alternatively, a less ambitious defense of Completeness may claim that it's merely a working hypothesis of natural science or a principle presupposed by physicalism, a philosophical doctrine that enjoys independent support (cf. Lewis 1966, p. 23; Kim 1993a, p. 290). In any case, the truth of Completeness, not to mention its proper formulation, is still very much a live philosophical issue.

Note that Completeness does not by itself push the dualist toward epiphenomenalism, for it's compatible with this principle that the causes of behavior have both mental and physical properties, each of which is causally sufficient for the behaviorial effect. So the second main premise in the argument puts a ban on such overdetermination:

No Overdetermination: There is no systematic overdetermination of physical events.

This principle allows some physical events to be overdetermined. Perhaps, for example, both the loudness and the suddenness of a thunderclap are causally sufficient for my jumping. But if a mental and a physical property were causally relevant to every behavioral event, this would be a pervasive, systematic overdetermination of a significant subset of physical events. No Overdetermination is meant to rule this out.

This second principle enjoys wide support in the literature. It is said that postulating systematic overdetermination in this context is "absurd" (Kim 1993a, p. 281) or at least "looks suspiciously ad hoc" (Lowe 2000, p. 572). Stephen Schiffer remarks that "it is hard to believe that God is such a bad engineer" as to allow such overdetermination (Schiffer 1987, p. 148; quoted in Crane 1995). However, Eugene Mills (1996) has defended mental-physical overdetermination as the most plausible route for the dualist to take. The bulk of his defense concerns the overdetermination of behavioral effects by mental and physical causes (events), not their causally relevant properties. However, reasoning similar to Mills' could be used by the property dualist in the present context. Overdetermination is plausible, the argument goes, if the mental and physical properties of a mental cause (M) are each counterfactually sufficient for the behavioral effect (B). Oversimplifying a bit, the claim is that (1) if M had lacked its mental property but still had its physical properties, it would still have caused B, and (2) if M had lacked its physical properties but still had its mental property, it would still have caused B. If the property dualist can reasonably claim that (1) and (2) are true, this will make a strong prima facie case for overdetermination.

5. Problem II: Anomalous Monism

5.1 The Argument for Anomalous Monism

Another version of the property-based problem of mental causation can be traced back to Donald Davidson's widely influential paper, "Mental Events" (Davidson 1970; see also his 1974). In this paper, Davidson defends an account of the mind-body relation he calls "anomalous monism". Davidson argues that we have excellent reasons to accept each of the following principles:

Principle of Causal Interaction: Some mental events interact causally with physical events.

Principle of the Nomological Character of Causality: Events related as cause and effect fall under strict laws.

Anomalism of the Mental: There are no strict laws on the basis of which mental events can be predicted and explained.

The mind-body problem arises, according to Davidson, precisely because most of us unquestioningly assent to the first principle: mental events have physical causes and effects. The second principle is only slightly more controversial. A genuine causal sequence falls under a "strict" (that is, exceptionless) law of nature. We might be utterly ignorant of the law, but we distinguish genuinely causal sequences from mere coincidences by assuming that the former, but not the latter, conform to a law. (Note: "strict" is not synonymous with "deterministic"; a strict law could be either deterministic or probabilistic.) One way to understand what Davidson has in mind is to consider the place of physics among the sciences. Physics gives us an account of the laws governing the basic constituents of the world. These laws are strict, unlike laws associated with "higher-level" sciences such as biology or psychology. Biological and psychological processes are liable to interference from "outside" forces, as when, for example, dinosaurs were made extinct when a meteor collided with the Earth. And though rational agents typically do what they judge best, any judgment can be canceled by, say, an unexpected blow to the head. But in the case of the basic constituents, there are no sources of interference because there is no "outside", only more of the same, more basic constituents. The fundamental physical things are in this sense causally autonomous.

Now if we suppose that everything is made up of the basic constituents, then we must assume that the behavior of everything is governed by laws governing those basic constituents. Any causal sequence is a sequence involving the basic constituents and so governed by strict fundamental laws. Interactions among fundamental entities will be fantastically complex, and "higher-level" sciences are in the business of finding abstract patterns of regularities and capturing these in higher-level laws. Such laws, however, are not strict, since they abstract away from differences that, at lower-levels, prove important.

The resulting picture here is of a single, multi-faceted, material world that can be described in many different ways. Some of our descriptions are "mental", some "physical". The same world answers to both. There is, however, no prospect of translating mental talk into physical talk, hence no prospect of establishing systematic mental-physical correlations of the sort that would be required for strict mental-physical laws. Importantly, however, this is consistent with the possibility of establishing loose mental-physical generalizations, which could be regarded as defeasible, ceteris paribus laws (see e.g., Fodor 1987, 1991b).

Davidson's view is often described as a "token identity theory": every particular (token) mental event is identical with some particular (token) physical event, but mental types cannot be identified with physical types. Most philosophers who address these issues find it natural to identify types with properties, so to say that mental types cannot be reduced to or identified with physical types would be to say that mental properties are distinct from physical properties. Is Davidson, then, a property dualist of the sort discussed in §4? The question is a tricky one, for two reasons. First, Davidson is a nominalist, so strictly speaking, he does not believe in properties, at least not in the same sense as (e.g.) Chalmers does. Second, property dualism as described earlier is incompatible with physicalism, yet Davidson is himself a physicalist. (Here we must add "in a sense", for there is no one kind of physicalism. But we are confident that Davidson is a physicalist in a sense that the property dualists of §4 would reject.)

5.2 The Charge of Epiphenomenalism

In whatever sense Davidson is or is not a property dualist, anomalous monism faces a number of difficulties, the most pressing of which, for our purposes, is that it apparently makes mental properties causally irrelevant to physical effects. Suppose Gus forms the intention to illuminate the room and subsequently flips the switch, thereby turning on the light. In this case we have a cause that, if Davidson is right, can be given both a mental and a physical description, and an effect that has a physical description. If this means that the cause has a mental property (in virtue of which it satisfies a mental description) and a physical property (in virtue of which it satisfies a physical description), we are faced with a further question. Granted, the event with the mental property is the event with a physical property, and granted that this event has a physical effect, but given Davidson's principles, why should we think that the mental property had anything at all to do with the event's physical effect? Davidson's second two principles seem to block such relevance. If all causal relations are subsumed by strict laws, and if there are no strict psychophysical laws, then any instance of mind-body causation is subsumed by only physical laws. But then it looks as if only a mental event's physical properties are relevant to what it causes. The mental properties (or mental types) are causally irrelevant. (See Stoutland 1980; Honderich 1982; Kim 1984; Sosa 1984.)

5.3 Davidson's Response

How might a proponent of anomalous monism respond to this problem, short of becoming an epiphenomenalist? Davidson (1993) himself denies a crucial assumption of the argument, one that many philosophers take for granted, namely, the assumption that causes do their causing in virtue of their properties. On Davidson's view, when an event causes something, it doesn't do so qua this or that: it just causes what it does, period. If this is right, then none of the property-based problems discussed here can get off the ground. But Davidson's position must confront the apparently central role that properties play in the theory of causality (in, e.g., Ehring 1997) as well as the standard examples used to illustrate causally relevant properties. For example, a soprano sings the word "shatter" at a high pitch, thereby causing a glass to break. Intuitively, it was the pitch of the note, not its meaning, that was causally relevant here (Dretske 1989; detailed responses to Davidson 1993 can be found in Heil and Mele 1993, chs. 2-4, by Kim, McLaughlin, and Sosa).

5.4 The Appeal to Counterfactuals

Some (e.g., LePore and Loewer 1987) look to counterfactuals to answer the charge of epiphenomenalism. The central idea is that anomalous monism is compatible with physical effects' being counterfactually dependent on mental properties. And such dependence secures an important kind of causal relevance for the mental, the sort that LePore and Loewer call "bringing about". On LePore and Loewer's view, a's being F brings about b's being G when the following conditions are met:

  1. a causes b.
  2. a is F and b is G.
  3. If a had not been F, b would not have been G.
  4. a's being F and b's being G are logically and metaphysically independent.

(Note that because this is intended as an account of causal relevance, not of causation, clause (1) does not introduce any circularity. Alternative counterfactual accounts of causal relevance can be found in LePore and Loewer 1989 and Horgan 1989; see also causation: counterfactual theories of.)

Now suppose a mental event, such as a decision to hail a cab, causes a physical event, a hand-signal. Say the mental property of the cause here is being a decision to hail a cab, and the behavioral property of the effect is being a hand-signal. In such a case, the mental property will be causally relevant in the production of the behavior if the following counterfactual holds: If the cause had not been a decision to hail a cab, the effect would not have been a hand-signal. And such a counterfactual is quite plausible, as are similar counterfactuals in a wide range of cases. But is their truth compatible with anomalous monism? LePore and Loewer argue that it is. While Davidson prohibits strict laws connecting mental and physical properties, he does allow for non-strict laws. And such laws are enough to ground or "support" counterfactuals (see also laws of nature). Consider, by analogy, the properties of being a match-striking and being a match-lighting. The law connecting such properties (if there is such) is surely non-strict: striking causes lighting only ceteris paribus. Nevertheless, we can assert with confidence, after a given lighting, that if the match had not been struck, it wouldn't have lighted. Non-strict psychophysical laws would similarly appear to ground counterfactuals connecting mental and behavioral properties.

Whether this is a plausible defense of anomalous monism depends on, among other things, whether counterfactual accounts of causal relevance (and of causation more generally) are plausible. Such theories have come under attack on a number of fronts. These attacks can take the form of counterexamples (Kim 1973; Braun 1995; Ehring 1997) or broader metaphysical concerns. Here we mention a couple of the latter. They are not decisive against counterfactual accounts, but they do create some pressure to look elsewhere to avoid epiphenomenalism.

First, a substance dualist, too, could appeal to counterfactuals in the face of the problem of interaction. Suppose, as an occasionalist would, that God has set up the world in such a way that the states of souls mirror those of bodies so that the "right" counterfactuals come out true. For example, if I had not felt pain just now, my hand would not have withdrawn, for God in that case would not have caused it to. A solution of this kind to the problem of interaction seems too easy: even if God ensures that soul-body counterfactuals hold, this does not amount to a genuine causal connection between the two kinds of substance. And a similar point could be made about properties: allow that the note sounded by Dretske's soprano caused the glass to shatter, but now add that God had decided that if the note had not meant "shatter", he would not have allowed the glass to shatter. The four conditions listed above would seem to be satisfied, but the meaning of the soprano's note is still, intuitively, not causally relevant to the breaking of the glass.

Reflection on cases such as these leads to a second, more fundamental point: When a counterfactual is true, there should be something in the world that makes it true. Even granting that if the cause had not had its mental property, the effect would not have had its behavioral property, in virtue of what is this true? What is this counterfactual's truthmaker? This truthmaker, and not the bare counterfactual itself, is what matters in determining whether any property is causally relevant. And once we look at the relevant truthmakers in actual cases of (apparent) mental causation, the problem of epiphenomenalism crops up again. Although the effect counterfactually depends on the mental property, this appears to be true only because the mental property depends on a physical property which is doing the real causal work: the mental property looks like a freeloader. This sort of concern is a version of the "exclusion problem" (§6). It also threatens the next defense of anaomalous monism to be considered.

5.5 The Appeal to Nomological Sufficiency

While Jerry Fodor (1989) apparently agrees that the above counterfactual account captures a kind of causal relevance, he argues that LePore and Loewer have settled for too little. On Fodor's view, mental properties can be relevant to behavior in a stronger sense, a sense in which they are sufficient for their effects and in this way "make a difference". Fodor spells out this sufficiency in terms of laws: a property makes a difference if "it's a property in virtue of the instantiation of which the occurrence of one event is nomologically sufficient for the occurrence of another" (Fodor 1989, p. 65; see also McLaughlin 1989).

Will such an account save anomalous monism from the charge of epiphenomenalism? On the face of it, it cannot, for mental properties on Davidson's view appear only in "hedged" laws, laws that include an implicit ceteris paribus rider. Consider a candidate psychological law:

(L) If an agent, a, wants x, believes x is obtainable by doing y, and judges y best, all things considered, then a forms the intention to y and subsequently y's on the basis of this intention, ceteris paribus.

The ceteris paribus clause here would seem to block the mental properties in question from being causally sufficient for the behavioral effect. But perhaps not: according to (L) the mental properties are sufficient for the behavioral effect when the ceteris paribus conditions are satsified. And this sort of causal sufficiency, Fodor argues, is all we could want for mental properties. In this way, the causal relevance of the mental ends up being compatible with its anomalism.

An account of causal relevance in terms of laws is natural given the tight connections between laws and properties (see, e.g., Armstrong 1983). But those sympathetic to Fodor's position might still ask what the causal mechanism is in mental-physical interactions. For example, it could turn out that the reason psychophysical laws such as (L) hold is that mental properties are themselves grounded in more basic, physical properties, and that only the latter do genuine causal work: mental properties merely "piggyback" on the real bearers of causal powers (see LePore and Loewer 1989, pp. 187-8). This is the same worry that was raised against the counterfactual account above. The exclusion problem now deserves a closer look.

6. Problem III: Exclusion

6.1 Functionalism and Multiple Realizability

While reflection on anomalous monism can lead to the exclusion problem, another route is through the popular doctrine of functionalism. According to many functionalists, mental properties are functional properties (Putnam 1967; Fodor 1968, 1975; Block 1980b; Heil 1998, ch. 4). To be in pain, for example, is a matter of being in a state with a certain causal profile: pain is a state caused by tissue damage, and one that causes certain overt responses (moans, attempts to repair the damage, beliefs that one is in pain). But, argue functionalists, it is unlikely that we could find a single physical state that played this role in every actual and possible case of pain. Human beings differ in subtle physiological ways: one person's neurological states, including states he goes into when he is in pain, differ subtly from another person's. Human beings' neurological states, in turn, differ from those of a cat or a dog, and perhaps dramatically from states of an octopus. We can even imagine encountering aliens with vastly different biologies, but to which we would unhesitatingly ascribe pains.

Here we arrive at a core thesis of functionalism: states of mind are "multiply realizable". The property of being in pain can be realized in a wide variety of physical (and perhaps non-physical) systems. Someone is in pain in virtue of being in a state with the right sort of causal profile, some sort of neurological state, say. But the property of being in pain cannot be identified with this neurological state because creatures of other kinds can be in pain in virtue of being in vastly different physical conditions. (For further discussion of this argument, see Kim 1992; Heil 1999.) Functionalists often put this point by saying that mental properties are "higher-level" properties, properties possessed by objects by virtue of their possession of appropriate "lower-level" properties, their realizers.

6.2 The Exclusion Problem

Now, however, we are confronted with the specter of epiphenomenalism. How could functional properties make a causal difference? Suppose being in pain is a matter of being in a particular functional state. That is, being in pain is a matter of possessing a particular functional property, F. F is realized in your case by, say, some neurological property, N. Now, N is unproblematically relevant to producing various behavioral effects. N is relevant to your reaching for aspirin, say. But then what causal work is left for F to do? It seems to be causally idle, "screened off" by the work of N. This version of the problem of mental causation has appeared in various guises: for starters see Malcolm 1968 and the problem's later development in Kim 1989, 1993b, 1998, 2003. It is called the exclusion problem because it looks as if the physical properties that realize mental properties exclude the latter from causal relevance. (As we point out shortly, functionalism is not the only doctrine threatened by this argument. For a related problem of mental causation aimed specifically at functionalism, see Block 1990.)

This problem has clear affinities with the other two versions of the property-based problem we've looked at. Consider the claim above that the realizing property N must be relevant to the behavioral effect. This would seem to be justified either by an appeal to the principle of Completeness (§4) or to Davidson's doctrine (§5.1) that the causal relation be subsumed by a strict (and so physical) law. And the argument's claim that N and F compete for causal relevance, such that one excludes the other, would seem to require a principle such as No Overdetermination (§4).

But in spite of these similarities, the exclusion problem is in an important way unique: unlike the other problems we've looked at so far, exclusion worries generalize to a wide range of properties outside of the mental. Any properties, mental or otherwise, that are multiply realizable by physical properties are threatened with causal irrelevance. Now some philosophers (see, e.g., Fodor 1989; Baker 1993) take this general nature of the problem to be an encouraging sign: we normally don't think that, say, biological or geological properties are causally irrelevant, in spite of their being distinct from their physical realizers. So why think that exclusion threatens the causal relevance of mental properties either? But others would insist that the alleged causal relevance of biological and geological properties is not sacrosanct. Any causal powers we attribute to them must respect what our best metaphysics tells us. And in any case, the central issue here is not so much whether mental properties (and the rest) are causally relevant, but how they could be. That is, even if the exclusion problem, because it generalizes, doesn't tempt us toward epiphenomenalism, it still demands that we explain how mental properties could be causally relevant given that they appear be to be screened off by their physical realizers (see Kim 1998, pp. 61-2, 77-80).

The exclusion problem is the subject of a large literature. Here we look at some of the main lines of response, dividing them into two broad categories: (1) solutions that attempt to remove the threat of exclusion (and so epiphenomenalism) while respecting the distinctness of mental properties and their realizers, and (2) solutions that avoid exclusion by simply identifying mental properties with their realizers.

6.3 Non-Identity Solutions

If our mental property F and its physical realizer N are distinct, and if N is causally relevant in the production of behavior, and if there is no overdetermination of the behavioral effect, then it would seem as if F lacks causal relevance: it is "excluded" by N. But is this reasoning valid? Perhaps N and F are distinct and each causally relevant to the behavioral effect, yet do not overdetermine it.

One way to see how this could be is to consider what sorts of counterfactuals must hold in order for N and F to overdetermine the behavioral effect. If there is such overdetermination, then presumably it must be true both that (1) if the cause had lacked F but still had N, it would still have caused the behavioral effect, and that (2) if the cause had lacked N but still had F, it would still have caused the behavioral effect (cf. the use of counterfactuals in §4 and §5). One way to deny overdetermination then is to insist that at least one of these counterfactuals is false, in spite of the causal relevance of both N and F. (1) would be false, for example, if the world described in its antecedent is so different from our world that the effect would not occur. (For a detailed discussion of this and other responses to (1) and (2), see Bennett 2003.)

Another sort of approach, defended by Stephen Yablo (1992), rests on an account of the nature of mental properties. In particular, Yablo says that mental properties are determinables of physical properties. Just as being scarlet is a way of being red, so having N is a way of having F — one way among many, as the multiple realizability of F implies. But we don't generally think that determinables and their determinates compete for causal relevance. Suppose an earthquake causes a building to collapse. Is it in virtue of being violent that the earthquake causes this? Apparently not, for now add that the earthquake was barely violent, i.e., just over five on the Richter scale. The property of being barely violent would, according to our earlier reasoning, exclude from causal relevance the property of being violent. But this doesn't sound right: being violent and being barely violent don't compete for causal relevance. And the reason, on Yablo's view, is that the former property is a determinable of the latter: being barely violent is a way of being violent. In general, determinable properties and their determinates, in spite of being distinct, do not give rise to exclusion worries. Whether this strategy for solving the exclusion problem can be successful depends on, among other things, whether mental properties are in fact determinables of physical properties. (For skepticism, see Ehring 1996.)

A third non-identity solution, one that may in the end be compatible with Yablo's, starts with the point that every property has (i.e., bestows) causal powers. (On an especially strong version of this view, a property just is a cluster of causal powers; see Shoemaker 1980, and for discussion, Hawthorne 2001.) The property of being water, for example, has the power to dissolve salt in certain circumstances; the property of being sharp has the power to cut in certain circumstances, etc. Now consider again the mental property F and its realizer N. Plausibly, F's powers are included in N's. Both properties, for example, have the power to cause a certain kind of behavior, but because of its greater "specificity", N has in addition to this powers that F lacks. Now in general we don't think that wholes causally compete with their parts. For example, when Gus steps on Lilian's toe, his foot's causing Lilian discomfort doesn't exclude Gus' causing her discomfort. Both Gus and his foot coexist as causes, without competition and without any (problematic) sort of overdetermination. And a similar point could be made about properties: if the causal powers of F are included in those associated with N, then F and N don't compete for causal relevance. (For discussion of this approach, see Shoemaker 2001; Wilson 1999; Heil 1999. Cf. also Pereboom 2002, in which the causal powers of a mental property are said to be "wholly constituted by" those of its realizer.)

6.4 Identity Solutions

Another way of avoiding exclusion is just to say that F=N, that "these" are just one and the same property (cf. identity theory of mind). This sort of psychophysical property identity would seem to be blocked by the multiple realizability argument sketched earlier. But what exactly does that argument show? Some (e.g., Kim 1992; cf. Lewis 1969; Jackson 1995) take it to show, not that mental properties are distinct from their physical realizers, but that what we thought was one kind of mental property is actually many. Pains realized in different physical properties are, in spite of having the same name ("pain"), different mental properties. There is no such property as pain simpliciter, only pain-for-this-physical-structure and pain-for-that-physical structure. Once such "structure-specific" identities are allowed, we can say that F (pain-for-humans) is identical with N.

This solution, however, comes at a price: it forces us to abandon the belief that pain is a single, natural kind. There is, however, a way to preserve this belief while pursuing a strategy that's otherwise quite similar to Kim's. The essential idea is that "property" as we've used the term so far is ambiguous. Sometimes it is used to refer to those entities that characterize objects (events, substances, etc.); other times it is used to refer to those entities that unify objects, entities that are each a "one across many". Now suppose that the characterizing properties are tropes: particularized properties, unique to each object (Campbell 1981; Armstrong 1989, ch. 6). And the properties unifying objects are something else — call these "types". Types could be, for example, concepts, predicates, or resemblance classes of tropes. Now if the mental "properties" that are causally relevant to behavior are tropes, and the mental "properties" mentioned in the multiple realizability argument are types, then there's no reason to think that this argument rules out psychophysical property-identities in any way that leads to exclusion worries. The F-trope and the N-trope are one and the same trope falling under two distinct types, mental and physical. Note that this proposal allows for a single type pain that all creatures share; it's just that this type is not the same sort of entity (a trope) that is causally relevant in the production of behavior. (This approach is defended in Heil 1992; Robb 1997; Heil and Robb 2003. Cf. Macdonald and Macdonald 1986, 1995a).

Some might object to identity solutions on the grounds that they merely shift exclusion worries from the properties of causes (events or substances) to the "second-order" properties of causally relevant properties. Suppose a given property, both mental and physical, is unproblematically involved in a physical causal transaction. It's tempting to think that nonetheless, it is qua physical that the property is causally relevant, not qua mental. And one might want to say this for the same reasons that drive the original, "first-order" exclusion problem. The success of this line of objection depends on, among other things, whether properties themselves have properties. (For discussion of the objection, see Jackson 1995; Noordhof 1998; Robb 2001.)

7. Problem IV: Externalism

7.1 Intentional Mental Properties

The final version of the property-based problem we'll look at is restricted to intentional mental properties. Suppose, as many philosophers do, that externalism is true: the contents of representational states of mind — propositional attitudes, perceptual experiences, mental images, and so on — depend, not on intrinsic features of those states, but on relations; in particular, they depend on the causal, historical, and social relations agents bear to their surroundings. (For a discussion of motivations for externalism, see Putnam 1975a; Burge 1979, 1986; Heil 1992, chap. 2; mental content: externalism about.) In the simplest case, Lilian's thoughts about water are thoughts about water (H2O) because Lilian stands in the right sorts of causal relations to water. The key move here is to reject the idea that meaningful objects or states owe their meaning to their intrinsic make-up.

The causally problematic feature here is the ineliminable contextual or relational component of intentional mental properties. Suppose that mental representations are physical structures in the brains of intelligent creatures. Now suppose with the externalist that the content of mental representations is determined, not just by intrinsic features of agents, but by their contexts. Lilian (or Lilian's brain) represents a tree in the quad by going into state T. But T constitutes a representation of a tree in the quad, not by virtue of T's intrinsic makeup, but by virtue of Lilian's standing in the right kind of relation to the tree. The very same kind of state in a different context (in the brain of someone in different circumstances) could represent something very different — or nothing at all. Now if the content of Lilian's thought that there is a tree in the quad is "broad", if the significance of that thought depends on factors outside Lilian's body (Lilian's standing in an appropriate causal relation to the tree, for instance), then it is hard to see how this content could figure in a causal account of Lilian's actions, including Lilian's uttering the sentence, "There is a tree in the quad".

Consider an analogy (cf. Fodor 1987, ch. 2): Suppose Gus inserts a quarter in a vending machine. The coin has a range of intrinsic qualities common to quarters, but its being a quarter does not depend solely on these intrinsic qualities: these qualities could be shared by a good counterfeit. The coin's being a quarter depends on its having the right sort of history: it was produced in a United States mint. This is something the vending machine cares nothing about. The machine reacts only to the coin's intrinsic features. We could put this by saying that the coin affects the machine, not qua quarter, but only qua possessor a particular kind of intrinsic makeup. (Vending machines take advantage of the fact that objects with the intrinsic makeup of quarters are in fact almost always quarters.)

The worry is that we are, in this respect, similar to vending machines. We produce responses to incoming stimuli wholly in virtue of our intrinsic makeup and the intrinsic character of the stimuli. Our thoughts possess complicated relations to our surroundings: our thoughts occur in a particular context. These relations determine our thoughts' significance. But our thoughts' significance plays no role in our causal economy, hence no role in producing behavior. (For formulations of this problem, along with proposed solutions, see, e.g., Braun 1991; Yablo 1997.)

7.2 Narrow Content

This version of the problem of mental causation has inspired a number of responses. One involves positing narrow content (Fodor 1991a; mental content: narrow). Narrow content could be thought of as the content of a representational state of mind minus its "broad" components. Consider Lilian (or Lilian's brain) and an intrinsically indiscernible brain in a vat wired to a supercomputer. Grant that Lilian and the envatted brain entertain intrinsically indiscernible thoughts with utterly different representational contents. Now imagine that we could abstract a common element from the contents of Lilian's and the brain's intrinsically indiscernible thoughts. This element is their narrow content. Because narrow content is something all intrinsic duplicates must have in common, the hope is that such content could have a role in producing behavior.

Some deny, however, that the notion of narrow content is coherent (see, e.g., Adams et al. 1990). Return to the vending machine. The quarter Gus inserts in the machine has a particular value. It has this value owing to relations it bears to outside goings-on: it was minted in the Denver mint. A slug placed in the machine could have the very same intrinsic makeup as the quarter, but it lacks the quarter's value. It looks as though it is the quarter's intrinsic makeup, not its value, that matters to the operation of the machine. Insofar as that operation is concerned, the quarter's value is epiphenomenal. Now imagine someone arguing that a quarter and an intrinsically indiscernible slug do in fact share a kind of value: narrow value. Because narrow value accompanies an object's intrinsic qualities, we need not regard narrow value as epiphenomenal. But what could narrow value be? Whatever it is, is it in any way like value ordinarily conceived: broad value? Narrow value looks like a phony property posited ad hoc solely to accommodate an otherwise embarrassing difficulty. Nevertheless, some remain optimistic about the prospects of a viable internalist account of content, one that would allow fully fledged thoughts to have a role in the production of behavior. (See Martin and Heil 1998; Segal 2000; Heil 2003, ch. 18.)

7.3 Dretske's Proposal

A second, quite different, attempt to preserve the causal relevance of intentional properties can be found in the work of Fred Dretske (1988, 1993). So far we've assumed that a behavioral event is distinct from the mental event that causes it. But on Dretske's view, behavior is a process that includes, as a component, its mental cause. When mental event a causes bodily movement b, the behavior in this case is not b itself, but the process of a's causing b. For example, when Lilian raises her hand because she wants to get the teacher's attention and she believes that raising her hand will accomplish this, her behavior is not her hand's going up, but the process of this belief-desire pair's causing her hand to go up. Now Dretske grants that when mental event a initiates, or "triggers", a process ending in bodily movement b, a does so only in virtue of its instrinsic properties. Neverthess, a's relational, intentional properties have a causal role, for they can be relevant to the fact that a causes b. Dretske puts this point by saying that reasons are "structuring" causes of behavior: it's because of what a indicates that it was "recruited" during the learning process as a cause of b. It's because, for example, that Lilian's belief indicates what it does — raising one's hand (in these circumstances) is a way to get the teacher's attention — that it was recruited as (together with the relevant desire) a cause of hand-raising. Relational, intentional mental properties thus become causally relevant to behavior, since they are relevant to structuring the very causal processes that, on Dretske's view, are instances of behavior.

Dretske's solution to the externalist problem is an original, intriguing position, though it raises a number of questions (see, e.g., Kim 1991; Block 1990, pp. 153-4). One question is whether relational, intentional properties do in fact play a causal role in the structuring (or "wiring") of causal processes in the brain. Even during the learning process, the states of Lilian's brain would seem to be sensitive only to the local, intrinsic properties of one another, properties which screen off any external properties. Dretske may be able to avoid such screening-off by appealing the counterfactual dependence of behavior-structuring on these properties. His view would then stand or fall with the success of counterfactual theories of causal relevance (§5.4). A second question is whether intentional properties, even if they are relevant in the way Dretske says they are, deliver the kind of causal relevance we want. When Lilian raises her hand, the structuring of the relevant processes in her brain has already occurred. If intentional properties are relevant at all, it seems they are relevant only to what happened in the past during the learning process. But we normally think that mental properties are causally relevant to what's going on here and now, the very time when Lilian (or anyone) acts.

7.4 Broad Behavior?

Dretske's proposal is a version of what's sometimes called the "dual explanandum" strategy. The idea is that physical and mental properties are causally responsible for different effects. For Dretske, the (triggering) physical properties are responsible for bodily movement, while the (structuring) mental properties are responsible for behavior.

Another version of this strategy begins with a point made earlier, namely that the question of a property's causal relevance is really a question about its relevance to some property of the effect. The form of our central causal question, that is, is whether the mental cause qua F causes the behavioral effect qua G. Now when F is an intentional mental property, what G is the object of our question? It appears to be a behavioral property that, like the mental property, is itself "broad". Consider a simple example: Suppose Lilian believes that a glass in front of her contains water, and this belief (together with her desires) causes her to reach for the glass. Her behavior is an instance of trying to get water, and it's the instantiation of this property that we're wondering about when we ask whether the intentional property of her belief is causally relevant. But now the answer seems straightforward, for surely what makes Lilian's behavior a trying for water is that it's caused by a belief whose content concerns water. Once we realize that the behavioral property of the effect is itself broad, its connection to the intentional mental property seems clear.

This is not to say that the physical properties of Lilian's belief are irrelevant: it's just that they are relevant to a different property of the effect, say the property of being a forward arm-movement. The intentional properties of her belief are relevant to the effect qua (broad) behavior; the physical properties are relevant to the effect qua (narrow) movement. And note that once the view is put this way, it points to a solution to the exclusion problem as well (§6): If a mental property and its physical realizer are relevant to different properties of the effect, they need not compete for causal relevance (cf. Yablo 1992).

Because it promises to solve two problems of mental causation, this approach is potentially quite powerful. (For discussion, see Fodor 1991a; Burge 1995.) One question to raise here, however, is whether the fact that some behavior can be described broadly makes the intentional mental property of its cause relevant. The undeniable conceptual connections between mental and behavioral descriptions may point to a kind of explanatory relevance, but it's a further question as to whether the causal connections grounding these explanations involve broad properties. Those motivated by the original epiphenomenalist arguments will worry that narrow, physical properties are doing all of the causal work here: the apparent relevance of the broad properties is an illusion created by the way we, in explaining behavior, conceptualize both cause and effect. This point leads to a fourth, related response to the problem.

7.5 The Appeal to Explanatory Practice

Some would challenge the distinction between explanation and causation, insisting that our concept of causality is fundamentally explanatory: causally relevant properties are those that figure in our best causal explanations (Burge 1993; Baker 1993). We find out what causal relations amount to by starting with cases of causal explanation. We (and cognitive scientists) routinely explain physical events by citing mental causes (and vice versa). To question whether real causal relations answer to these explanations is to succumb to metaphysical hubris. This appeal to explanatory practice has the potential to answer all four of the property-based problems we've looked at.

No doubt our understanding of the notions of causality and causal relevance depends on our grasp of causal explanations. But there are at least two areas of concern about this explanatory strategy (cf. Kim 1998, pp. 60-7): First, is it addressing the right question? Earlier, we pointed out that the central question of mental causation is not so much whether mental properties are causally relevant but how they could be, given some alleged feature of mental properties (in this case the feature is their being relational properties). The explanatory strategy would at best seem to be addressing only the "whether" question, not the "how" question. Second, even when restricted to the "whether" question, the strategy does rest on a conflation of what appears to be an epistemological notion (explanation) with metaphysical notions (causation and causal relevance). A full evaluation of the view thus requires a deeper look into how the two are related.

8. Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Mind

We conclude with a methodological question. The foregoing discussion of mental causation has raised a number of fundamental metaphysical issues concerning, for example, laws, counterfactuals, causality, and properties. Does making progress on the problem of mental causation, and in the philosophy of mind generally, really require philosophers to delve into foundational metaphysics?

One way to bring this question into focus is to consider Georges Rey's "Fairness Maxim for the Philosophy of Mind":

DON'T BURDEN THE MIND WITH EVERYONE ELSE'S PROBLEMS. Always ask whether a problem is peculiar to the mind, or whether the issue could equally well be raised in other less problematic areas. If it can be, settle it for those areas first, and then assess the philosophy of mind (Rey 1997, p. 27).

Some philosophers of mind might read the principle as advice to remain neutral on metaphysical matters such as those listed above. But one risk of the practice of neutrality is that seemingly innocent assumptions — e.g., that counterfactuals reveal causal connections, or that a given predicate picks out a genuine property — can in fact embody substantive metaphysical theses. But another way to read Rey's principle is as a statement of the proper order of inquiry: Foundational, metaphysical questions should be addressed prior to questions about the mind, in such a way that metaphysics informs one's philosophy of mind. Philosophers following this advice can avoid pursuing solutions to the problem of mental causation that are tailored to a favored thesis in philosophy of mind; such solutions are in danger of appearing ad hoc from a broader metaphysical perspective. The aim instead would be an account of mental causation that generalizes smoothly across the board, and for that reason is more powerful.


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Related Entries

action | anomalous monism | causation: counterfactual theories of | causation: the metaphysics of | emergent properties | epiphenomenalism | functionalism | identity theory of mind | mental content: externalism about | mental content: narrow | multiple realizability | physicalism | properties | qualia | tropes


We are grateful to Brendan O'Sullivan for helpful discussion of these issues and to David Chalmers for detailed comments on earlier drafts of this entry.

Copyright © 2003
David Robb
John Heil

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